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Interpretations of Probability

First published Mon Oct 21, 2002; substantive revision Sat Jul 7, 2007

‘Interpreting probability’ is a commonly used but misleading name for a worthy enterprise. The so-called ‘interpretations of probability’ would be better called ‘analyses of various concepts of probability’, and ‘interpreting probability’ is the task of providing such analyses. Or perhaps better still, if our goal is to transform inexact concepts of probability familiar to ordinary folk into exact ones suitable for philosophical and scientific theorizing, then the task may be one of ‘explication’ in the sense of Carnap (1950). Normally, we speak of interpreting a formal system, that is, attaching familiar meanings to the primitive terms in its axioms and theorems, usually with an eye to turning them into true statements about some subject of interest. However, there is no single formal system that is ‘probability’, but rather a host of such systems. To be sure, Kolmogorov's axiomatization, which we will present shortly, has achieved the status of orthodoxy, and it is typically what philosophers have in mind when they think of ‘probability theory’. Nevertheless, several of the leading ‘interpretations of probability’ fail to satisfy all of Kolmogorov's axioms, yet they have not lost their title for that. Moreover, various other quantities that have nothing to do with probability do satisfy Kolmogorov's axioms, and thus are interpretations of it in a strict sense: normalized mass, length, area, volume, and indeed anything that falls under the scope of measure theory, the abstract mathematical theory that generalizes such quantities. Nobody seriously considers these to be ‘interpretations of probability’, however, because they do not play the right role in our conceptual apparatus. Instead, we will be concerned here with various probability-like concepts that purportedly do. Be all that as it may, we will follow common usage and drop the cringing scare quotes in our survey of what philosophers have taken to be the chief interpretations of probability.

Whatever we call it, the project of finding such interpretations is an important one. Probability is virtually ubiquitous. It plays a role in almost all the sciences. It underpins much of the social sciences — witness, for example, the prevalence of the use of statistical testing, confidence intervals, regression methods, and so on. It finds its way, moreover, into much of philosophy. In epistemology, the philosophy of mind, and cognitive science, we see states of opinion being modeled by subjective probability functions, and learning being modeled by the updating of such functions. Since probability theory is central to decision theory and game theory, it has ramifications for ethics and political philosophy. It figures prominently in such staples of metaphysics as causation and laws of nature. It appears again in the philosophy of science in the analysis of confirmation of theories, scientific explanation, and in the philosophy of specific scientific theories, such as quantum mechanics, statistical mechanics, and genetics. It can even take center stage in the philosophy of logic, the philosophy of language, and the philosophy of religion. Thus, problems in the foundations of probability bear at least indirectly, and sometimes directly, upon central scientific, social scientific, and philosophical concerns. The interpretation of probability is one of the most important such foundational problems.

1. Kolmogorov's Probability Calculus

Probability theory was inspired by games of chance in 17th century France and inaugurated by the Fermat-Pascal correspondence. However, its axiomatization had to wait until Kolmogorov's classic Foundations of the Theory of Probability (1933). Let Ω be a non-empty set (‘the universal set’). A field (or algebra) on Ω is a set F of subsets of Ω that has Ω as a member, and that is closed under complementation (with respect to Ω) and union. Let P be a function from F to the real numbers obeying:

  1. (Non-negativity) P(A) ≥ 0, for all AF.
  2. (Normalization) P(Ω) = 1.
  3. (Finite additivity) P(AB) = P(A) + P(B) for all A, BF such that AB = ∅.

Call P a probability function, and (Ω, F, P) a probability space.

The assumption that P is defined on a field guarantees that these axioms are non-vacuously instantiated, as are the various theorems that follow from them. The non-negativity and normalization axioms are largely matters of convention, although it is non-trivial that probability functions take at least the two values 0 and 1, and that they have a maximal value (unlike various other measures, such as length, volume, and so on, which are unbounded). We will return to finite additivity at a number of points below. We may now apply the theory to various familiar cases. For example, we may represent the results of tossing a single die once by the set Ω={1, 2, 3, 4, 5, 6}, and we could let F be the set of all subsets of Ω. Under the natural assignment of probabilities to members of F, we obtain such welcome results as P({1}) = 1/6, P(even) = P({2} ∪ {4} ∪ {6}) = 3/6, P(odd or less than 4) = P(odd) + P(less than 4) − P(odd ∩ less than 4) = 1/2 + 1/2 − 2/6 = 4/6, and so on.

