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Inductive Logic

First published Mon Sep 6, 2004; substantive revision Wed Feb 27, 2008

An inductive logic is a system of reasoning that extends deductive logic to less-than-certain inferences. In a valid deductive argument the premises logically entail the conclusion, where such entailment means that the truth of the premises provides a guarantee of the truth of the conclusion. Similarly, in a good inductive argument the premises should provide some degree of support for the conclusion, where such support means that the truth of the premises indicates with some degree of strength that the conclusion is true. Presumably, if the logic of good inductive arguments is to be of any real value, the measure of support it articulates should meet the following condition:

Criterion of Adequacy (CoA):
As evidence accumulates, the degree to which the collection of true evidence statements comes to support a hypothesis, as measured by the logic, should tend to indicate that false hypotheses are probably false and that true hypotheses are probably true.

This article will primarily focus on the kind of the approach to inductive logic most widely studied by philosophers and logicians in recent years. These logics apply classical probability theory to sentences to represent a measure of the degree to which evidence statements support hypotheses. This kind of approach usually draws on Bayes' theorem, which is a theorem of probability theory, to articulate how the implications of hypotheses about evidence claims redound to the credit or discredit of the hypotheses. We will examine the extent to which this kind of logic may pass muster as an adequate logic of evidential support, especially in regard to the testing of scientific hypotheses. In particular, we see how such a logic may be shown to satisfy the Criterion of Adequacy.

1. Inductive Arguments

Let us begin by examining several examples of the kind of arguments an inductive logic should explicate. Consider the following two arguments:

Example 1.. Every raven in a random sample of 3200 ravens is black. This strongly supports the hypothesis that all ravens are black.

Example 2. 62 percent of voters in a random sample of 400 registered voters (polled on February 20, 2004) said that they favor John Kerry over George W. Bush for President in the 2004 Presidential election. This supports with a probability of at least .95 the hypothesis that between 57 percent and 67 percent of all registered voters favor Kerry over Bush for President (at or around the time the poll was taken).

An argument of this kind is often called an induction by enumeration of cases. We may represent the logical form of such arguments semi-formally as follows:

Premise: In random sample S consisting of n members of population B, the proportion of members that have attribute A is r.

Therefore, with degree of support p,

Conclusion: The proportion of all members of B that have attribute A is between rq and r+q (i.e., is within margin of error q of r).

Let's lay out this argument more formally. The Premise breaks down into three separate premises:[1]

Semi-formalization Formalization
Premise 1 The frequency (or proportion) of members with attribute A among the members of B in S is r. F[A,BS] = r
Premise 2 S is a random sample of B with respect to whether or not its members have A Random[S,B,A]
Premise 3 Sample S has exactly n members Size[S] = n
Therefore (with degree of support p) ========[p]
Conclusion The proportion of all members of B that have attribute A is between rq and r+q (i.e., is within margin of error q of r) F[A,B] = r ± q

Any inductive logic that encompasses such arguments should address two challenges. (1) It should tell us which enumerative inductive arguments should count as good inductive arguments, rather than as inductive fallacies. In particular, it should tell us how to determine the appropriate degree p to which such premises inductively support the conclusion, for a given margin of error q. (2) It should demonstrably satisfy the CoA. That is, it should be provable (as a metatheorem) that if a conclusion expressing the approximate proportion for an attribute in a population is true, then it is very likely that sufficiently numerous random samples of the population will provide true premises for good inductive arguments that confer degrees of support p approaching 1 for that true conclusion—where, on pain of triviality, these sufficiently numerous samples are only a tiny fraction of a large population. Later we will see how a probabilistic inductive logic may meet these two challenges.

Enumerative induction is rather limited in scope. This form of induction is only applicable to the support of claims involving simple universal conditionals (i.e., claims of form ‘All Bs are As’) or claims about the proportion of an attribute in a population (i.e., ‘The frequency of As among the Bs is r’). And it applies only when the evidence for such claims consists of instances of Bs observed to be either As or non-As. However, many important empirical hypotheses are not reducible to this simple form, and the evidence for hypotheses is often not composed of simple instances. Consider, for example, the Newtonian Theory of Mechanics:

All objects remain at rest or in uniform motion unless acted upon by some external force. An object's acceleration (i.e., the rate at which its motion changes from rest or uniform motion) is in the same direction as the force exerted on it; and the rate at which the object accelerates due to a force is equal to the magnitude of the force divided by the object's mass. If an object exerts a force on another object, the second object exerts an equal amount of force on the first object, but in the opposite direction to the force exerted by the first object.

The evidence for (and against) this theory is not gotten by examining a randomly selected subset of objects and the forces acting upon them. Rather, the theory is tested by calculating observable phenomena entailed by it in a wide variety of specific situations—ranging from simple collisions between small bodies to the trajectories of planets and comets—and then seeing whether those phenomena really occur. This approach to testing hypotheses and theories is ubiquitous, and should be captured by an adequate inductive logic.

Many less theoretical instances of inductive reasoning also fail to be captured by enumerative induction. Consider the kinds of inferences members of a jury are supposed to make based on the evidence presented at a murder trial. The inference to probable guilt or innocence is usually based on a patchwork of various sorts of evidence. It almost never involves consideration of a randomly selected sequences of past situations when people like the accused committed similar murders. Or, consider how a doctor diagnoses her patient on the basis of his symptoms. Although the frequency of occurrence of various diseases when similar symptoms were present may play a role, this is clearly not the whole story. Diagnosticians commonly employ a form of hypothetical reasoning—e.g., if the patient has a brain tumor, would that account for all of his symptoms?; or are these symptoms more likely the result of a minor stroke?; or is there another possible cause? The point is that a full account of inductive logic should not be limited to enumerative induction, but should also explicate the logic of hypothetical reasoning through which hypotheses and theories are tested on the basis of their predictions about specific observations. In Section 3 we will see how a probabilistic inductive logic (sometimes called a "Bayesian Confirmation Theory") captures such reasoning.

2. Inductive Logic and Inductive Probabilities

Probability, and the equivalent notion odds, are the oldest and best understood ways of representing partial belief and uncertain inference. Probability has been studied by mathematicians for over 350 years, but the concept is certainly much older. In recent times a number of other related representations of uncertainty have emerged. Many of these have found useful application in computer based artificial intelligence systems that perform inductive inferences in expert domains such as medical diagnosis. This article will explicate the representation of inductive inferences in terms of probability. A brief comparative description of some of the most prominent alternative representations may be found in the following supplementary document:

Some Prominent Approaches for Representing Uncertain Inferences.

2.1 The Historical Origins of Probabilistic Logic

The mathematical study of probability originated with Blaise Pascal and Pierre de Fermat in the mid-17th century. From that time through the early 19th century, as the mathematical theory continued to develop, the theory was primarily applied to the assessment of risk in games of chance and to drawing simple statistical inferences about characteristics of large populations — e.g., to compute appropriate life insurance premiums based on mortality rates. In the early 19th century Pierre de Laplace made further theoretical advances, and showed how to apply probabilistic reasoning to a much wider range of scientific and practical problems. Since that time probability has become an indispensable tool in the sciences, business, and many other areas of modern life.

Throughout its development various researchers appear to have thought of probability as a kind of logic. But the first extended treatment of probability as an explicit part of logic was George Boole's The Laws of Thought (1854). John Venn followed two decades later with a related logical account of probability in The Logic of Chance (1876). Not long after that the whole discipline of logic was transformed by new developments in deductive logic.

In the late 19th and early 20th century Frege, followed by Russell and Whitehead, showed how deductive logic could be represented in the kind of rigorous formal system we now call quantificational logic or predicate logic. For the first time logicians had a fully formal deductive logic powerful enough to represent all valid deductive arguments in mathematics and the sciences—a logic in which the validity of deductive arguments depends only on the logical structure of the sentences involved. This development spurred some logicians to attempt to apply a similar approach to inductive reasoning. The idea was to extend the deductive entailment relation to a notion of probabilistic entailment for cases where premises provide less than conclusive support for conclusions. These partial entailments are expressed in terms of conditional probabilities, probabilities of the form P[C | B] = r (read “the probability of C given B is r”), where P is a probability function, C is a conclusion sentence, B is a conjunction of premise sentences, and r is the probabilistic degree of support that B provides for C. Attempts to develop such a logic have varied widely in regard to precisely how the deductive model is emulated.

Some inductive logicians have tried to follow the deductive paradigm very closely. In deductive logic the syntactic structure of the sentences involved completely determines whether premises logically entail a conclusion. So these logicians attempted to specify inductive support probabilities solely in terms of the syntactic structure of premise and conclusion sentences. In such a system each sentence confers a syntactically specified degree of support on each of the other sentences of the language. The inductive probabilities in such a system are logical in the sense that they depend on syntactic structure alone. This kind of conception was first articulated by John Maynard Keynes in his Treatise on Probability (1921). Rudolf Carnap pursued this idea with greater rigor in his Logical Foundations of Probability (1950) and in several subsequent works (e.g., Carnap 1952). (For details of Carnap's approach see the section on logical probability in the entry on interpretations of the probability calculus, in this Encyclopedia.)

In the inductive logics of Keynes and Carnap, Bayes' theorem, which is a theorem of probability theory, plays a central role in expressing how evidence comes to bear on hypotheses. (We'll examine Bayes' theorem later.) So, such approaches might well be called Bayesian logicist inductive logics. Other well-known Bayesian logicist attempts to develop a probabilistic inductive logic include (Jeffreys, 1939), (Jaynes, 1968), and (Rosenkrantz, 1981).

It is now generally held that the core idea of Bayesian logicism is fatally flawed—that syntactic logical structure cannot be the sole determiner of the degree to which premises inductively support conclusions. A crucial facet of the problem faced by Bayesian logicism involves how the logic is supposed to apply to scientific contexts where the conclusion sentence is some hypothesis or theory, and the premises are evidence claims. The difficulty is that in any probabilistic logic that satisfies the usual axioms for probabilities, the inductive support for a hypothesis must depend in part on its prior probability. This prior probability represents how plausible the hypothesis is supposed to be on its own, before the evidence is brought to bear. A Bayesian logicist must tell us how to assign values to these pre-evidential prior plausibilities for each hypothesis or theory under consideration, and must do so in a way that relies only on their syntactic logical structure, or on some measure of their syntactic simplicity. There are severe technical problems with getting this idea to work. Moreover, various counter-examples seem to show that such an approach must assign intuitively quite unreasonable prior probabilities to many hypotheses. Thus, it appears that logical structure alone cannot distinguish good inductive inferences from bad ones. (We will describe this problem in more detail, and provide such a counterexample, in Section 3, after we spell out the details of how probabilistic logics represent the confirmation of hypotheses.)

At about the time the Bayesian logicist idea was developing, an alternative conception of probabilistic inductive reasoning was also emerging. This approach is now generally referred to as the Bayesian subjectivist or personalist approach to inductive reasoning (see, e.g., Ramsey, 1926; De Finetti, 1937; Savage 1954; Edwards, Lindman, Savage, 1963; Jeffrey, 1983, 1992; Howson, Urbach, 1993; Joyce 1999). It treats inductive probability as part of a larger normative theory of belief and action known as Bayesian decision theory. The principle idea is that the strength of an agent's desires for various possible outcomes should combine with her belief-strengths regarding claims about the world to produce optimally rational decisions. Bayesian subjectivists provide a logic that captures this idea, and they attempt to justify this logic by showing that in principle it leads to optimal decisions about which of various risky alternatives should be pursued. On the Bayesian subjectivist or personalist account of inductive probability, inductive probability functions represent the subjective (or personal) belief-strengths of ideally rational agents, the kind of belief strengths that figure into rational decision making. (See the section on subjective probability in the entry on interpretations of the probability calculus, in this Encyclopedia.)

Elements of the logicist conception of inductive logic live on today as part of the general approach called Bayesian inductive logic. However, among philosophers and statisticians the term ‘Bayesian’ is now most closely associated with the subjectivist or personalist account of belief and decision. And the term ‘Bayesian inductive logic’ has come to carry the connotation of a logic that involves purely subjective probabilities. This current usage is misleading since in inductive logic the Bayesian/non-Bayesian distinction should really hang on whether the logic gives Bayes' theorem a prominent role, or whether the logic largely eschews the use of Bayes' theorem in inductive inferences, as does the classical approach to statistical inference. Indeed, any inductive logic that draws on the usual axioms of probability theory to express the probabilistic support of hypotheses by evidence almost has to be a Bayesian inductive logic in this broader sense.

In this article the probabilistic inductive logic we will examine is a Bayesian inductive logic in the broader sense. This logic will not presuppose the subjectivist Bayesian theory of belief and decision, and will avoid the objectionable features of Bayesian logicism. We will see that there are good reasons to distinguish inductive probabilities from both Bayesian degree-of-belief probabilities and from purely logical probabilities. So, the probabilistic logic articulated in this article will be presented in an autonomous way, though it may be fitted into a Bayesian subjectivist or Bayesian logicist program, if one desires to do so.

2.2 Probabilistic Logic: Axioms and Characteristics

All logics derive from the meanings of terms in sentences. What we now recognize as formal deductive logic rests on the meanings (i.e., the truth-functional properties) of the standard logical terms. These terms, and the symbols we will employ to represent them, are as follows: ‘not’, ‘~’; ‘and’, ‘·’; ‘or’, ‘∨’; truth-functional ‘if-then’, ‘⊃’; ‘if and only if’, ‘≡’; the quantifiers ‘all’, ‘∀’, and ‘some’, ‘∃’; and the identity relation, ‘=’. The meanings of all other terms (i.e., names, and predicate and relational expressions) are permitted to “float free”. That is, the logic doesn't depend on their meanings or the truth-values of sentences containing them, but only supposes them to be meaningful and that sentences containing them have truth-values. Deductive logic only tells us that the logical structures of some sentences — i.e., the syntactic arrangements of their logical terms — preclude them from being jointly true of any single possible state of affairs. This is the notion of logical inconsistency. The notion of logical entailment is interdefinable with it. A collection of premise sentences logically entails a conclusion sentence just when the negation of the conclusion is logically inconsistent with those premises.