We could instead attach probabilities to members of a collection S of sentences of a formal language, closed under (countable) truth-functional combinations, with the following counterpart axiomatization:

  1. P(A) ≥ 0 for all AS.
  2. If T is a logical truth (in classical logic), then P(T) = 1.
  3. P(AB) = P(A) + P(B) for all AS and BS such that A and B are logically incompatible.

Now let us strengthen our closure assumptions regarding F, requiring it to be closed under complementation and countable union; it is then called a sigma field (or sigma algebra) on Ω. It is controversial whether we should strengthen finite additivity, as Kolmogorov does:

3′. (Countable additivity) If A1, A2, A3 … is a countably infinite sequence of (pairwise) disjoint sets, each of which is an element of F, then

An)   =  


Kolmogorov comments that infinite probability spaces are idealized models of real random processes, and that he limits himself arbitrarily to only those models that satisfy countable additivity. This axiom is the cornerstone of the assimilation of probability theory to measure theory.

The conditional probability of A given B is then given by the ratio of unconditional probabilities:

P(A | B) =
, provided P(B) > 0.

This is often taken to be the definition of conditional probability, although it should be emphasized that this is a technical usage of the term that may not align perfectly with a pretheoretical concept that we might have (see Hájek, forthcoming). Indeed, some authors take conditional probability to be the primitive notion, and axiomatize it directly (e.g. Popper 1959b, Renyi 1970, van Fraassen 1976, Spohn 1986 and Roeper and Leblanc 1999).

There are other axiomatizations that give up normalization; that give up countable additivity, and even additivity; that allow probabilities to take infinitesimal values (positive, but smaller than every positive real number); that allow probabilities to be vague (interval-valued, or more generally sets of numerical values). For now, however, when we speak of ‘the probability calculus’, we will mean Kolmogorov's approach, as is standard.

Given certain probabilities as inputs, the axioms and theorems allow us to compute various further probabilities. However, apart from the assignment of 1 to the universal set and 0 to the empty set, they are silent regarding the initial assignment of probabilities.[1] For guidance with that, we need to turn to the interpretations of probability. First, however, let us list some criteria of adequacy for such interpretations.

2. Criteria of adequacy for the interpretations of probability

What criteria are appropriate for assessing the cogency of a proposed interpretation of probability? Of course, an interpretation should be precise, unambiguous, non-circular, and use well-understood primitives. But those are really prescriptions for good philosophizing generally; what do we want from our interpretations of probability, specifically? We begin by following Salmon (1966, 64), although we will raise some questions about his criteria, and propose some others. He writes:

Admissibility. We say that an interpretation of a formal system is admissible if the meanings assigned to the primitive terms in the interpretation transform the formal axioms, and consequently all the theorems, into true statements. A fundamental requirement for probability concepts is to satisfy the mathematical relations specified by the calculus of probability…

Ascertainability. This criterion requires that there be some method by which, in principle at least, we can ascertain values of probabilities. It merely expresses the fact that a concept of probability will be useless if it is impossible in principle to find out what the probabilities are…

Applicability. The force of this criterion is best expressed in Bishop Butler's famous aphorism, “Probability is the very guide of life.”…

It might seem that the criterion of admissibility goes without saying: ‘interpretations’ of the probability calculus that assigned to P the interpretation ‘the number of hairs on the head of’ or ‘the political persuasion of’ would obviously not even be in the running, because they would render the axioms and theorems so obviously false. The word ‘interpretation’ is often used in such a way that ‘admissible interpretation’ is a pleonasm. Yet it turns out that the criterion is non-trivial, and indeed if taken seriously would rule out several of the leading interpretations of probability! As we will see, some of them fail to satisfy countable additivity; for others (certain propensity interpretations) the status of at least some of the axioms is unclear. Nevertheless, we regard them as genuine candidates. It should be remembered, moreover, that Kolmogorov's is just one of many possible axiomatizations, and there is not universal agreement on which is ‘best’ (whatever that might mean). Indeed, Salmon's preferred axiomatization differs from Kolmogorov's.[2] Thus, there is no such thing as admissibility tout court, but rather admissibility with respect to this or that axiomatization. It would be unfortunate if, perhaps out of an overdeveloped regard for history, one felt obliged to reject any interpretation that did not obey the letter of Kolmogorov's laws and that was thus ‘inadmissible’. In any case, if we found an inadmissible interpretation that did a wonderful job of meeting the criteria of ascertainability and applicability, then we should surely embrace it.

So let us turn to those criteria. It is a little unclear in the ascertainability criterion just what “in principle” amounts to, though perhaps some latitude here is all to the good. Understood charitably, and to avoid trivializing it, it presumably excludes omniscience. On the other hand, understanding it in a way acceptable to a strict empiricist or a verificationist may be too restrictive. ‘Probability’ is apparently, among other things, a modal concept, plausibly outrunning that which actually occurs, let alone that which is actually observed.

Most of the work will be done by the applicability criterion. We must say more (as Salmon indeed does) about what sort of a guide to life probability is supposed to be. Mass, length, area and volume are all useful concepts, and they are ‘guides to life’ in various ways (think how critical distance judgments can be to survival); moreover, they are admissible and ascertainable, so presumably it is the applicability criterion that will rule them out. Perhaps it is best to think of applicability as a cluster of criteria, each of which is supposed to capture something of probability's distinctive conceptual roles; moreover, we should not require that all of them be met by a given interpretation. They include:

Non-triviality: an interpretation should make non-extreme probabilities at least a conceptual possibility. For example, suppose that we interpret ‘P’ as the truth function: it assigns the value 1 to all true sentences, and 0 to all false sentences. Then trivially, all the axioms come out true, so this interpretation is admissible. We would hardly count it as an adequate interpretation of probability, however, and so we need to exclude it. It is essential to probability that, at least in principle, it can take intermediate values. All of the interpretations that we will present meet this criterion, so we will discuss it no more.

Applicability to frequencies: an interpretation should render perspicuous the relationship between probabilities and (long-run) frequencies. Among other things, it should make clear why, by and large, more probable events occur more frequently than less probable events.

Applicability to rational belief: an interpretation should clarify the role that probabilities play in constraining the degrees of belief, or credences, of rational agents. Among other things, knowing that one event is more probable than another, a rational agent will be more confident about the occurrence of the former event.

Applicability to ampliative inference: an interpretation will score bonus points if it illuminates the distinction between ‘good’ and ‘bad’ ampliative inferences, while explicating why both fall short of deductive inferences.

The next criterion may be redundant, given our list so far, but including it will do no harm:

Applicability to science: an interpretation should illuminate paradigmatic uses of probability in science (for example, in quantum mechanics and statistical mechanics).

Perhaps there are further metaphysical desiderata that we might impose on the interpretations. For example, there appear to be connections between probability and modality. Events with positive probability can happen, even if they don't. Some authors also insist on the converse condition that only events with positive probability can happen, although this is more controversial — see our discussion of ‘regularity’ in Section 4. (Indeed, in uncountable probability spaces this condition will require the employment of infinitesimals, and will thus take us beyond the standard Kolmogorov theory — ‘standard’ both in the sense of being the orthodoxy, and in its employment of standard, as opposed to ‘non-standard’ real numbers. See Skyrms 1980.) In any case, our list is already long enough to help in our assessment of the leading interpretations on the market.

3. The Main Interpretations

3.1 Classical Probability

The classical interpretation owes its name to its early and august pedigree. Championed by Laplace, and found even in the works of Pascal, Bernoulli, Huygens, and Leibniz, it assigns probabilities in the absence of any evidence, or in the presence of symmetrically balanced evidence. The guiding idea is that in such circumstances, probability is shared equally among all the possible outcomes, so that the classical probability of an event is simply the fraction of the total number of possibilities in which the event occurs. It seems especially well suited to those games of chance that by their very design create such circumstances — for example, the classical probability of a fair die landing with an even number showing up is 3/6. It is often presupposed (usually tacitly) in textbook probability puzzles.