An inductive logic must, it seems, deviate from this paradigm in several significant ways. For one thing, logical entailment is an absolute, all-or-nothing relationship between sentences, whereas inductive support comes in degrees of strength. For another, although the notion of inductive support is analogous to the deductive notion of logical entailment, and is arguably an extension of it, there seems to be no inductive logic extension of the notion of logical inconsistency—at least none that is inter-definable with inductive support in the way that logical inconsistency is inter-definable with logical entailment. That is, B logically entails A just when (B·~A) is logically inconsistent. However, it turns out that when the unconditional probability of (B·~A) is very nearly 0 (i.e., when (B·~A) is “nearly inconsistent”), the degree to which B inductively supports A, P[A | B], may range anywhere from nearly 0 to very near 1.

Another notable difference is that when B logically entails A, adding a premise C cannot undermine the entailment—i.e., (C·B) must entail A as well. This property of logical entailment is called monotonicity. But inductive support is nonmonotonic. Adding a new premise C to B may substantially raise the degree of support for A, or substantially lower it, or may leave it completely unchanged—i.e., P[A | C·B] may have a value much larger than P[A | B], or a much smaller value, or it may have the same, or nearly the same value.

In a formal treatment of probabilistic inductive logic, inductive support is represented by conditional probability functions defined on sentences of a formal language L. These probability functions are constrained by certain rules or axioms regarding the role played by the logical terms (i.e., ‘not’, ‘and’, ‘or’, etc., the quantifiers ‘all’ and ‘some’, and the identity relation). The axioms apply without regard for what the other terms of the language may mean. In essence the axioms specify a family of possible support functions, {Pβ, Pγ, … , Pδ, …} for a given language L. Although each support function satisfies these same axioms, the further issue of which among them provides an appropriate measure of inductive support is not settled by the axioms alone. That may depend on additional factors, such as the meanings of the non-logical terms in the language.

A good way to specify the rules or axioms of the logic of inductive support functions is as follows. Let L be a language for predicate logic with identity, and let ‘⊨’ be the standard logical entailment relation.

A support function is a function Pα from pairs of sentences of L to real numbers between 0 and 1 that satisfies the following rules or axioms:
  1. Pα[D | E] < 1 for some sentences D and E.

For all sentence A, B, C, and D,

  1. If BA, then Pα[A | B] =1;
  2. If ⊨(BC), then Pα[A | B] = Pα[A | C];
  3. If C⊨ ~(B·A), then either Pα[(AB) | C] = Pα[A | C] + Pα[B | C] or Pα[D | C] = 1;
  4. Pα[(A·B) | C] = Pα[A | (B·C)] · Pα[B | C].

This axiomatization takes conditional probability as basic, as seems appropriate for support functions. These functions agree with the usual unconditional probability functions when the latter are defined—just let Pα[A] = Pα[A | (D ∨~D)]. However, these axioms permit conditional probabilities Pα[A | C] to remain defined even when condition statement C has probability 0 (i.e., even when Pα[C | (D∨~D)] is zero).

Notice that conditional probability functions apply only to pairs of sentences, a premise sentence and a conclusion sentence. So in probabilistic inductive logic we represent finite collections of premises by conjoining them into a single sentence. Rather than say, ‘A is supported to degree r by the premises {B1, B2,…,Bn}’, we say ‘A is supported to degree r by the premise (B1·B2·…·Bn)’, and write this as P[A | (B1·B2·…·Bn)] = r’.

Let us briefly consider each axiom, 1-5, to see how plausible it is as a constraint on a quantitative measure of inductive support, and how it extends the notion of deductive entailment. First, notice that adopting an inductive support scale between 0 and 1 is merely a convenience. This scale is usual for probabilities; but any other scale might do as well.

Rule (1) is a non-triviality requirement. It says that some sentences must be supported by others to degree less than 1. We might instead have required that Pα[(A·~A) | (A∨~A)] < 1; but this turns out to be derivable from Rule (1) together with the other rules.

Each degree-of-support function Pα on L measures support strength with numerical values between 0 and 1, with maximal support at 1. Deductive entailment can be viewed as a special case of maximal inductive support. So, when B logically entail A, B supports A to the maximum extent. This is just what Rule (2) asserts. It comports with the idea that an inductive support function is a kind of generalization of the deductive entailment relation.

Rule (3) is equally obvious. It says that whenever B is logically equivalent to C, as premises each must provide precisely the same amount of support to every conclusion.

Rule (4) says that inductive support “adds up” in a plausible way. When C logically entails the incompatibility of A and B, the support C provides each separately must sum to the support it provides for their disjunction. The only exception is in cases where C acts like a contradiction and supports all sentences to degree 1.

To understand what Rule (5) says, think of a support function Pα as describing a measure on possible worlds or possible states of affairs. Pα[C | D] = r’ says that the proportion of worlds in which C is true among those where D is true is r. Rule (5) then says the following: if A is true in fraction r of worlds where B and C are true together, and if B (together with C) is true in proportion q of all the C-worlds, then A and B (and C) should be true together in fraction r of that proportion q of B (and C) worlds among the C-worlds.[2]

From these five rules or axioms, all of the usual theorems of probability theory are easily derived. For example, logically equivalent sentences are always supported to the same degree: if C ⊨ (BA), then Pα[A | C] = Pα[B | C]. The following generalization of the Addition Rule (4) holds:

Pα[(AB) | C] = Pα[A | C] + Pα[B | C] − Pα[(A·B) | C].

It also follows that if {B1,…, Bn,…} is any countable set of sentences such that for each pair Bi and Bj, C ⊨ ~(Bi·Bj) (i.e., the members of the set are mutually exclusive, given C), then limn Pα[(B1B2 ∨ …∨Bn) | C] = ∑i Pα[Bi | C], unless Pα[D | C] = 1 for every sentence D.[3]

In the context of inductive logic it makes good sense to supplement the above rules with two additional rules. One is this:

  1. If A is an axiom of set theory or any other piece of pure mathematics employed by the sciences, or if A is analytically truth (given the meanings of terms in L), then, for all C, Pα[A | C] = 1.

The idea is that inductive logic is about evidential support for contingent claims. Nothing can count as empirical evidence against non-contingent truths. They should be “maximally supported” by all claims.

One important respect in which inductive logic should follow the deductive paradigm is in not presupposing the truth-values of contingent sentences. No inductive support function Pα should permit a tautological premise to assign degree of support 1 to a contingent claim—i.e., Pα[C | B ∨~B] should always be less than 1 when C is contingent. For, the whole idea of inductive logic is to provide a measure of the extent to which contingent premise sentences indicate the likely truth-values of contingent conclusion sentences. And this idea won't work properly if the truth-values of some contingent sentences are presupposed. Such presuppositions would make inductive logic enthymematic. It may hide significant premises in inductive support relationships.

However, it is common practice for probabilistic logicians to sweep provisionally accepted contingent claims under the rug by assigning them probability 1. This saves the trouble of repeatedly writing a given contingent sentence B as a premise, since Pγ[A | B·C] will just equal Pγ[A | C] whenever Pγ[B | C] = 1. Although this device is useful, such probability functions should be considered mere abbreviations of proper, logically explicit, non-enthymematic, inductive support functions. Thus, properly speaking, an inductive support function Pα should not assign probability 1 to a sentence relative to all possible premises unless that sentence is either (i) logically true, or (ii) an axiom of set theory or some other piece of pure mathematics employed by the sciences, or (iii) unless according to the interpretation of the language that Pα presupposes, the sentence is analytic, and so outside the realm of evidential support. Thus, we adopt the following version of the so-called “axiom of regularity”.

  1. If, for all C, Pα[A | C] = 1, then A is a logical truth or an axiom of set theory or some other piece of pure mathematics employed by the sciences, or is analytically true (according to the meanings of the terms of L as represented in Pα).

This is more a convention than an axiom. Taken together with (6) it tells us that a support function Pα counts as non-contingently true just those sentences that it assigns probability 1 on every premise.

Bayesian logicists such as Keynes and Carnap thought that inductive logic might be made to depend solely on the logical form of sentences, just like deductive logic. The idea was, effectively, to supplement axioms 1–7 with additional axioms that depend only on the logical structures of sentences, and to do so with enough such axioms to reduce the number of possible support functions to a single unique function. It is now widely agreed that this project cannot be carried out in a plausible way. Perhaps there are additional rules that should be added to 1–7. But it is doubtful such rules can suffice to specify a single, uniquely qualified support function based only on logical structure. We will show why in Section 3, after seeing how inductive probabilities capture the relationship between hypotheses and evidence.

2.3 Two Conceptions of Inductive Probability

Axioms 1–7 for conditional probability functions merely place formal constraints on what may properly count as a degree of support function. Each function Pα satisfying these rules may be viewed as a possible way of applying the notion of inductive support to a language L that respects the meanings of the logical terms, much as each possible truth-value assignment for a language represents a possible way of assigning truth-values to its sentences in a way that respects the semantic rules expressing the meanings of the logical terms. The issue of which of the possible truth-value assignments to a language represents the actual truth or falsehood of its sentences depends on more than this—it depends on the meanings of the non-logical terms and on the state of the actual world. Similarly, the degree to which some sentences actually support others in a fully meaningful language must rely on something more than merely satisfying the axioms for support functions. It must, at least, rely on what the sentences of the language mean, and perhaps on much more besides. But, what more? Various “interpretations of probability”, which offer accounts of how support functions are to be understood, may help by filling out our conception of what inductive support is really about. There are two prominent views.

One reading is to take each Pα as a measure on possible worlds, or possible states of affairs. The idea is that, given a fully meaningful language (and, perhaps relative to the inferential inclinations of a particular agent, α) Pα[A | B] = r’ says that among the worlds in which B is true, A is true in proportion r of them. There will generally not be a single privileged way to define such a measure on possible worlds. Rather, it may be that each of a number of functions Pα, Pβ, Pγ, …, etc., satisfying the constraints imposed by axioms 1-7 can represent a viable measure of the inferential import of propositions expressed by sentences of the language. This idea needs more fleshing out, of course. The next section will give some indication of how that might go.

Subjectivist Bayesians offer an alternative reading of the support functions. First, they usually take unconditional probability as basic, and they take conditional probabilities as defined in terms of them: the conditional probability Pα[A | B]’ is defined as a ratio of unconditional probabilities, Pα[A·B]/Pα[B]. Subjectivist Bayesians take each unconditional probability function Pα to represent the belief-strengths or confidence-strengths of an ideally rational agent, α. On this understanding Pα[A] =r’ says, “the strength of α's belief (or confidence) that A is truth is r.” Subjectivist Bayesians usually tie such belief strengths to what the agent would be willing to bet on A turning out to be true. Roughly, the idea is this. Suppose that an ideally rational agent α would be willing to accept a wager that would yield (no less than) $u if A turns out to be true and would lose him $1 if A turns out to be false. Then, under reasonable assumptions about how much he desires money, it can be shown that his belief strength that A is true should be Pα[A] = 1/(u+1). And it can further be shown that any function Pα that expresses such betting-related belief-strengths on all statements in agent α's language must satisfy axioms for unconditional probabilities analogous to axioms 1–5. [4] Moreover, it can be shown that any function Pβ that satisfies these axioms is a possible rational belief function for some ideally rational agent β. These relationships between belief-strengths and the desirability of outcomes (e.g., gaining money or goods on bets) are at the core of subjectivist Bayesian decision theory. Subjectivist Bayesians usually take inductive probability to just be this notion of probabilistic belief-strength.

Undoubtedly real agents do believe some claims more strongly than others. And, arguably, the belief strengths of real agents can be measured on a probabilistic scale between 0 and 1, at least approximately. And clearly the inductive support of evidence for hypotheses should influence the strength of an agent's belief in those hypotheses. However, there is good reason for caution about viewing inductive support functions as Bayesian belief-strength functions, as we will see a bit later. So, perhaps an agent's support function is not simply identical to his belief function, and perhaps the relationship between inductive support and belief-strength is somewhat more complicated.

In any case, some account of what support functions are supposed to represent is clearly needed. The belief function account and the possible worlds account are two attempts to provide this. Let us put this interpretative issue aside for now. One may be able to get a better handle on what inductive support functions really are after one sees how the inductive logic that draws on them is supposed to work.

3. The Application of Inductive Probabilities to the Evaluation of Scientific Hypotheses

One of the most important applications of a formal inductive logic is to the confirmation or refutation of scientific hypotheses. The logic should explicate the notion of evidential support for all sorts of hypotheses, ranging from simple diagnostic claims (e.g., “the patient is infected with the HIV”) to scientific theories about the fundamental nature of the world, like quantum mechanics or the theory of relativity. We'll now look into how support functions (a.k.a. confirmation functions) represent the logic of hypothesis confirmation. This kind of inductive logic is often referred to as Bayesian Confirmation Theory.