Here is a classic statement by Laplace:

The theory of chance consists in reducing all the events of the same kind to a certain number of cases equally possible, that is to say, to such as we may be equally undecided about in regard to their existence, and in determining the number of cases favorable to the event whose probability is sought. The ratio of this number to that of all the cases possible is the measure of this probability, which is thus simply a fraction whose numerator is the number of favorable cases and whose denominator is the number of all the cases possible. (1814, 1951 6-7)

There are numerous questions to be asked about this formulation. When are events of the same kind? Intuitively, ‘heads’ and ‘tails’ are equally likely outcomes of tossing a fair coin; but if their kind is ‘ways the coin could land’, then ‘edge’ should presumably be counted alongside them. The “certain number of cases” and “that of all the cases possible” are presumably finite numbers. What, then, of probabilities in infinite spaces? Apparently, irrational-valued probabilities such as 1/√2 are automatically eliminated, and thus theories such as quantum mechanics that posit them cannot be accommodated. (We will shortly see, however, that Laplace's theory has been refined to handle infinite spaces.)

Who are “we”, who “may be equally undecided”? Different people may be equally undecided about different things, which suggests that Laplace is offering a subjectivist interpretation in which probabilities vary from person to person depending on contingent differences in their evidence. This is not his intention. He means to characterize the objective probability assignment of a rational agent in an epistemically neutral position with respect to a set of “equally possible” cases. But then the proposal risks sounding empty: for what is it for an agent to be “equally undecided” about a set of cases, other than assigning them equal probability?

This brings us to one of the key objections to Laplace's account. The notion of “equally possible” cases faces the charge of either being a category mistake (for ‘possibility’ does not come in degrees), or circular (for what is meant is really ‘equally probable’). The notion is finessed by the so-called ‘principle of indifference’, a coinage due to Keynes. It states that whenever there is no evidence favoring one possibility over another, they have the same probability. Thus, it is claimed, there is no circularity in the classical definition after all. However, this move may only postpone the problem, for there is still a threat of circularity, albeit at a lower level. We have two cases here: outcomes for which we have no evidence at all, and outcomes for which we have symmetrically balanced evidence. There is no circularity in the first case unless the notion of ‘evidence’ is itself probabilistic; but artificial examples aside, it is doubtful that the case ever arises. For example, we have a considerable fund of evidence on coin tossing from the results of our own experiments, the testimony of others, our knowledge of some of the relevant physics, and so on. In the second case, the threat of circularity is more apparent, for it seems that some sort of weighing of the evidence in favor of each outcome is required, and it is not obvious that this can be done without reference to probability. Indeed, the most obvious characterization of symmetrically balanced evidence is in terms of equality of conditional probabilities: given evidence E and possible outcomes O1, O2, …, On, the evidence is symmetrically balanced iff P(O1 | E) = P(O2 | E) = … = P(On | E). Then it seems that probabilities reside at the base of the interpretation after all. Still, it would be an achievement if all probabilities could be reduced to cases of equal probability.

As we have seen, Laplace's classical theory is restricted to finite sample spaces. When the spaces are countably infinite, the spirit of the classical theory may be upheld by appealing to the information-theoretic principle of maximum entropy, a generalization of the principle of indifference championed by Jaynes (1968). Entropy is a measure of the lack of ‘informativeness’ of a probability distribution. The more concentrated is the distribution, the less is its entropy; the more diffuse it is, the greater is its entropy. For a discrete distribution P = (p1, p2, …), the entropy of P is defined as:

i pi log pi

The principle of maximum entropy enjoins us to select from the family of all distributions consistent with our background knowledge the distribution that maximizes this quantity. In the special case of choosing the most uninformative prior over a finite set of possible outcomes, this is just the familiar ‘flat’ classical distribution discussed previously. Things get more complicated in the infinite case, since there cannot be a flat distribution over denumerably many outcomes, on pain of violating the standard probability calculus (with countable additivity). Rather, the best we can have are sequences of progressively flatter distributions, none of which is truly flat. We must then impose some further constraint that narrows the field to a smaller family in which there is a distribution of maximum entropy.[3] This constraint has to be imposed from outside as background knowledge, but there is no general theory of which external constraint should be applied when.

Let us turn now to uncountably infinite spaces. It is easy — all too easy — to assign equal probabilities to the points in such a space: each gets probability 0. Non-trivial probabilities arise when uncountably many of the points are clumped together in larger sets. If there are finitely many clumps, Laplace's classical theory may be appealed to again: if the evidence bears symmetrically on these clumps, each gets the same share of probability.