Consider some exhaustive set {h1, h2,…} of mutually incompatible hypotheses or theories about some subject matter. The set of alternatives may be very simple, e.g., {“the patient has HIV”, “the patient is free of HIV”}. Or, when the physician is trying to determine which among a range of diseases is causing the patient's symptoms, the alternative hypotheses may consist of a long list of possible diseases. For the cosmologist the alternatives may be a list of several alternative gravitational theories, or several versions of the “same theory“. Where inductive logic is concerned, even a slightly different version of a given theory will count as a distinct theory if it differs from the original in empirical import. (This should not be confused with the converse claim, which is the positivistic assertion that theories with the same empirical content are really the same theory. Inductive logic doesn't require you to buy that!)

In general there may be finitely or infinitely many such alternatives under consideration. They may all be considered at once, or they may be constructed and compared over a long historical period. One may even think of the set of alternative hypotheses as consisting of all logically possible alternatives expressible in a given language about a given subject matter—e.g., all possible theories of the origin and evolution of the universe expressible in English and mathematics. Although testing every possible alternative may pose practical challenges, it turns out that the logic works much the same way in the logically ideal case as it does in realistic cases.

If the set of alternative hypotheses is finite, it may contain a catch-all hypothesis hK that says that none of the other hypotheses are true (e.g., “none of the other known diseases is present”). When only some number u of explicit alternative hypotheses is under consideration, hK is just the sentence (~h1·…·~hu).

Evidence for scientific hypotheses consists of the results of specific experiments or observations. For a given experiment or observation, let ‘c’ represent a description of the relevant conditions under which it is performed, and let ‘e’ represent a description of the result, the evidential outcome of condition c.

Scientific hypotheses often require the mediation of background knowledge and auxiliary hypotheses to help them express claims about evidence. Let ‘b’ represent all background and auxilliaries not at issue in the assessment of the hypotheses hi, but that mediate their implications about evidence. In cases where a hypothesis is deductively related to evidence, either hi·b·ce or hi·b·c ⊨ ~e.

For example, hi might be the Newtonian Theory of Gravitation. A test of the theory might involve a condition statement c describing the results of some earlier measurements of Jupiter's position, and describing the means by which the next position measurement will be made; the outcome description e states the result of this additional position measurement; and the background information (or auxiliary hypotheses) b might state some already well confirmed theory about the workings and accuracy of the devices used to make the position measurements. If outcome e can be calculated from the theory hi together with b and c, we have hi·b·ce (hi·b·c logically entails e). Thus, if (c·e) occurs, this may be considered good evidence for hi, given b, as the hypothetico-deductive account of confirmation maintains. On the other hand, if from hi·b·c we calculate some outcome incompatible with e, then hi·b·c ⊨ ~e. In that case from deductive logic alone we get that b·c·e ⊨ ~hi, and hi is said to be falsified by b·c·e. (Duhem (1906) and Quine (1953) are generally credited with alerting inductive logicians to the importance of auxiliary hypotheses. They point out that scientific hypotheses often make little contact with evidence claims on their own. So, often the evidence can only falsify hypotheses relative to the background or auxiliary hypotheses that tie them to that evidence.)

In a probabilistic inductive logic the degree to which evidence c·e supports a hypothesis hi relative to background b is represented by the posterior probability of hi, Pα[hi | b·cn·en]. It turns out that the posterior probability of a hypothesis depends on just two kinds of factors: (1) its prior probability, Pα[hi | b], together with the prior probabilities of its competitors, Pα[hj | b], etc.; and (2) the likelihood of evidential outcomes e according to hi, give that b and c are true, P[e | hi·b·c], together with the likelihoods of outcomes according to its competitors, P[e | hj·b·c], etc. In this section we will first examine each of these two kinds of factors in some detail, and then see precisely how the values of posterior probabilities depend on them.

3.1 Likelihoods

In probabilistic inductive logic the likelihoods carry the empirical import of hypotheses. A likelihood is a support function probability of form P[e | hi·b·c]. It expresses how likely it is that outcome e will occur according to hypothesis hi.[5] If a hypothesis together with auxiliaries and observation conditions deductively entails an evidence claim, the axioms of probability make the corresponding likelihood objective in the sense that every support function must agree on its values: i.e., P[e | hi·b·c] = 1 if hi·b·ce; P[e | hi·b·c] = 0 if hi·b·c ⊨ ~e. However, in many cases the hypothesis hi will not be deductively related to the evidence, but will only imply it probabilistically. There are (at least) two ways this might happen. Either hi may itself be an explicitly probabilistic or statistical hypothesis, or it may be that an auxiliary statistical hypothesis, as part of background b, connects hi to the evidence. Let's briefly consider examples of each.

A blood test for HIV has a known false-positive rate and a known true-positive rate. Suppose the false positive rate is .05 — i.e., the test incorrectly shows the blood sample to be positive for HIV in 5% of all cases where no HIV is present. And suppose the true-positive rate is .99—i.e., the test correctly shows the blood sample to be positive for HIV in 99% of all cases where HIV really is present.When a particular patient's blood is tested, the hypotheses under consideration are ‘the patient is infected with HIV’, h, and ‘the patient is not infected with HIV’, ~h. In this context the known test characteristics function as background information, b. The experimental condition c merely states that this patient was subjected to a blood test for HIV, which was processed by the lab in the usual way. Let us suppose that the outcome e states that the result is positive for HIV. The relevant likelihoods, then, are P[e | h·b·c] = .99 and P[e | ~h·b·c] = .05.

In this example the values of the likelihoods are entirely due to the statistical characteristics of the accuracy of the test, which is carried by the background information b. The hypothesis h being tested is not itself statistical.

This kind of situation may, of course, arise for much more complex hypotheses. The hypothesis of interest may be some deterministic physical theory, say Newtonian Gravitation Theory. Some of the experiments that test this theory relay on somewhat imprecise measurements that have known statistical error characteristics, which are expressed as part of the background or auxiliary hypotheses b. For example, the auxiliary b may describe the error characteristics of a device that measures the torque imparted to a quartz fiber, used to assess the strength of the gravitational force between test masses. In that case b may say that for this kind of device measurement errors are normally distributed about whatever value a given gravitational theory predicts, with some specified standard deviation that is characteristic of the device. This results in specific values ri for the likelihoods, P[e | hi·b·c] = ri, for each of the various alternative gravitational theories hi being tested.

On the other hand, the hypotheses being tested may themselves be statistical in nature. One of the simplest examples of statistical hypotheses and their role in likelihoods are hypotheses about the chance characteristic of coin-tossing. Let h[r] be a hypothesis that says a specific coin has a propensity r (e.g., 1/2) for coming up heads on normal tosses, and that such tosses are probabilistically independent of one another. Let c state that the coin is tossed n times in the normal way; and let e say that on these tosses the coin comes up heads m times. In cases like this the value of the likelihood of the outcome e on hypothesis h for condition c is well-known: P[e | h[r]·b·c] = [n!/(m!(nm)!)] rm (1−r)nm.

There are, of course, more complex cases of likelihoods involving statistical hypotheses. Consider, for example, the hypothesis that plutonium 233 nuclei have a half-life of 20 minutes—i.e., the propensity for a Pu-233 nucleus to decay within a 20 minute period is 1/2. This hypothesis, h, together with background b about decay products and the efficiency of the equipment used to detect them (which may itself be an auxiliary statistical hypothesis), yields precisely calculable values for likelihoods P[ek | h·b·c] of possible outcomes of the experimental arrangement.

Likelihoods that arise from explicit statistical claims — either within the hypotheses being tested, or from explicit statistical background claims that tie the hypotheses to the evidence — are often called direct inference likelihoods. Such likelihoods are completely objective. So it seems reasonable to suppose that all support functions should agree on their values, just as all support functions agree on likelihoods when evidence is logically entailed. Direct inference likelihoods are logical in an extended, non-deductive sense. Indeed, some logicians have attempted to spell out the logic of direct inferences in terms of the logical form of the sentences involved.[6] But regardless of whether that project succeeds, it seems reasonable to take likelihoods of this sort to have highly objective or intersubjectively agreed values.

Not all likelihoods of interest in confirmational contexts are warranted deductively or by explicitly stated statistical claims. Nevertheless, the likelihoods that relate hypotheses to evidence in scientific contexts should often have objective or intersubjectively agreed values. So, although a variety of different support functions Pα, Pβ ,…, Pγ, etc., may be needed to represent the differing “inductive proclivities” of the various members of a scientific community, all should agree, at least approximately, on the values of the likelihoods. For, likelihoods represent the empirical content of a hypothesis, what the hypothesis (together with background b) probabilistically implies about the evidence. Thus, the empirical objectivity of a science relies on a high degree of objectivity or intersubjective agreement among scientists on the numerical values of likelihoods.

To see the point more vividly, imagine what a science would be like if scientists disagreed widely about the values of likelihoods. Each practitioner interprets a theory to say quite different things how likely it is that various possible evidence statements will turn out to be true. Whereas scientist α takes theory h1 to probabilistically imply that event e is highly likely, his colleague β understands the empirical import of h1 to say that e is very unlikely. And, conversely, α takes competing theory h2 to probabilistically imply that e is quite unlikely, whereas β reads h2 to say that e is very likely. So, for α the evidence outcome e supplies strong support for h1 over h2, because Pα[e | h1·b·c] >> Pα[e | h2·b·c]. But his colleague β takes outcome e to show just the opposite — that h2 is strongly supported over h1 — because Pβ[e | h1·b·c] << Pβ[e | h2·b·c]. If this kind of thing were to occur often or for significant evidence claims in a scientific domain, it would make a shambles of the empirical objectivity of that science. It would completely undermine the empirical testability of its hypotheses and theories. Under such circumstances, although each scientist employs the same theoretical sentences to express a given theory h, each understands the empirical import of these sentences so differently that h as understood by α is an empirically different theory than h as understood by β. Thus, the empirical objectivity of the sciences requires that experts should be in close agreement about the values of the likelihoods.[7]

For now we will suppose that the likelihoods have objective or intersubjectively agreed values, common to all agents in a scientific community. Let us mark this agreement by dropping the subscript ‘α’, ‘β’, etc., from expressions that represent likelihoods. One might worry that this supposition is overly strong. There are many legitimate scientific contexts where, although scientists should have enough of a common understanding of the empirical import of hypotheses to assign quite similar values to likelihoods, precise agreement on the numerical values is unrealistic. This point is well taken. Later we will see how to relax the supposition that likelihood values agree precisely. But for now, the main ideas behind probabilistic inductive logic will be more easily explained if we focus on those contexts were objective or intersubjectively agreed likelihoods are available. Towards the end of this article we will see that much the same logic continues to apply in contexts where the values of likelihoods may be somewhat vague, or where members of the scientific community disagree to some extent about their values.

An adequate treatment of the likelihoods calls for the introduction of one additional notational device. Scientific hypotheses are generally tested by a sequence of experiments or observations conducted over a period of time. To explicitly represent the accumulation of evidence, let the series of sentences c1, c2, …, cn, describe the conditions under which a sequence of experiments or observations are conducted. And let the corresponding outcomes of these observations be represented by sentences e1, e2,…,en. We will abbreviate the conjunction of the first n descriptions of experimental or observation conditions as ‘cn’, and abbreviate the conjunction of descriptions of their outcomes as ‘en’. Then, for a stream of n observations or experiments and their outcomes, the likelihoods take form P[en | hi·b·cn] = r, for appropriate r between 0 and 1. In many cases in the sciences the likelihood of the evidence stream is equal to the product of the likelihoods of the individual outcomes: P[en | hi·b·cn] = P[e1 | hi·b·c1] ·…· P[en | hi·b·cn]. When this holds, the individual bits of evidence are said to be probabilistically independent on the hypothesis. However, such independence may not always hold.

3.2 Posterior Probabilities and Prior Probabilities

In probabilistic inductive logic the evaluation of a hypothesis on evidence is represented by its posterior probability, Pα[hi | b·cn·en]. The posterior probability represents the net plausibility of the hypothesis resulting from the combination of the evidence together with any relevant non-evidential plausibility considerations. The likelihoods are the means through which evidence contributes to posterior probabilities. But another factor, the prior probability of the hypothesis (on background b), Pα[hi | b], also makes a contribution. It represents the weight of all non-evidential plausibility considerations on which posterior plausibilities may depend. It turns out that posterior probabilities depend only on the values of (ratios of) likelihoods and on the values of (ratios of) prior probabilities.

To understand the role of prior probabilities, consider the HIV test example described in the previous section. What the physician and patient want to know is the value of the posterior probability Pα[h | b·c·e] that the patient has HIV, h, given the evidence of the positive test, c·e, and given the error rates of the test, described by b. The value of this posterior probability depends on the likelihood (due to the error rates) of this patient obtaining a true-positive result, P[e | h·b·c] = .99, and of obtaining a false positive result, P[e | ~h·b·c] = .05. In addition, the value of the of the posterior probability depends on how plausible it is that the patient has HIV before the test results are taken into account, Pα[h | b]. In the context of medical diagnosis this prior probability is sometimes called the base rate. It is the plausibility that the patient may have contracted HIV based on his risk group (i.e., whether he is an IV drug user, has unprotected sex with multiple partners, etc.). Such information may be explicitly stated in the background, b. To see its importance, consider the following numerical results (which may be calculated using the formula called Bayes' Theorem, presented in the next section). If the base rate for the patient's risk group is relatively high, say Pα[h | b] = .10, then the positive test result yields a probability for his having HIV of Pα[h | b·c·e] = .69. However, if the patient is in a very low risk group, Pα[h | b] = .001, then a positive test only raises the plausibility of HIV infection to Pα[h | b·c·e] = .02. This posterior probability is much higher than the prior probability of .001, but should not worry the patient too much. This positive test result is more likely due to the false-positive rate of the test than to the presence of HIV. (This sort of test, with such a large false-positive rate, .05, is best used as a screening test; a positive result should lead to a second, more rigorous, more expensive test.)