Enter Bertrand's paradoxes. They all arise in uncountable spaces and turn on alternative parametrizations of a given problem that are non-linearly related to each other. Some presentations are needlessly arcane; length and area suffice to make the point. The following example (adapted from van Fraassen 1989) nicely illustrates how Bertrand-style paradoxes work. A factory produces cubes with side-length between 0 and 1 foot; what is the probability that a randomly chosen cube has side-length between 0 and 1/2 a foot? The tempting answer is 1/2, as we imagine a process of production that is uniformly distributed over side-length. But the question could have been given an equivalent restatement: A factory produces cubes with face-area between 0 and 1 square-feet; what is the probability that a randomly chosen cube has face-area between 0 and 1/4 square-feet? Now the tempting answer is 1/4, as we imagine a process of production that is uniformly distributed over face-area. This is already disastrous, as we cannot allow the same event to have two different probabilities (especially if this interpretation is to be admissible!). But there is worse to come, for the problem could have been restated equivalently again: A factory produces cubes with volume between 0 and 1 cubic feet; what is the probability that a randomly chosen cube has volume between 0 and 1/8 cubic-feet? Now the tempting answer is 1/8, as we imagine a process of production that is uniformly distributed over volume. And so on for all of the infinitely many equivalent reformulations of the problem (in terms of the fourth, fifth, … power of the length, and indeed in terms of every non-zero real-valued exponent of the length). What, then, is the probability of the event in question?

The paradox arises because the principle of indifference can be used in incompatible ways. We have no evidence that favors the side-length lying in the interval [0, 1/2] over its lying in [1/2, 1], or vice versa, so the principle requires us to give probability 1/2 to each. Unfortunately, we also have no evidence that favors the face-area lying in any of the four intervals [0, 1/4], [1/4, 1/2], [1/2, 3/4], and [3/4, 1] over any of the others, so we must give probability 1/4 to each. The event ‘the side-length lies in [0, 1/2]’, receives a different probability when merely redescribed. And so it goes, for all the other reformulations of the problem. We cannot meet any pair of these constraints simultaneously, let alone all of them.

How does the classical theory of probability fare with respect to our criteria of adequacy? Let us begin with admissibility. It is claimed that (Laplacean) classical probabilities are only finitely additive (see, e.g., de Finetti 1974). It would be more correct to say that classical probabilities are countably additive, but trivially so. As we have seen, classical probabilities are only defined on finite sample spaces. The statement 3′ of countable additivity, recall, is a conditional; its antecedent, “{Ai} is a countably infinite collection of (pairwise) disjoint sets,” is never satisfied in such spaces. Thus, the conditional is vacuously true.

Classical probabilities are ascertainable, assuming that the space of possibilities can be determined in principle. They bear a relationship to the credences of rational agents; the concern, as we saw above, is that the relationship is vacuous, and that rather than constraining the credences of a rational agent in an epistemically neutral position, they merely record them.

Without supplementation, the classical theory makes no contact with frequency information. However the coin happens to land in a sequence of trials, the possible outcomes remain the same. Indeed, even if we have strong empirical evidence that the coin is biased towards heads with probability, say, 0.6, it is hard to see how the unadorned classical theory can accommodate this fact — for what now are the ten possibilities, six of which are favorable to heads? Laplace does supplement the theory with his Rule of Succession: "Thus we find that an event having occurred successively any number of times, the probability that it will happen again the next time is equal to this number increased by unity divided by the same number, increased by two units." (1951, 19) That is:

Pr(success on N+1st trial | N consecutive successes) =

Thus, inductive learning is possible. We must ask, however, whether such learning can be captured once and for all by such a simple formula, the same for all domains and events. We will return to this question when we discuss the logical interpretation below.

Science apparently invokes at various points probabilities that look classical. Bose-Einstein statistics, Fermi-Dirac statistics, and Maxwell-Boltzmann statistics each arise by considering the ways in which particles can be assigned to states, and then applying the principle of indifference to different subdivisions of the set of alternatives, Bertrand-style. The trouble is that Bose-Einstein statistics apply to some particles (e.g. photons) and not to others, Fermi-Dirac statistics apply to different particles (e.g. electrons), and Maxwell-Boltzmann statistics do not apply to any known particles. None of this can be determined a priori, as the classical interpretation would have it. Moreover, the classical theory purports to yield probability assignments in the face of ignorance. But as Fine (1973) writes:

If we are truly ignorant about a set of alternatives, then we are also ignorant about combinations of alternatives and about subdivisions of alternatives. However, the principle of indifference when applied to alternatives, or their combinations, or their subdivisions, yields different probability assignments (170).