In the evidential evaluation of scientific theories, prior probabilities often represent assessments by agents of non-evidential, conceptually motivated plausibility weightings among hypotheses. However, because such plausibility assessments tend to vary among agents, critics often brand them as merely subjective, and take their role in probabilistic induction to be highly problematic. Bayesian inductivists counter that such assessments often play an important role in the sciences, especially when there is insufficient evidence to distinguish among some of the alternative hypotheses. And, they argue, the epithet merely subjective is unwarranted. Such plausibility assessments are often backed by extensive arguments that may draw on forceful conceptual considerations.

Consider, for example, the kind of plausibility arguments that have been brought to bear on the various interpretations of quantum theory (e.g., those related to the measurement problem). These arguments go to the heart of conceptual issues that were central to the development of the theory. Indeed, many of these issues were first raised by the scientists who made the greatest contributions to the theory's development, in the attempt to get a conceptual hold on the theory and its implications. Although disagreements remain, such arguments seem to play a legitimate role in the assessment of alternative views when distinguishing evidence has yet to be found.

More generally, scientists often bring plausibility arguments to bear in assessing their views. Although such arguments are seldom decisive, they may bring the scientific community into widely shared agreement, especially regarding the implausibility of some logically possible alternatives. This seems to be the primary epistemic role of the thought experiment. It is arguably a virtue of probabilistic induction that it provides a place for such assessments to figure into the full evaluation of hypotheses. Although prior probabilities may be subjective in the sense that agents may disagree on the relative strengths of plausibility arguments—and so disagree on the plausibilities of various hypotheses—priors are far from being mere subjective whims. Moreover, probabilistic induction shows how, when sufficient empirical evidence becomes available, such plausibility assessments are “washed out” or overridden by the evidence. We'll see how this works in Sections 4 and 5.

Bayesian logicists like Keynes and Carnap maintained that posterior probabilities of hypotheses should be determined by logical form alone. The idea was that the likelihoods might reasonably be specified in terms of logical form; so if logical form might be made to determine the values of prior probabilities as well, then inductive logic would be fully “formal” in the same way that deductive logic is formal. Keynes and Carnap tried to implement this idea through syntactic versions of the principle of indifference — the idea that syntactically similar hypotheses should be assigned the same prior probability values. Carnap showed how to carry out this project in detail, but only for extremely simple formal languages. Most logicians now take the project to have failed because of a fatal flaw with the whole idea that reasonable prior probabilities can be made to depend on logical form alone. Semantic content should matter. Goodmanian grue-predicates provide one way to illustrate the point.[8]

We will return to the discussion of prior probabilities in a bit. But it is now time to see how the likelihoods combine with prior probabilities to yield posterior probabilities for hypotheses.

3.3 Bayes' Theorem

Any probabilistic inductive logic that draws on the usual axioms of probability theory to represent how evidence supports hypotheses must be a Bayesian inductive logic in the broad sense. For, Bayes' Theorem is just a simple theorem of probability theory. Its importance is due to the relationship it expresses between hypotheses and evidence. The theorem shows how, through the likelihoods, evidence combines with prior plausibility assessments to produce posterior plausibility values for hypotheses. A logic of hypothesis evaluation of this sort is often referred to as a Bayesian Confirmation Theory.

Let's now examine several forms of Bayes' Theorem, each derivable from axioms 1–5. The simplest is this:

Bayes' Theorem: Simple Form
(8) Pα[hi|b·cn·en] =
P[en|hi·b·cn] · Pα[hi|b]
P[en|hi·b·cn] · Pα[hi|b]
if Pα[cn|hi·b]=Pα[cn|b].

This equation expresses the posterior probability of hi, Pα[hi | b·cn·en], in terms of the likelihood of the evidence on the hypothesis (together with background and observation conditions), P[en | hi·b·cn], the prior probability of the hypothesis (given background conditions), Pα[hi | b], and the simple probability of the evidence (given background and observation conditions), Pα[en | b·cn]. This latter probability is sometimes called the expectedness of the evidence.

This version of Bayes' Theorem also includes a term, (Pα[cn | hi·b] / Pα[cn | b]), that represents the ratio of the likelihood of the experimental conditions on the hypothesis and background to the “likelihood” of the experimental conditions on the background alone. Bayes' Theorem is usually expressed in a way that suppresses this factor by building cn into the background b. However, if cn is built into b, then technically b must change as new evidence is accumulated. It is better to make the factor explicit, and see how to deal with it logically. Arguably the term (Pα[cn | hi·b] / Pα[cn | b]) should be 1, or near 1, since the truth of the hypothesis at issue should not significantly affect how likely it is that the experimental conditions are satisfied. If various alternative hypotheses assign significantly different likelihoods to the experimental conditions, then such conditions should more properly be included in the evidential outcomes en.

Both the prior probability of the hypothesis and the expectedness tend to be “subjective”. That is, various agents from the same scientific community may legitimately disagree on what values these factors should take. Bayesian logicians usually accept the subjectivity of the prior probabilities of hypotheses, but they find the subjectivity of the expectedness more troubling. However, this problem is easily finessed.

The subjective expectedness of the evidence may be circumvented by considering a ratio form of Bayes' Theorem, a form that compares hypotheses one pair at a time:

Bayes' Theorem: Ratio Form
Pα[hj | b·cn·en]
Pα[hi | b·cn·en]
P[en | hj·b·cn]
P[en | hi·b·cn]
Pα[hj | b]
Pα[hi | b]
Pα[cn | hj·b]
Pα[cn | hi·b]
P[en | hj·b·cn]
P[en | hi·b·cn]
Pα[hj | b]
Pα[hi | b]

The second line follows if cn is no more likely on hi·b than on hj·b—i.e., if neither hypothesis makes the occurrence of experimental or observation conditions more likely than the other.[9]

This ratio form of Bayes' Theorem expresses how much more plausible, on the evidence, one hypothesis is than an alternative. Notice that the only subjective element affecting the ratio of posterior probabilities is the ratio of prior probabilities. We see from this equation that the likelihood ratios carry the full import of the evidence. The evidence influences the evaluation of hypotheses in no other way.

Let's consider a simple example. Suppose we possess a warped coin and want to determine its propensity for heads. We may compare two hypotheses, h[q] and h[r], that propose the propensity for heads is q and r, respectively. Let cn report that the coin is tossed n times in the normal way, and let en report a total m heads. Equation (9) then yields:

Pα[h[q] | b·cn·en]
Pα[h[r] | b·cn·en]
qm (1−q)nm
rm (1−r)nm
Pα[h[q] | b]
Pα[h[r] | b]

When, for instance, the coin is tossed n = 100 times and comes up heads m = 72 times, the evidence for hypothesis h[1/2] as compared to h[3/4] is given by the likelihood ratio [(1/2)72(1/2)28]/[(3/4)72(1/4)28] = .000056269. So, even if prior to the evidence, one considers it 100 times more plausible that the coin is fair than that it is warped towards heads with propensity 3/4—i.e., even if Pα[h[1/2] | b] / Pα[h[3/4] | b] = 100—the evidence provided by these tosses makes the posterior plausibility that the coin is fair only about 6/1000th as plausible as the hypothesis that it is warped towards heads with propensity 3/4 — i.e., Pα[h[1/2] | b·cn·en] / Pα[h[3/4] | b·cn·en] = .0056269. Thus, such evidence strongly refutes the “fairness hypothesis” relative to the “3/4-heads-propensity hypothesis”, provided the assessment of prior plausibilities doesn't make the latter hypothesis too extremely implausible to begin with. Notice, however, that strong refutation is not absolute refutation. Additional evidence could reverse the trend towards the strong refutation of the “fairness hypothesis”.

This example employs repetitions of the same kind of experiment — repeated tosses of a coin. But the point holds more generally. If, as the evidence increases, the likelihood ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] approach 0, then the Ratio Form of Bayes' Theorem, Equation 9, shows that the posterior probability of hj must approach 0 as well. The evidence comes to strongly refute hj with little regard for its prior plausibility value. Indeed, Bayesian induction turns out to be a version of eliminative induction, and Equation 9 begins to illustrate this. For, suppose that hi is the true hypothesis, and consider what happens to each of its false competitors, hj. If enough evidence becomes available to drive each of the likelihood ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] toward 0 (as n increases), then Equation 9 says that each false hj will become effectively refuted—each of their posterior probabilities approaches 0. As a result, the posterior probability of hi must approach 1. The next two equations make this clear.

If we sum the ratio versions of Bayes' Theorem in Equation 9 over all alternatives to hypothesis hi (including the catch-all hK, if we need one), we get the Odds Form of Bayes' Theorem. The odds against A given b is defined as Ωα[~A | B] = Pα[~A | B] / Pα[A | B]. So, we have:

Bayes' Theorem: The Odds Form
(10) Ωα[~hi | b·cn·en] =
P[en | hj·b·cn]
P[en | hi·b·cn]
Pα[hj | b]
Pα[hi | b]
Pα[en | hK·b·cn]
P[en | hi·b·cn]
Pα[hK | b]
Pα[hi | b]

Notice that if a catch-all hypothesis is needed, the likelihood of evidence relative to it will not generally enjoy the same kind of objectivity as the likelihoods for specific, positive hypotheses. We leave the subscript α on the likelihood for the catch-all to indicate this lack of objectivity.

Although the catch-all hypothesis may lack objective likelihoods, the influence of the catch-all term in Bayes' theorem diminishes as additional positive hypotheses are articulated. That is, as new hypotheses are discovered they are “peeled off” of the catch-all. So, when a new hypothesis hu+1 is formulated and made explicit, the old catch-all hK is replaced by a new catch-all, hK*, of form (~h1·…·~hu·~hu+1); and the prior probability for the new catch-all hypothesis is gotten by diminishing the prior of the old catch-all: Pα[hK* | b] = Pα[hK | b]Pα[hu+1 | b]. Thus, the influence of the catch-all term should diminish towards 0 as new alternative hypotheses are made explicit.[10]

If increasing evidence drives the likelihood ratios comparing hi with each competitor towards 0, then the odds against hi, Ωα[~hi | b·cn·en], will approach 0 (provided that priors of catch-all terms, if needed, approach 0 as well as new alternative hypotheses are made explicit and peeled off). And, as Ωα[~hi | b·cn·en] approaches 0, the posterior probability of hi goes to 1. The relationship between the odds against hi and its posterior probability is this:

Bayes' Theorem: The General Probabilistic Form

(11)    Pα[hi | b·cn·en] = 1/(1 + Ωα[~hi | b·cn·en]).

There is a result, a kind of Bayesian Convergence Theorem, that shows that if hi (together with b·cn) is true, then the likelihood ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] comparing evidentially distinguishable alternative hypothesis hj to hi will very probably approach 0 as evidence accumulates (i.e., as n increases). Let's call this result the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem. When this theorem applies, Equation 9 shows that the posterior probability of false competitor hj will very probably approach 0 as evidence accumulates, regardless of the value of its prior probability Pα[hj | b]. As this happens to each of hi's false competitors, Equations 10 and 11 say that the posterior probability of the true hypothesis, hi, will very probably approach 1 as evidence increases.[11] Thus, Bayesian induction is at bottom a version of induction by elimination, where the elimination of alternatives comes by way of likelihood ratios approaching 0 as evidence accumulates. We will examine the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem in detail in Section 5.[12]

For more on Bayes' Theorem see the entries on Bayes' Theorem and on Bayesian epistemology in this Encyclopedia.

3.4 Likelihood Ratios, Likelihoodism, and the Law of Likelihood

The versions of Bayes' Theorem provided by Equations 9-11 show that for probabilistic inductive logic the influence of empirical evidence on posterior probabilities of hypotheses is completely captured by the ratios of likelihoods, P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn]. The evidence (cn·en) influences the posterior probabilities in no other way. So, the following “Law” is a consequence of the inductive logic of support functions.

General Law of Likelihood:
Given any pair of incompatible hypotheses hi and hj, whenever the likelihoods Pα[en | hj·b·cn] and Pα[en | hi·b·cn] are defined, the evidence (cn·en) supports hi over hj, given b, if and only if Pα[en | hi·b·cn] > Pα[en | hj·b·cn]. The ratio of likelihoods Pα[en | hi·b·cn] / Pα[en | hj·b·cn] measures the strength of the evidence for hi over hj given b.

Two features of this law require some explanation. As stated, the General Law of Likelihood does not presuppose that likelihoods of form Pα[en | hj·b·cn] and Pα[en | hi·b·cn] are always defined. This qualification is introduced to accommodate a conception of evidential support called Likelihoodism, which is especially influential among statisticians. Also, the likelihoods in the law are expressed with the subscript α attached to indicate that the law holds for each inductive support function Pα, even when the values of the likelihoods are not objective or agreed on by all agents in a given scientific community. These two features of the law are closely related, as we will see.

Each probabilistic support function satisfies the axioms of Section 2. According to these axioms the conditional probability of one sentence on another is always defined. So, in the context of the inductive logic of support functions the likelihoods are always defined, and the qualifying clause about this in the General Law of Likelihood is automatically satisfied. For inductive support functions, all of the versions of Bayes' theorem (Equations 8-11) continue to hold even when the likelihoods are not objective or intersubjectively agreed on by the scientific community. Although in many scientific contexts there will be agreement on the values of likelihoods, whenever such agreement fails, the subscripts α, β, etc. must remain attached to the support function likelihoods to indicate this. Even so, the General Law of Likelihood continues to hold.