This brings us to one of the chief points of controversy regarding the classical interpretation. Critics accuse the principle of indifference of extracting information from ignorance. Proponents reply that it rather codifies the way in which such ignorance should be epistemically managed — for anything other than an equal assignment of probabilities would represent the possession of some knowledge. Critics counter-reply that in a state of complete ignorance, it is better to assign vague probabilities (perhaps vague over the entire [0, 1] interval), or to eschew the assignment of probabilities altogether.

3.2 Logical probability

Logical theories of probability retain the classical interpretation's idea that probabilities can be determined a priori by an examination of the space of possibilities. However, they generalize it in two important ways: the possibilities may be assigned unequal weights, and probabilities can be computed whatever the evidence may be, symmetrically balanced or not. Indeed, the logical interpretation, in its various guises, seeks to encapsulate in full generality the degree of support or confirmation that a piece of evidence E confers upon a given hypothesis H, which we may write as c(H, E). In doing so, it can be regarded also as generalizing deductive logic and its notion of implication, to a complete theory of inference equipped with the notion of ‘degree of implication’ that relates E to H. It is often called the theory of ‘inductive logic’, although this is a misnomer: there is no requirement that E be in any sense ‘inductive’ evidence for H. ‘Non-deductive logic’ would be a better name, yet even this overlooks the fact that deductive logic's relations of implication and incompatibility are also accommodated as extreme cases in which the confirmation function takes the values 1 and 0 respectively. Nevertheless, what is significant is that the logical interpretation provides a framework for induction.

Early proponents of logical probability include Johnson (1921), Keynes (1921), and Jeffreys (1939). However, by far the most systematic study of logical probability was by Carnap. His formulation of logical probability begins with the construction of a formal language. In (1950) he considers a class of very simple languages consisting of a finite number of logically independent monadic predicates (naming properties) applied to countably many individual constants (naming individuals) or variables, and the usual logical connectives. The strongest (consistent) statements that can be made in a given language describe all of the individuals in as much detail as the expressive power of the language allows. They are conjunctions of complete descriptions of each individual, each description itself a conjunction containing exactly one occurrence (negated or unnegated) of each predicate of the language. Call these strongest statements state descriptions.

Any probability measure m(−) over the state descriptions automatically extends to a measure over all sentences, since each sentence is equivalent to a disjunction of state descriptions; m in turn induces a confirmation function c(−, −):

c(h, e) =
m(h & e)

There are obviously infinitely many candidates for m, and hence c, even for very simple languages. Carnap argues for his favored measure “m*” by insisting that the only thing that significantly distinguishes individuals from one another is some qualitative difference, not just a difference in labeling. Call a structure description a maximal set of state descriptions, each of which can be obtained from another by some permutation of the individual names. m* assigns each structure description equal measure, which in turn is divided equally among their constituent state descriptions. It gives greater weight to homogenous state descriptions than to heterogeneous ones, thus ‘rewarding’ uniformity among the individuals in accordance with putatively reasonable inductive practice. The induced c* allows inductive learning from experience.

Consider, for example, a language that has three names, a, b and c, for individuals, and one predicate F. For this language, the state descriptions are:

  1. Fa & Fb & Fc
  2. ¬Fa & Fb & Fc
  3. Fa & ¬Fb & Fc
  4. Fa & Fb & ¬Fc
  5. ¬Fa & ¬Fb & Fc
  6. ¬Fa & Fb & ¬Fc
  7. Fa & ¬Fb & ¬Fc
  8. ¬Fa & ¬Fb & ¬Fc

There are four structure descriptions:

{1}, “Everything is F”;

{2, 3, 4}, “Two Fs, one ¬F”;

{5, 6, 7}, “One F, two ¬Fs”; and

{8}, “Everything is ¬F”.