There is a view, or family of views, called likelihoodism that maintains that the inductive logician or statistician should only concern himself with whether the evidence provides increased or decreased support for one hypothesis over another, and only in cases where this evaluation is based on the ratios of completely objective likelihoods. When the likelihoods involved are objective, the ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[e n | hi·b·cn] provide a pure, objective measure of how strongly the evidence supports hi as compared to hj, “untainted” by prior plausibility considerations. According to likelihoodists, only this kind of pure measure is scientifically appropriate for the assessment of how evidence impacts hypotheses.

Likelihoodists maintain that it is not appropriate for statisticians to incorporate assumptions about prior probabilities of hypotheses into the assessment of evidential support. It is not their place to compute recommended values of posterior probabilities for the scientific community. When the results of experiments are made public, say in scientific journals, only objective likelihoods should be reported. The evaluation of the impact of objective likelihoods on agents' posterior probabilities depends on each agent's individual subjective prior probability, which represents plausibility considerations that have nothing to do with the evidence. So, posterior probabilities should be left to individuals to compute, if they wish to do so.

The conditional probabilities for most pairs of sentences fail to be objectively defined in a way that suits likelihoodists. So, for them, the general logic of support functions (captured by the axioms of Section 2) cannot represent an objective logic of evidential support for hypotheses. Because they eschew the logic of support functions, likelihoodist do not have Bayes' theorem available, and so cannot derive the Law of Likelihood from it. Rather, they must state the Law of Likelihood as an axiom of their inductive logic, an axiom that applies only when the likelihoods have well-defined objective values.

Likelihoodists tend to have a very strict conception of what it takes for likelihoods to be well-defined. They consider a likelihood to be well-defined only when it is what we referred to earlier as a direct inference likelihood — i.e., only when either, (1) the hypothesis (together with background and experimental conditions) logically entails the data, or (2) the hypothesis (together with background) logically entails an explicit simple statistical hypothesis that (together with experimental conditions) specifies precise probabilities for each of the events that make up the evidence.

Likelihoodists contrast simple statistical hypotheses with composite statistical hypotheses, which only entail vague, or imprecise, or directional claims about the statistical probabilities of evidential events. Whereas a simple statistical hypothesis might say, for example, “ the chance of heads on tosses of the coin is precisely .65.”, by contrast a composite statistical hypothesis might say, “ the chance of heads on tosses is either .65 or .75,” or it may be a directional hypothesis that says, “ the chance of heads on tosses is greater than .65.” Likelihoodists maintain that composite hypotheses are not an appropriate basis for well-defined likelihoods. Such hypotheses represent a kind of disjunction of simple statistical hypotheses. The direction hypothesis, for instance, is essentially a disjunction of the various simple statistical hypotheses that assign specific values above .65 to the chances of heads on tosses. Likelihoods based on such hypotheses are not appropriately objective by the lights of the likelihoodist because they must in effect depend on factors that represent the degree to which the composite hypothesis supports each of the simple statistical hypotheses that it encompasses; and likelihoodists consider such factors too subjective to be permitted in a logic that countenances only objective likelihoods.[13]

Taking all of this into account, the version of the Law of Likelihood appropriate to likelihoodists may be stated as follows.

Special Law of Likelihood:
Given a pair of incompatible hypotheses hi and hj that imply simple statistical models regarding outcomes en given (b·cn), the likelihoods P[en | hj·b·cn] and P[en | hi·b·cn] are well defined. For such likelihoods, the evidence (cn·en) supports hi over hj, given b, if and only if P[en | hi·b·cn] > P[en | hj·b·cn]; the ratio of likelihoods P[en | hi·b·cn] / P[en | hj·b·cn] measures the strength of the evidence for hi over hj given b.

Notice that when either version of the Law of Likelihood holds, the absolute size of a likelihood is irrelevant to the strength of the evidence. All that matters is the relative size of the likelihoods for one hypothesis as compared to another. That is, let c1 and c2 be the conditions for two distinct experiments having outcomes e1 and e2, respectively. Suppose that e1 is 1000 times more likely on hi (given b·c1) than is e2 on hi (given b·c2); and suppose that e1 is also 1000 times more likely on hj (given b·c1) than is e2 on hj (given b·c2)—i.e., suppose that Pα[e1 | hi·b·c1] = 1000 · Pα[e2 | hi·b·c1], and Pα[e1 | hj·b·c1] = 1000 · Pα[e2 | hj·b·c2]. Which piece of evidence, (c1·e1) or (c2·e2), is stronger evidence with regard to the comparison of hi to hj? The Law of Likelihood implies both are equally strong. All that matters evidentially are the ratios of the likelihoods, and they are the same: Pα[e1 | hi·b·c1] / Pα[e1 | hj·b·c1] = Pα[e2 | hi·b·c2] / Pα[e2 | hj·b·c2]. Thus, the General Law of Likelihood implies the following principle.

General Likelihood Principle:
Suppose two different experiments or observations (or two sequences of them) c1 and c2 produce outcomes e1 and e2, respectively. Let { h1, h2, …} be any set of alternative hypotheses. If there is a constant K such that for each hypothesis hj from the set, Pα[e1 | hj·b·c1] = K · Pα[e2 | hj·b·c2], then the evidential import of (c1·e1) for distinguishing among hypotheses in the set (given b) is precisely the same as the evidential import of (c2·e2).

Similarly, the Special Law of Likelihood implies a corresponding Special Likelihood Principle that applies only to hypotheses that express simple statistical models.[14]

Throughout the remainder of this article we will not assume that likelihoods must be based on simple statistical hypotheses, as likelihoodist would have them. However, most of what will be said about likelihoods, especially the convergence result in Section 5, applies to likelihoodist likelihoods as well. We will, however, continue to suppose that likelihoods are objective in the sense that all members of the scientific community agree on their numerical values. In Section 6 we will see how to even relax this supposition for those contexts where it is unrealistic.

3.5 Representations of the Vagueness and Diversity of Prior Probability Assessments

Given that a scientific community should largely agree on the values of the likelihoods, any significant disagreement regarding the posterior plausibilities of hypotheses should derive from disagreements over prior plausibilities. Furthermore, individual agents may be unable to specify precisely how plausible they consider hypotheses to be; so their prior probabilities for hypotheses may be vague. Both disagreements among agents and vagueness for individual agents can be represented formally by sets of inductive support functions, {Pα, Pβ, …}, that agree on the values for the likelihoods, but encompass a range of values for the prior plausibilities of hypotheses. Disagreement and vagueness are different issues, but they may be represented in much the same way. Let us consider them in turn.

Assessments of evidence-independent plausibilities of hypotheses by real people will often be vague, and not subject to the kind of precise quantitative treatment that a Bayesian version of probabilistic inductive logic seems to require for prior probabilities. So, it is sometimes objected, the kind of assessment of prior probabilities required to get the Bayesian algorithm going cannot be accomplished in practice. Bayesian inductivists have a way of addressing this worry. An agent's vague assessments of prior plausibilities may be represented by a collection of probability functions, a vagueness set, which covers the range of plausibility values that the agent finds acceptable. Notice that if accumulating evidence drives the likelihood ratios to extremes, the range of functions in the agent's vagueness set will come to near agreement, near 0 or 1, on values for posterior probabilities of hypotheses. Thus, as evidence accumulates, the agent's vague initial plausibility assessments transform into quite sharp posterior probabilities that indicate the strong refutation or support of the various hypotheses. Intuitively this seems a quite reasonable effect.

The various agents in a community may widely disagree over the non-evidential plausiblities of hypotheses. Bayesian inductivists may represent this kind of diversity across the community of agents as a collection of the agents' vagueness sets. Let's call such a collection a Diversity set. So, although there may well be disagreement among agents regarding the prior plausibilities of hypotheses, and only vague priors for individual agents, probabilistic inductive logic may easily represent this. Furthermore, if accumulating evidence drives the likelihood ratios to extremes, the range of functions in a Diversity set will come to near agreement, near 0 or 1, on the values for posterior probabilities of hypotheses. So, not only would such evidence firm up each agent's vague initial plausibilities, it would also bring the whole community into agreement on the near refutation or strong support of the various alternative hypotheses.

Under what conditions might the likelihood ratios go to such extremes as evidence accumulates, effectively washing out vagueness and diversity? The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem (discussed in detail in Section 5) implies that if a true hypothesis disagrees with false alternatives on the likelihoods of possible outcomes for a long enough stream of experiments or observations, then that evidence stream will very probably produce actual outcomes that drive the likelikood ratios of false alternatives as compared to the true hypothesis to approach 0. As this happens, almost any range of prior plausibility assessments will be driven to agreement on the posterior plausibilities for hypotheses. Thus, the accumulating evidence will very probably bring all support functions in the vagueness and Diversity sets for a community of agents to near agreement on posterior plausibility values — near 0 for the false competitors, and near 1 for the true hypothesis.

One more point about prior probabilities and Bayesian convergence should be mentioned. Some subjectivist versions of Bayesian induction seem to suggest that an agent's prior plausibility assessments for hypotheses should stay fixed once and for all, and that all plausibility updating should be brought about via the likelihoods in accord with Bayes' Theorem. Critics argue that this is unreasonable. The members of a scientific community may quite legitimately revise their prior plausibility assessments for hypotheses from time to time as they rethink plausibility arguments and bring new considerations to bear. This seems a natural part of the conceptual development of a science. It turns out that such reassessments of priors pose no difficulty for probabilistic inductive logic. Reassessments may sometimes come about by the addition of explicit statements that supplement or modify the background information b. They may also take the form of (non-Bayesian) transitions to new vagueness sets for individual agents and to new Diversity sets for the community. The logic of Bayesian induction has nothing to say about what values the prior plausibility assessments for hypotheses should have; and it places no restrictions on how they might change. Provided that the series of reassessments of prior plausibilities doesn't push the prior of the true hypothesis ever nearer to zero, the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem implies that the evidence will very probably bring the posterior probabilities of empirically distinct rivals of the true hypothesis to approach 0 via decreasing likelihood ratios; and as this happens, the posterior probability of the true hypothesis will head towards 1.

4. Bayesian Estimation and Convergence for Enumerative Inductions

In this section we'll see that for the special case of enumerative inductions, probabilistic inductive logic satisfies the Criterion of Adequacy (CoA) stated at the beginning of this article. That is, under some plausible conditions, given a reasonable amount of evidence, the degree to which that evidence comes to support a hypothesis through enumerative induction is very likely to approach 1 for true hypotheses. We will now see how this works.

Recall that in enumerative inductions the idea is to infer the proportion, or relative frequency, of an attribute in a population from how frequently the attribute occurs in a sample of the population. Examples 1 and 2 at the beginning of the article describe two such inferences. Enumerative induction is only a rather special case of inductive inference. However, such inferences are very common, and so worthy of carefully attention. They arise, for example, in the context of polling, and in many other cases where a population frequency is estimated from a sample. We will establish conditions under which such inferences give rise to highly objective posterior probabilities, posterior probabilities that are fairly stable over a wide range of reasonable prior plausibility assessments. That is, we will consider all of the inductive support functions in an agent's vagueness set V or in a community's diversity set D. We will see that under some very weak suppositions about the make up of V or of D, a reasonable amount of data will bring all of the support functions in these sets to agree that the posterior degree of support for a hypothesis is very close to 1. And, we will see, it is very likely these support functions will converge to agreement on a true hypothesis.

4.1 Convergence to Agreement

Suppose we want to know the frequency with which attribute A occurs among members of population B. We randomly select a sample S from B consisting of n members, and find that it contains m members having attribute A.[15] On the basis of this evidence, what posterior probability p can we find for the hypothesis that the true proportion (or frequency) of A among B is within a given margin q around the sample proportion m/n? And to what extent does that bound depend on the prior probabilities of the various possible alternative frequency hypotheses. More generally, for a given vagueness or diversity set, what lower bound can we place on p.

Put more formally, we are asking for what values of p and q does the following inequality hold?:

Pα[ (m/n)−q < F[A,B] < (m/n)+q | b · F[A,BS]=m/n · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n] > p.

It turns out that we need only one very weak assumption about the values of prior probabilities of support functions Pα in vagueness or diversity sets to legitimize such inferences, an assumption that almost always holds in the context of enumerative inductions.

Boundedness Assumption for Estimation:
There is a region R of possible values near the sample frequency m/n (e.g., R is the region between (m/n)−q and (m/n)+q , for some margin q of interest) such that no frequency hypothesis outside of R is overwhelmingly more initially plausible than frequency hypotheses inside of R.

What does it mean for a hypothesis to not be overwhelmingly initially more plausible than another? Let's be precise. Consider two kinds of cases:

Case 1. Suppose there is a known upper bound w on the size of the whole population B (where w is much larger than the sample size n). In that case we just need the following two conditions to hold for all support functions Pα in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration.
  1. There is some small g > 0 (as small as you like) such that all hypotheses of form F[A,B] = k/w in region R have prior probabilities greater than g—i.e., Pα[F[A,B] = k/w | b] > g for each k/w in R, for all Pα under consideration.
  2. There is a factor η (possibly very large) such that all hypotheses of form F[A,B] = k/w not in region R have prior probabilities no larger than η·g—i.e., Pα[F[A,B] = k/w | b] < η·g for each k/w not in R, for all support functions Pα under consideration.

(We also assume, as seems reasonable, that in the absence of information about the observed sample frequency, the claim ‘Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n’ (that the sample is randomly selected and of size n) should be irrelevant to the probabilities of possible population frequencies. Thus, we suppose that Pα[F[A,B] = k/w | Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n · b] = Pα[F[A,B] = k/w | b].)

Case 2. Alternatively, suppose that no positive integer w is known to be an upper bound on the possible values of the population size. But suppose that the prior probabilities of the various competing hypotheses can be represented (at least very nearly) by a probability density function pα[F[A,B] = r | b] — i.e., for any specific values v and u, Pα[ v < F[A,B] < u | b] = vu pα[F[A,B] = r | b] dr. Then we just need the following two conditions to be satisfied by all support functions Pα in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration.
  1. There is some small g > 0 (as small as you like) such that the density function pα[F[A,B] = r | b] is never less than g for r inside region R.
  2. There is a factor η (possibly quite large) such that pα[F[A,B] = r | b] is never more than η·g for r outside of region R.

(We also assume, as seems reasonable, that in the absence of information about the observed sample frequency, the claim ‘Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n’ (that the sample is randomly selected and of size n) should be irrelevant to the values of the probability density function for population frequencies. Thus, we suppose that

pα[F[A,B] = q | Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n · b] = pα[F[A,B] = s | b].)

When either of these conditions is satisfied let us say that for the support functions Pα in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration, the prior probabilities are (g,η) bounded for region R . Then we have the following theorem about enumerative inductions.

Theorem: Simple Estimation Theorem:[16]
Suppose, for all support functions Pα in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration, the prior probabilities are (g,η) bounded for region R around m/n. Then, for all support functions Pα in the vagueness or diversity set,
Pα[ F[A,B]∈R | b · F[A,BS]=m/n · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n] ≥
1/(1+ η · [(1/β[m+1, nm+1, R]) − 1]).

For any given value of m/n, this lower bound approaches 1 rapidly as n increases.

The expression ‘β[m+1, nm+1, R]’ represents the beta function with parameters m+1 and nm+1 evaluated over region R. By definition β[m+1, nm+1, R] = R rm (1−r)nm dr / ∫01 r m (1−r)nm dr. When region R contains an interval around m/n, the value of this function is a fraction that approaches 1 for large n. (Its values may be easily computed using the beta function contained in any sophisticated mathematics or spreadsheet program.)

This theorem implies that for large samples the values of prior probabilities don't matter much. Given such evidence, a vary wide range of inductive support functions Pα will come to agree on high posterior probabilities that the proportion of attribute A in population B is very close to the sample frequency. Thus, all support functions in such vagueness or diversity sets come to near agreement. Let us look at several numerical examples to make clear how strong this result really is.

At the beginning of this article we saw two examples of enumerative inductive inferences. Consider Example 1. Let ‘B’ represent the population of all ravens. Let ‘A’ represent the class of black ravens. Now consider those hypotheses of form F[A,B] = r for r in the interval between .99 and 1. This collection of hypotheses includes the claim that “all ravens are black” together with those alternative hypotheses that claim the frequency of being black among ravens is within .01 of 1. The alternatives to these hypotheses are just those that assert F[A,B] = s for values of s below .99.

Suppose none of the support functions represented in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration rates the prior plausibility of any of the hypotheses ‘F[A,B] = s’ with s less than .99 to be more than twice as plausible as the hypotheses ‘F[A,B] = r’ for which r is between .99 and 1. That is, suppose, for each Pα in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration, the prior plausibility Pα[F[A,B] = s | b] for hypotheses with s below .99 is never more than η = 2 times greater than the prior plausibility Pα[F[A,B] = r | b] for hypotheses with r between .99 and 1. Then, on the evidence of 400 ravens selected randomly with respect to color, the theorem yields the following bound for all Pα in the vagueness or diversity set:

Pα[F[A,B] > .99 | b · F[A,BS] = 1 · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S] = 400] ≥ .9651.

The following table describes similar results for other prior probability ratios and sample sizes n:

Table 1: Values of lower bound p on the posterior probability
m/n = 1
F[A,B]> .99
Sample-Size = n
(number of As in Sample of Bs = m = n)
Prior Ratio: η
400 800 1600 3200
1 0.9822 0.9997 1.0000 1.0000
2 0.9651 0.9994 1.0000 1.0000
5 0.9170 0.9984 1.0000 1.0000
10 0.8468 0.9968 1.0000 1.0000
100 0.3560 0.9691 1.0000 1.0000
1,000 0.0524 0.7581 0.9999 1.0000
10,000 0.0055 0.2386 0.9990 1.0000
100,000 0.0006 0.0304 0.9898 1.0000
1,000,000 0.0001 0.0031 0.9068 1.0000
10,000,000 0.0000 0.0003 0.4931 1.0000
Pα[F[A,B]>.99 | b·F[A,BS]=1 ·Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=n] ≥ p, for a range of Sample-Sizes n (from 400 to 3200), when the prior probability of any specific frequency hypothesis outside the region between .99 and 1 is no more than η times more than the lowest prior probability for any specific frequency hypothesis inside of the region between .99 and 1.

(All probabilities with entries ‘1.0000’ in this table and the next actually have values slightly less than one, but nearly equal 1.0000 to four significant decimal places.)

To see what the table tells us, consider the third to last row. It represents what happens when a vagueness or diversity set contains at least some support functions that assign prior plausibilities nearly one hundred thousand times higher to some hypotheses asserting frequencies not between .99 and 1 than it assigns to hypotheses asserting frequencies between .99 and 1. The table shows that even in such cases, a random sample of 1600 black ravens will, nevertheless, pull the posterior plausibility level that “the true frequency is above .99” to a value above .9898, for every support function in the set. And if the vagueness or diversity set contains support functions that assign even more extreme priors, say, priors that are nearly ten million times higher for some hypotheses asserting frequencies below .99 than for hypotheses within .99 of 1 (the table's last row), this poses no great problem for convergence-to-agreement. A random sample of 3200 black ravens will yield posterior plausibilities indistinguishable from 1 for the claim that “more than 99% of all ravens are black.”

Strong support can be gotten for an even narrower range of hypotheses about the percentage of black birds among the ravens. But a larger sample size is needed for this. For an additional example, see the supplementary document

Tighter Bounds on the Margin of Error.

Consider the second example from the beginning of this article, the poll about the presidential preferences of voters. The posterior plausibilities for this example follow a similar pattern. That is, let ‘B’ represent the class of all registered voters on February 20, 2004, and let ‘A’ represent those who prefer Kerry to Bush. In sample S (randomly drawn from B with respect to A) consisting of 400 voters, 248 report preference for Kerry over Bush — i.e., F[A,B] = 248/400 = .62. Suppose, as seems reasonable, that none of the support functions in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration rates the hypotheses ‘F[A,B] = r’ for values of r outside the interval .62±.05 as more initially plausible than they rate alternative frequency hypotheses having values of r inside this interval. That is, suppose, for each Pα under consideration, the prior plausibilities Pα[F[A,B] = s | b] when s is not within .62±.05 is never more than η = 1 times as great as the prior plausibilities Pα[F[A,B] = r | b] for hypotheses having r within .62±.05. Then, the theorem yields the following lower bound on the posterior plausibility ratings, for all Pα in the vagueness or diversity set under consideration:

Pα[.57 < F[A,B] < .67 | b · F[A,BS]=.62 · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S]=400] ≥ .9614.

The following table gives similar results for other sample sizes and for ratios of prior plausibilities that may be much larger than 1. In addition, this table shows what happens when we tighten up the interval around the frequency hypotheses being supported to .62±.025—i.e., it shows the bounds p on support for the hypothesis .595< F[A,B] < .645 as well:

Table 2: Values of lower bound p on the posterior probability
m/n = .62 F[A,B] =
m/n ± q
Sample-Size = n
(number of As in Sample of Bs = m: where m/n = .62)
Prior Ratio: η
q =
.05 or .025
1 .05 →
.025 →
2 .05 →
.025 →
5 .05 →
.025 →
10 .05 →
.025 →
100 .05 →
.025 →
1,000 .05 →
.025 →
10,000 .05 →
.025 →
100,000 .05 →
.025 →
1,000,000 .05 →
.025 →
10,000,000 .05 →
.025 →
Pα[.62−q < F[A,B] < .62+q | F[A,BS] = .62 · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S] = n] ≥ p, for two values of q (.05 and .025) and a range of Sample-Sizes n (from 400 to 12800), when the prior probability of any specific frequency hypothesis outside of .62 ± q is no more than η times more than the lowest prior probability for any specific frequency hypothesis inside of .62 ± q.

Notice that even if the vagueness or diversity set includes prior plausibilities nearly ten million times higher for hypotheses asserting frequency values outside of .62±.025 than for hypotheses asserting frequencies within .62±.025, a random sample of 12800 registered voters will, nevertheless, bring about a posterior plausibility value greater than .9457 for the claim that “the true frequency of preference for Kerry over Bush among all registered voters is within .62±.025”, for all support functions Pα in the set.

4.2 Convergence to the Truth

The Simple Estimation Theorem is a Bayesian Convergence-to-Agreement result. However, it does not show that the Criterion of Adequacy (CoA) is satisfied. The theorem shows, for enumerative inductions, that as evidence accumulates, diverse support functions will come to near agreement on high posterior support strengths for those hypotheses expressing population frequencies near the sample frequency. But, it does not show that the true hypothesis is among them—it does not show that the sample frequency is near the true population frequency. So, it does not show that these converging support functions converge on strong support for the true hypothesis, as a CoA result is supposed to do.

However, there is such a CoA result close at hand. It derives from an application of the Central Limit Theorem. It establishes that each frequency hypothesis of form F[A,B] = r implies, via direct inference likelihoods, that randomly selected sample data is highly likely to result in sample frequencies very close to the value r that it claims to be the true frequency. Of course each frequency hypothesis says that the sample frequency will be near its own frequency value; but only the true hypothesis says this truthfully. Add this result to the previous theorem and we get that, for large sample sizes, it is very likely that a sample frequency will occur that yields a very high degree of support for the true hypothesis. Thus the CoA is satisfied.

Here is the needed result.

Theorem: A Weak Law of Large Numbers for Enumerative Inductions.
Let sample size n be greater than 20, and let r be any frequency between 0 and 1. Then, for any chosen margin q,

P[rq < F[A,BS] < r+q | F[A,B] = r · Random[S,B,A] · Size[S] = n]

≈ 1 − 2 · Φ[−q/(r·(1−r))/n)½] ≥ 1 − 2 · Φ[−2·q·n½],

which goes to 1 fairly quickly as n increases.

Φ[x] is the area under the Standard Normal Distribution up to point x. The approximation to the normal distribution is very close for n > 20, and gets closer as n gets larger.

Notice that the degree of support probability in this theorem is a direct inference likelihood—all support functions should agree on these values.[17]

This Weak Law result together with the Simple Estimation Theorem yields the promised CoA result: for large sample sizes, it is very likely that a sample frequency will occur that has a value very near the true frequency; and whenever such a sample frequency does occur, it yields a very high degree of support for the true frequency hypothesis.

This result only applies to enumerative inductions. In the next section we establish a CoA result that applies much more generally. It applies to the inductive support of hypotheses in any context where competing hypotheses are empirically distinct enough to disagree, at least a little, on the likelihoods of possible outcomes.

5. The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem

In this section we will investigate the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem. This theorem shows that under reasonable conditions, when hi is true and hj is empirically distinct from hi, then it is very likely that a sequence of outcomes en will occur that yields likelihood ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] that approach 0 as evidence accumulates (i.e., as n increases). The theorem places an explicit lower bound on the “rate of probable convergence” of likelihood ratios towards 0. That is, it puts a lower bound on how likely it is, if hi is true, that a stream of outcomes will occur that yields a likelihood ratio against hj within a specified small distance from 0.

The theorem itself is not strictly Bayesian. It draws only on likelihoods. Neither the statement of the theorem nor its proof employ prior probabilities of any kind. Likelihoodists and Bayesian inductivists agree that when the ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] approach 0 for increasing n, the evidence goes strongly against hj as compared to hi. So even a likelihoodist who eschews the use of Bayesian prior probabilities may embrace this result.

For Bayesians, the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem further implies the likely convergence to agreement (near 0) of the posterior probabilities of false competitors of a true hypothesis. When the ratios P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] approach 0 for increasing n, the Ratio Form of Bayes' Theorem, Equation 9, says that the posterior probability of hj must also approach 0 as evidence accumulates, regardless of the value of its prior probability. So, support functions in collections representing vague prior plausibilities for an individual agent (i.e., a vagueness set) and representing the diverse range of priors for a community of agents (i.e., a diversity set) will very likely come to agree on the near 0 posterior probability of empirically distinct false rivals of a true hypothesis. And as the posterior probabilities of false competitors fall, the posterior probability of the true hypothesis heads towards 1. Thus, the theorem establishes that the inductive logic of probabilistic support functions satisfies the Criterion of Adequacy (CoA).

The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem overcomes many of the objections raised by critics of Bayesian convergence results. First, this theorem does not employ second-order probabilities; it says noting about the probability of a probability. It only concerns the probability of a particular disjunctive sentence expressing possible sequences of outcomes. The theorem does not require evidence to consist of sequences of events that, according to the hypothesis, are identically distributed (like repeated tosses of a die). A version of the theorem even applies when the observations that make up the evidence stream are not probabilistically independent on the hypotheses. The result does not rely on countable additivity, and the explicit lower bounds it provides on convergence means that there is no need to wait for the infinite long run.

It is sometimes claimed that Bayesian convergence results only work when an agent locks in values for the prior probabilities of hypotheses once and for all, and updates posterior probabilities from there only by conditioning on evidence via Bayes Theorem. The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem, however, applies even if agents revise their prior plausibility assessments over time. Such non-Bayesian shifts from one support function or vagueness set to another may arise from new non-evidential plausibility arguments, or may be due to reassessments of old ones. The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem itself only involves the values of likelihoods. So, provided such reassessments don't push the prior plausibility of the true hypothesis towards 0 too rapidly, the theorem implies that the posterior probabilities of each empirically distinct false competitor will very probably approach 0 as evidence increases.[18]

5.1 The Space of Possible Outcomes of Experiments and Observations

To specify the details of the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem we'll need a few additional notational conventions and definitions. Here they come.