The measure m* assigns numbers to the state descriptions as follows: first, every structure description is assigned an equal weight, 1/4; then, each state description belonging to a given structure description is assigned an equal part of the weight assigned to the structure description:

State description Structure description Weight m*
1. Fa.Fb.Fc I. Everything is F 1/4 1/4
2. ¬Fa.Fb.Fc 1/12
3. FaFb.Fc II. Two Fs, one ¬F 1/4 1/12
4. Fa.FbFc 1/12
5. ¬FaFb.Fc 1/12
6. ¬Fa.FbFc III. One F, two ¬Fs 1/4 1/12
7. FaFbFc 1/12
8. ¬FaFbFc IV. Everything is ¬F 1/4 1/4

Notice that m* gives greater weight to the homogenous state descriptions 1 and 8 than to the heterogeneous ones. This will manifest itself in the inductive support that hypotheses can gain from appropriate evidence statements. Consider the hypothesis statement h = Fc, true in 4 of the 8 state descriptions, with a priori probability m*(h) = 1/2. Suppose we examine individual “a” and find it has property F — call this evidence e. Intuitively, e is favorable (albeit weak) inductive evidence for h. We have: m*(h & e) = 1/3, m*(e) = 1/2, and hence

c*(h, e) =
m*(h & e)
= 2/3.

This is greater than the a priori probability m*(h) = 1/2, so the hypothesis has been confirmed. It can be shown that in general m* yields a degree of confirmation c* that allows learning from experience.

Note, however, that infinitely many confirmation functions, defined by suitable choices of the initial measure, allow learning from experience. We do not have yet a reason to think that c* is the right choice. Carnap claims nevertheless that c* stands out for being simple and natural.

He later generalizes his confirmation function to a continuum of functions cλ. Define a family of predicates to be a set of predicates such that, for each individual, exactly one member of the set applies, and consider first-order languages containing a finite number of families. Carnap (1963) focuses on the special case of a language containing only one-place predicates. He lays down a host of axioms concerning the confirmation function c, including those induced by the probability calculus itself, various axioms of symmetry (for example, that c(h, e) remains unchanged under permutations of individuals, and of predicates of any family), and axioms that guarantee undogmatic inductive learning, and long-run convergence to relative frequencies. They imply that, for a family {Pn}, n = 1, …, k (k > 2):

cλ (individual s + 1 is Pj, sj of the first s individuals are Pj) =
(sj + λ/k)
s + λ

where λ is a positive real number. The higher the value of λ, the less impact evidence has: induction from what is observed becomes progressively more swamped by a classical-style equal assignment to each of the k possibilities regarding individual s + 1.

I turn to various objections to Carnap's program that have been offered in the literature, noting that this remains an area of lively debate. (See e.g. Maher's lecture notes in the Other Internet Resources section for defenses of Carnap.) Firstly, is there a correct setting of λ, or said another way, how ‘inductive’ should the confirmation function be? The concern here is that any particular setting of λ is arbitrary in a way that compromises Carnap's claim to be offering a logical notion of probability. Also, it turns out that for any such setting, a universal statement in an infinite universe always receives zero confirmation, no matter what the (finite) evidence. Many find this counterintuitive, since laws of nature with infinitely many instances can apparently be confirmed. Earman (1992) discusses the prospects for avoiding the unwelcome result.

Significantly, Carnap's various axioms of symmetry are hardly logical truths. Moreover, Fine (1973, 202) argues that we cannot impose further symmetry constraints that are seemingly just as plausible as Carnap's, on pain of inconsistency. Goodman taught us: that the future will resemble the past in some respect is trivial; that it will resemble the past in all respects is contradictory. And we may continue: that a probability assignment can be made to respect some symmetry is trivial; that one can be made to respect all symmetries is contradictory. This threatens the whole program of logical probability.

Another Goodmanian lesson is that inductive logic must be sensitive to the meanings of predicates, strongly suggesting that a purely syntactic approach such as Carnap's is doomed. Scott and Krauss (1966) use model theory in their formulation of logical probability for richer and more realistic languages than Carnap's. Still, finding a canonical language seems to many to be a pipe dream, at least if we want to analyze the “logical probability” of any argument of real interest — either in science, or in everyday life.