For a given sequence of n experiments or observations cn, consider the set of those possible sequences of outcomes that would result in likelihood ratios for hj over hi that are less than some chosen small number ε > 0. This set is represented by the expression:

{en : P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] < ε}

Placing the disjunction symbol ‘∨’ in front of this expression yields an expression:

∨{en : P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] < ε},

that represents the disjunction of all outcome sequences in this set. So,

∨{en : P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] < ε}

is just a particular sentence that says, in effect, “one of the sequences of outcomes of the first n experiments or observations will occur that makes the likelihood ratio for hj over hi less than ε.”

The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem says that under fairly weak assumptions, the likelihood of a disjunctive sentence of this sort, given that ‘hi·b·cn’ is true,

P[∨{en : P[en | hj·b·cn]/P[en | hi·b·cn] < ε} | hi·b·cn],

must be at least 1−(ψ/n), for some explicitly calculable term ψ. Thus, the true hypothesis hi implies that as the amount of evidence, n, increases, it is highly likely (as close to 1 as you please) that one of the outcome sequences en will occur that yields a likelihood ratio P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] less than ε, for any value of ε you may choose. As this happens, the posterior probability of hi's false competitor, hj, must approach 0, as required by the Ratio Form of Bayes' Theorem, Equation 9.

The term ψ in the theorem depends on a measure of the empirical distinctness of the hypotheses for the proposed sequence of experiments and observations. To specify this measure we need to contemplate the collection of possible outcomes of each experiment or observation. So, consider some sequence of experimental or observational conditions described by sentences c1,c2,…,cn. Corresponding to each condition ck there will be some range of possible alternative outcomes. Let Ok = {ok1,ok2,…,okw} be a set of statements describing the alternative possible outcomes for condition ck. (The number of alternative outcomes will usually differ for distinct experiments c1,…,cn; so, the value of w depends on ck). For each hypothesis hj, the alternative outcomes of ck in Ok are mutually exclusive and exhaustive, so we have:

P[oku·okv | hj·b·ck] = 0 and w

u = 1
P[oku | hj·b·ck] =1.

We now let expressions like ‘ek’ act as variables that range over the possible outcomes of ck — i.e., ek ranges over the members of Ok. As before, ‘cn’ denotes the conjunction of the first n test conditions, (c1·c2·…·cn), and ‘en’ represents possible sequences of corresponding outcomes, (e1·e2·…·en). The set of all such outcome sequences is En. So, for each hypothesis hj (including hi), enEn P[en | hj·b·cn] = 1.

5.2 Probabilistic Independence

In many scientific contexts the outcomes in a stream of experiments or observations are probabilistically independent of one another relative to each hypothesis under consideration. For our purposes independence may be divided into two types.

Definition: Independent Evidence Conditions:
(1) A sequence of outcomes ek is condition-independent of a condition for an additional experiment or observation ck+1, given h·b and its own conditions ck, if and only if P[ek | h·b·ck·ck+1] = P[ek | h·b·ck].

(2) An individual outcome ek is result-independent of a sequence of other observations and their outcomes (ck−1·ek−1), given h·b and its own condition ck, if and only if P[ek | h·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)] = P[ek | h·b·ck].

When these two conditions hold, the likelihood for an evidence sequence may be decomposed into the product of the likelihoods for individual experiments or observations. To see how the two independence conditions affect the decomposition, first consider the following formula, which holds even when neither independence condition is satisfied:

(12) P[en | hj·b·cn] = n
k = 1
P[ek | hj·b·cn·ek−1].

When condition-independence holds, the likelihood of the whole evidence stream parses into a product of likelihoods that probabilistically depend on only past observation conditions and their outcomes. They do not depend on the conditions for other experiments whose outcomes are not yet specified. Here is the formula:

(13) P[en | hj·b·cn] = n
k = 1
P[ek | hj·b·ck· (ck−1·ek−1)].

Finally, whenever both independence conditions are satisfied we have the following relationship between the likelihood of the evidence stream and the likelihoods of individual experiments or observations:

(14) P[en | hj·b·cn] = n
k = 1
P[ek | hj·b·ck].

(For proofs of Equations 12-14, see the supplementary document: Immediate Consequences of Independent Evidence Conditions.)

In many scientific contexts both clauses of the Independent Evidence Condition will be satisfied. Let us consider each independence condition more carefully.

Condition-independence says that the mere addition of a new observation condition ck+1, without specifying one of its outcomes, does not alter the likelihood of the outcomes ek of other experiments ck. To appreciate the significance of this condition, imagine what it would be like if it were violated. Suppose hypothesis hj is some statistical theory, say, for example, a quantum theory of superconductivity. The conditions expressed in ck describe a number of experimental setups, perhaps conducted in numerous labs throughout the world, that test a variety of aspects of the theory (e.g., experiments that test electrical conductivity in different materials at a range of temperatures). An outcome sequence ek describes the results of these experiments. The violation of condition-independence would mean that merely adding to hj·b·ck a statement ck+1 describing how an additional experiment has been set up, but with no mention of its outcome, changes how likely the evidence sequence ek is taken to be. What (hj·b) says via likelihoods about the outcomes ek of experiments ck differs as a result of merely supplying a description of another experimental arrangement, ck+1. Condition-independence, when it holds, rules out such strange effects.

Result-independence says that the description of previous test conditions together with their outcomes is irrelevant to the likelihoods of outcomes for additional experiments. If this condition were widely violated, then in order to specify the most informed likelihoods for a given hypothesis one would need to include information about volumes of past observations and their outcomes. What a hypothesis says about future cases would depend on how past cases have gone. Such dependence had better not happen on a large scale. Otherwise, the hypothesis would be fairly useless, since its empirical import in each specific case would depend on taking into account volumes of past observational and experimental results. However, even if such dependencies occur, provided they are not too pervasive, result-independence can be accommodated rather easily by packaging each collection of result-dependent data together, treating it like a single extended experiment or observation. The result-independence condition will then be satisfied by letting each term ‘ck’ in the statement of the independence condition represent a conjunction of test conditions for a collection of result-dependent tests, and by letting each term ‘ek’ (and each term ‘oku’) stand for a conjunction of the corresponding result-dependent outcomes. Thus, by packaging result-dependent data together in this way, the result-independence condition is satisfied by those (conjunctive) statements that describe the separate, result-independent chunks.[19]

The version of the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem we will examine depends only on the Independent Evidence Conditions and on the axioms of probability theory. It draws on no other assumptions. Indeed, an even more general version of the theorem can be established that draws on neither of the Independent Evidence Conditions. However, the Independent Evidence Conditions are very plausible in many scientific contexts. So, little will be lost by assuming them. And the presentation will run more smoothly if we side-step the added complications needed to explain the more general result.

(A version of the more general theorem is stated and proved in a Supplement to the present article. Links to this supplementary material occur immediately following the statements of the various parts of the Convergence Theorem.)

From this point on let us assume that the following versions of the Independent Evidence Conditions hold.

Assumption: Independent Evidence Assumptions. For each hypothesis h and background b under consideration, we assume that the experiments and observations can be packaged into condition statements, c1,…, ck, ck+1,…, and possible outcomes in a way that satisfies the following conditions:

(1) Each sequence of possible outcomes ek of a sequence of conditions ck is condition-independent of additional conditions ck+1—i.e., P[ek | h·b·ck·ck+1] = P[ek | h·b·ck].

(2) Each possible outcome ek of condition ck is result-independent of sequences of other observations and possible outcomes (ck−1·ek−1)—i.e., P[ek | h·b·ck·(ck−1·ek−1)] = P[ek | h·b·ck].

We now have all that is needed to begin to state the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem.

5.3 Likelihood Ratio Convergence when Falsifying Outcomes are Possible

The Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem comes in two parts. The first part applies whenever some of the experiments or observations in sequence cn have possible outcomes that have 0 likelihoods on hypothesis hj but non-0 likelihoods on hi. Such outcomes are highly desirable. If they occur, the likelihood ratio comparing hj to hi will become 0, and hj will be falsified. Crucial experiments are a special case of this, the case where, for at least one possible outcome oku, P[oku | hi·b·ck] = 1 and P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0. In the more general case hi together with b says that one of the outcomes of ck is at least minimally probable, whereas hj says that outcome is impossible—i.e., P[oku | hi·b·ck] > 0 and P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0.

Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem 1—The Falsification Theorem:
Suppose cm, a subsequence of the whole evidence sequence cn, consists of experiments or observations with the following property: there are outcomes oku of each ck in cm deemed impossible by hj·b but deemed possible by hi·b to at least some small degree δ. That is, suppose there is a δ > 0 such that for each ck in cm, P[∨{oku : P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0} | hi·b·ck] ≥ δ. Then,

P[∨{en : P[en| hj·b·cn]/P[en | hi·b·cn] = 0} | hi·b·cn]
    = P[∨{en : P[en | hj·b·cn] = 0} | hi·b·cn]
    ≥ 1−(1−δ)m,

which approaches 1 for large m. (For the proof, see the supplementary document Proof of the Falsification Theorem.)

In other words, suppose hi says observation ck has at least a small likelihood of producing one of the outcomes oku that hj says is impossible — i.e., P[∨{oku: P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0} | hi·b·ck] ≥ δ > 0. And suppose that some number m of experiments or observations are of this kind. If the number of such observations is large enough, and hi (together with b·cn) is true, then it is highly likely that one of the outcomes held to be impossible by hj will occur, and the likelihood ratio of hj over hi will then become 0. Bayes' Theorem says that when this happen hj is absolutely refuted—its posterior probability becomes 0.

The Falsification Theorem is very commonsensical. First, notice that if there is a crucial experiment in the evidence stream, the theorem is completely obvious. That is, suppose for the specific experiment ck (in evidence stream cn) there are two incompatible possible outcomes okv and oku such that P[okv | hj·b·ck] = 1 and P[oku | hi·b·ck] = 1. Then, clearly, P[∨{oku: P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0} | hi·b·ck] = 1, since oku is one of the oku such that P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0. So where there is a crucial experiment available, the theorem applies with m = 1 and δ = 1.

The theorem is equally commonsensical for cases where there is no crucial experiment. To see what it says in such cases, consider an example. Let hi be some theory that implies a specific rate of proton decay, but a rate so low that there is only a very small probability that any particular proton will decay in a given year. Consider an alternative theory hj that implies that protons never decay. If hi is true, then for a persistent enough sequence of observations (i.e., if proper detectors can be built and billions of protons kept under observation for long enough), eventually a proton decay will almost surely be detected. When this happens, the likelihood ratio becomes 0. Thus, the posterior probability of hj becomes 0.

It is instructive to plug some specific values into the formula given by the Falsification Theorem, to see what the convergence rate might look like. For example, the theorem tells us that if we compare any pair of hypotheses hi and hj on an evidence stream cn that contains at least m = 19 observations or experiments having δ ≥ .10 for the likelihood of yielding a falsifying outcome, then the likelihood (on hi·b·cn) of obtaining an outcome sequence en that yields likelihood-ratio P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] = 0, will be at least as large as 1−(1−.1)19 = .865. (The reader is invited to try other values of δ and m as well.)

A comment about the need for and usefulness of such convergence theorems is in order, now that we’ve seen one. Given some specific pair of scientific hypotheses hi and hj one may directly compute the likelihood, given (hi·b·cn), that a proposed sequence of experiments or observations cn will result in one of the sequences of outcomes that yield low likelihood ratios. So, given a specific pair of hypotheses and a proposed sequence of experiments, we don't need a general Convergence Theorem to tell us the likelihood of obtaining refuting evidence. The specific hypotheses hi and hj tell us this themselves. They tell us the likelihood of obtaining each specific outcome stream, including those that refute the competitor or produce a very small likelihood ratio for it. Furthermore, after we've actually performed an experiment and recorded its outcome, all that matters is the actual ratio of likelihoods for that outcome. Convergence theorems become moot.

The point of Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem (both the Falsification Theorem and the part of the theorem still to come) is to assure us in advance of the consideration of any specific pair of hypotheses that if the possible evidence streams that test hypotheses have certain characteristics which reflect the empirical distinctness of the hypotheses, then it is highly likely that one of the sequences of outcomes will occur that yields a very small likelihood ratio. These theorems provide relatively meager, but finite lower bounds on how quickly such convergence is likely to be. Thus, they show that the CoA is satisfied—in advance of our using the logic to test specific hypotheses.

5.4 Likelihood Ratio Convergence When No Falsifying Outcomes are Possible

The Falsification Theorem shows what happens when the evidence stream includes possible outcomes that may falsify the alternative hypothesis. But what if no possibly falsifying outcomes are present? That is, what if hypothesis hj only specifies various non-zero likelihoods for possible outcomes? Or what if hj does specify 0 likelihoods on some outcomes, but only those that hi says are impossible, only those for which hi also specifies 0 likelihoods? Such evidence streams are undoubtedly much more common in practice than those containing possibly falsifying outcomes. To cover evidence streams of this kind we first need to identify a useful way to measure the degree to which hypotheses are empirically distinct on such evidence.

Consider some particular sequence of outcomes en that results from observations cn. The likelihood ratio P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] measures the extent to which the outcome sequence distinguishes between hi and hj. But as a measure of the power of evidence to distinguish among hypotheses, likelihood ratios themselves provide a rather lopsided scale, a scale that ranges from 0 to infinity with the midpoint, where en doesn't distinguish at all between hi and hj, at 1. So, rather than using raw likelihood ratios to measure the ability of en to distinguish between hypotheses, it proves more useful to employ a symmetric measure. The logarithm of the likelihood ratio provides such a measure.

Definition: QI—the Quality of the Information.
For each experiment or observation ck, define the quality of the information provided by oku for distinguishing hj from hi, given b, as follows:

QI[oku | hi/hj | b·ck] = log[P[oku | hi·b·ck]/P[oku | hj·b·ck]].

Similarly, define

QI[en | hi/hj | b·cn] = log[P[en | hi·b·cn]/P[en | hj·b·cn]].

That is, QI is the base-2 logarithm of the ratio of the likelihood for hi over that for hj.

So, we measure the Quality of the Information an outcome would yield in distinguishing between two hypotheses as the base-2 logarithm of the likelihood ratio. This is clearly a measure of the outcome's evidential strength at distinguishing between the two hypotheses.

By this measure, hypotheses hi and hj assign the same likelihood value to a given outcome oku just in case QI[oku | hi/hj | b·ck] = 0. QI measures information on a logarithmic scale that is symmetric about the natural no-information midpoint, 0. Positive information favors hi over hj and negative information favors hj over hi.

Relative to each hypothesis with background, hi·b and hj·b, it can be shown that the QI for a sequence of outcomes is just the sum of the QIs of the individual outcomes in the sequence:

(15) QI[en | hi/hj | b·cn] = n

k = 1
QI[ek | hi/hj | b·ck].

Probability theorists measure the expected value of a quantity by first multiplying each of its possible values by their probabilities of occurring, and then summing these products. Thus, the expected value of QI is given by the following formula:

Definition: EQI—the Expected Quality of the Information.
Let's call hj outcome-compatible with hi on evidence stream ck just when for each possible outcome sequence ek of ck, if P[ek | hi·b·ck] > 0, then P[ek | hj·b·ck] > 0. We also adopt the convention that if P[oku | hj·b·ck] = 0, then the term QI[oku | hi/hj | b·ck] · P[oku | hi·b·ck] = 0, since the outcome oku has 0 probability of occurring given hi·b·ck.

For hj outcome-compatible with hi on ck, define

EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] = u QI[oku | hi/hj | b·ckP[oku | hi·b·ck].

Also, define

EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] = en∈En QI[en | hi/hj | bP[en | hi·b·cn].

The EQI of an experiment or observation is the Expected Quality of its Information for distinguishing hi from hj when hi is true. It is a measure of the expected evidential strength of the possible outcomes of an experiment or observation at distinguishing between the hypotheses. Whereas QI measures the ability of each particular outcome or sequence of outcomes to empirically distinguish hypotheses, EQI measures the tendency of experiments or observations to produce distinguishing outcomes. It can be shown that EQI tracks empirical distinctness in a precise way. We return to this in a moment.

It is easily proved that the EQI for a sequence of observations cn is just the sum of the EQIs of the individual observations ck in the sequence:

(16) EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] = n

k = 1
EQI[ck | hi/hj | b].

(For the proof, see the supplementary document Proof that the EQI for cn is the sum of the EQI for the individual ck.)

This suggests that it may be useful to average the values of the EQI[ck| hi/hj | b] over the number of observations n. We then obtain a measure of the average expected quality of the information over the experiments and observations that make up cn.

Definition: The Average Expected Quality of Information
The average expected quality of information, EQI, from cn for distinguishing hj from hi, given hi·b, is defined as:

EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] = EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] ÷ n
(1/n) · n

k = 1
EQI[ck | hi/hj | b].

It turns out that the value of EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] cannot be less than 0; and it will be greater just in case hi is empirically distinct from hj on at least one outcome oku—i.e., just in case it is empirically distinct in the sense that P[oku | hi·b·ck]P[oku | hj·b·ck]. And the same goes for the average, EQI[cn | hi/hj | b].

Theorem: Nonnegativity of EQI.
EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] ≥ 0. And, EQI[ck | hi/hj | b] > 0 if and only if for at least one of its possible outcomes oku, P[oku | hi·b·ck]P[oku | hj·b·ck]. As a result, EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] ≥ 0; and EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] > 0 if and only if at least one experiment or observation ck has at least one possible outcome oku such that P[oku | hi·b·ck]P[oku | hj·b·ck].

(For the proof, see the supplementary document The Effect on EQI of Partitioning the Outcome Space More Finely—and Proof of the Nonnegativity of EQI Theorem.)

In fact, the finer one partitions the outcome space Ok = {ok1,…,okv,…,okw} into a larger number of distinct outcomes with differing likelihood ratio values, the larger EQI becomes.[20] This shows that EQI tracks empirical distinctness in a precise way. The importance of the Non-negativity of EQI result for the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem will become apparent in a moment.

We are now in a position to state the second part of the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem. It applies to all evidence streams not containing possibly falsifying outcomes for hj when hi holds—i.e., it applies to all evidence streams for which hj is outcome-compatible with hi on each ck in the stream.

Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem 2—The Non-Falsifying Refutation Theorem.
Let γ > 0 be any number smaller than 1/e2 (≈ .135; where ‘e’ is the base of the natural logarithm). And suppose that for each possible outcome oku of each observation condition ck in cn, either P[oku | hi·b·ck] = 0 or P[oku | hj·b·ck] / P[oku | hi·b·ck] ≥ γ. Choose positive ε < 1, as small as you like, but large enough (for the number of observations n being contemplated) that the value of EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] > −(log ε)/n. Then:

P[∨{en : P[en | hj·b·cn] / P[en | hi·b·cn] < ε} | hi·b·cn]   >
(log γ)2
(EQI[cn | hi/hj | hi·b] + (log ε)/n )2

(For proof see the supplementary document Proof of the Non-Falsifying Refutation Theorem.)

This theorem provides reasonable sufficient conditions for the likely refutation of false alternatives via exceeding small likelihood ratios. The conditions under which this happens characterize the degree to which the hypotheses involved are empirically distinct from each other. The theorem says that when these conditions are met, hypothesis hi (together with b·cn) makes the likelihood at least within (1/n) · (log γ)2 / (EQI[cn | hi/hj | b] + (log ε)/n)2 of 1 that an outcome sequence en will occur that yields a likelihood ratio smaller than chosen ε. It turns out that in almost every case the actual likelihood of obtaining such evidence will be much closer to 1 than this factor indicates.[21] Thus, the theorem provides a lower bound on the likelihood of obtaining small likelihood ratios. It shows that the larger the value of EQI for an evidence stream, the more likely that stream is to produce a sequence of outcomes that yield very small likelihood ratios. But even if EQI remains quite small, a long enough stream, n, will almost surely produce an outcome sequence having a very small likelihood ratio.[22]

Notice that the antecedent condition of the theorem, that “either P[oku | hi·b·ck] = 0 or P[oku | hj·b·ck] / P[oku | hi·b·ck] ≥ γ, for some γ > 0 but less than 1/e2 (≈ .135)”, does not favor hypothesis hi in any way. The condition only rules out the possibility that some outcomes might furnish extremely strong evidence against hj relative to hi. This condition is only needed because our measure of evidential distinguishability, QI, blows up when the ratio P[oku | hj·b·ck] / P[oku | hi·b·ck] is extremely small. Furthermore, this condition is really no restriction at all on possible experiments or observations. If ck has some possible outcome sentence oku that would make P[oku | hj·b·ck] / P[oku | hi·b·ck] < γ (for a given small γ of interest), one may disjunctively lump oku together with some other outcome sentence okv for ck. Then, the antecedent condition of the theorem will be satisfied, but with the sentence ‘(okuokv)’ treated as a single outcome (e.g., in the formula for EQI). It can be proved that the only effect of such “disjunctive lumping” is to make EQI a bit smaller than it would otherwise be. If the too refuting disjunct oku actually occurs when the evidence is collected, all the better. We merely failed to take this possibility into account in computing our lower bound on the likelihood that refutation via likelihood ratios will occur.

The point of the two Convergence Theorems explored in this section is to assure us, in advance of the consideration of any specific pair of hypotheses, that if the possible evidence streams that test them have certain characteristics which reflect their evidential distinguishability, it is highly likely that outcomes yielding small likelihood ratios will result. And these theorems provide finite lower bounds on how quickly convergence is likely to occur, bounds that show one need not wait for convergence through some infinitely long run. Indeed, for any evidence sequence in which the probability distributions are at all well behaved, the actual likelihood of obtaining outcomes that yield small likelihood ratio values will inevitably be much higher than the lower bounds given by Theorems 1 and 2.

In sum, according to Theorems 1 and 2, each hypothesis hi says, via likelihoods, that given enough observations, it is very likely to dominate its empirically distinct rivals in a contest of likelihood ratios. And even a sequence of observations with an extremely low average expected quality of information is very likely to do the job if that sequence is long enough. Presumably, the true hypothesis speaks truthfully about this, and its competitors lie. Thus (by Equation 9), as evidence accumulates, the degree of support for false hypotheses will very probably approach 0, indicating that they are probably false; and as this happens, (by Equations 10 and 11) the degree of support for the true hypothesis will approach 1, indicating its probable truth. The Criterion of Adequacy (CoA) is satisfied.

6. When the Likelihoods are Vague or Diverse

Up to this point we have been supposing that likelihoods possess objective or agreed numerical values. Although this supposition is often satisfied in scientific contexts, there are important settings where it is unrealistic—where individual agents have only vague likelihood values, and where the community cannot agree on precise values.[23] Let us now see how the supposition of precise, agreed likelihood values may be relaxed in a reasonable way.

Recall why agreement or near agreement on precise values for likelihoods is highly desirable. To the extent that members of a scientific community disagree on the likelihoods, they disagree about the empirical content of their hypotheses, about what each hypothesis says about how the world is likely to be. This can lead to disagreement about which hypotheses are refuted or favored by a given stream of evidence. Similarly, to the extent that the values of likelihoods are vague for an individual agent, he or she may be unable to determine which of several hypotheses is refuted or favored by a given evidence stream.

Notice, however, that the values of individual likelihoods are not what is most crucial to the way evidence impacts hypotheses. Rather (as Equations 9-11 show), it is ratios of likelihoods that do the heavy lifting. So, even if two support functions Pα and Pβ disagree on the values of likelihoods, they may, nevertheless, largely agree on the refutation or support that accrues to various rival hypotheses when the following condition is satisfied:

Directional Agreement Condition:
The likelihood ratios due to each of a pair of support functions Pα and Pβ will be said to agree in direction (with respect to the possible outcomes of experiments or observations relevant to a pair of hypotheses) just in case
  • whenever possible outcome sequence en makes Pα[en | hj·b·cn] / Pα[en | hi·b·cn] < 1, it makes Pβ[en | hj·b·cn] / Pβ[en | hi·b·cn] < 1 as well;
  • whenever possible outcome sequence en makes Pα[en | hj·b·cn] / Pα[en | hi·b·cn] > 1, it makes Pβ[en | hj·b·cn] / Pβ[en | hi·b·cn] > 1 as well;
  • each of these likelihood ratios is either extremely close to 1 for neither support function or for both support functions.[24]

When this condition holds, the evidence will support hi over hj according to Pα just in case it does so for Pβ as well, although the strength of support may differ. The rate at which the likelihood ratios increase or decrease on a stream of evidence may differ for the two support functions, but the impact of the cumulative evidence should ultimately affect their refutation or support in much the same way.

When likelihoods are vague or diverse, we may take the approach we employed for vague and diverse prior plausibility assessments. We may extend the vagueness sets for individual agents to include a range of inductive support functions, each within the range of values for the likelihoods and the prior probabilities that the agent finds acceptable. Similarly, we may extend the Diversity sets for communities of agents to include support functions for the range of likelihoods and prior probabilities (from the vagueness sets) of all members of the community. This will make no trouble for the convergence to agreement on the empirical support for hypotheses provided that the Directional Agreement Condition is satisfied by all support functions in the extended vagueness or Diversity sets of agents.

As it happens, the Likelihood Ratio Convergence Theorem can also do useful work here. The proof of the theorem doesn't actually depend on the assumption that likelihoods are objective or have intersubjectively agreed values. It can be shown to apply to each inductive support function Pα individually. The only problem with applying this result across a range of support functions is that if their likelihoods differ, then Pα may disagree with Pβ on which of the hypotheses is favored by a given sequence of evidence. An evidence stream that favors hi according to Pα may instead favor hj according to Pβ. However, when the Directional Agreement Condition holds for a given collection of these functions, this cannot happen. Directional Agreement means that the empirical import of hypotheses is considered similar enough by Pα and Pβ that a sequence of outcomes may favor a hypothesis according to Pα only if it does so for Pβ as well.

Thus, when the Directional Agreement Condition holds, if enough empirically distinguishing experiments or observations can be performed, all support functions in an extended vagueness or diversity set will very probably come to agree that the likelihood ratios for empirically distinct false competitors of a true hypothesis are extremely small. As that happens, the community comes to agree on the refutation of these competitors, and the true hypothesis rises to the top of the heap.[25]

What if the true hypothesis has empirically equivalent rivals? Their posterior probabilities must rise as well. We may only be assured that the disjunction of the true hypothesis with its empirically equivalent rivals will be driven to 1 as evidence lays low its empirically distinct rivals. The true hypothesis may itself approach 1 only if either it has no empirically equivalent rivals, or whatever equivalent rivals it has are laid low as well by non-evidential plausibility considerations.


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Thanks to Jim Joyce and Edward Zalta for many valuable comments and suggestions. The editors and author would also like to thank Greg Stokley for carefully reading the entry and identifying several typographical errors.