Logical probabilities are admissible. It is easily shown that they satisfy finite additivity, and given that they are defined on finite sets of sentences, the extension to countable additivity is trivial. Given a choice of language, the values of a given confirmation function are ascertainable; thus, if this language is rich enough for a given application, the relevant probabilities are ascertainable. The whole point of the theory of logical probability is to explicate ampliative inference, although given the apparent arbitrariness in the choice of language and in the setting of λ — thus, in the choice of confirmation function — one may wonder how well it achieves this. The problem of arbitrariness of the confirmation function also hampers the extent to which the logical interpretation can truly illuminate the connection between probabilities and frequencies.

The arbitrariness problem, moreover, stymies any compelling connection between logical probabilities and rational credences. And a further problem remains even after the confirmation function has been chosen: if one's credences are to be based on logical probabilities, they must be relativized to an evidence statement, e. But which is to be? Carnap requires that e be one's total evidence, that is, the maximally specific information at one's disposal, the strongest proposition of which one is certain. However, when we go beyond toy examples, it is not clear that this is well-defined. Suppose I have just watched a coin toss, and thus learned that the coin landed heads. Perhaps ‘the coin landed heads’ is my total evidence? But I also learned a host of other things: as it might be, that the coin landed at a certain time, bouncing in a certain way, making a certain noise as it did so … Call this long conjunction of facts X. I also learned a potentially infinite set of de se propositions: ‘I learned that X’, ‘I learned that I learned that X’ and so on. Perhaps, then, my total evidence is the infinite intersection of all these propositions, although this is still not obvious — and it is not something that can be represented by a sentence in one of Carnap's languages, which is finite in length. More significantly, the total evidence criterion goes hand in hand with positivism and a foundationalist epistemology according to which there are such determinate, ultimate deliverances of experience. But perhaps learning does not come in the form of such ‘bedrock’ propositions, as Jeffrey (1992) has argued — maybe it rather involves a shift in one's subjective probabilities across a partition, without any cell of the partition becoming certain. Then it may be the case that the strongest proposition of which one is certain is expressed by a tautology T — hardly an interesting notion of ‘total evidence’.[4]

In connection with the ‘applicability to science’ criterion, a point due to Lakatos is telling. By Carnap's lights, the degree of confirmation of a hypothesis depends on the language in which the hypothesis is stated and over which the confirmation function is defined. But scientific progress often brings with it a change in scientific language (for example, the addition of new predicates and the deletion of old ones), and such a change will bring with it a change in the corresponding c-values. Thus, the growth of science may overthrow any particular confirmation theory. There is something of the snake eating its own tail here, since logical probability was supposed to explicate the confirmation of scientific theories.

3.3 Frequency Interpretations

Gamblers, actuaries and scientists have long understood that relative frequencies bear an intimate relationship to probabilities. Frequency interpretations posit the most intimate relationship of all: identity. Thus, we might identify the probability of ‘heads’ on a certain coin with the frequency of heads in a suitable sequence of tosses of the coin, divided by the total number of tosses. A simple version of frequentism, which we will call finite frequentism, attaches probabilities to events or attributes in a finite reference class in such a straightforward manner:

the probability of an attribute A in a finite reference class B is the relative frequency of actual occurrences of A within B.

Thus, finite frequentism bears certain structural similarities to the classical interpretation, insofar as it gives equal weight to each member of a set of events, simply counting how many of them are ‘favorable’ as a proportion of the total. The crucial difference, however, is that where the classical interpretation counted all the possible outcomes of a given experiment, finite frequentism counts actual outcomes. It is thus congenial to those with empiricist scruples. It was developed by Venn (1876), who in his discussion of the proportion of births of males and females, concludes: “probability is nothing but that proportion” (p. 84, his emphasis).

Finite frequentism gives an operational definition of probability, and its problems begin there. For example, just as we want to allow that our thermometers could be ill-calibrated, and could thus give misleading measurements of temperature, so we want to allow that our ‘measurements’ of probabilities via frequencies could be misleading, as when a fair coin lands heads 9 out of 10 times. More than that, it seems to be built into the very notion of probability that such misleading results can arise. Indeed, in many cases, misleading results are guaranteed. Starting with a degenerate case: according to the finite frequentist, a coin that is never tossed, and that thus yields no actual outcomes whatsoever, lacks a probability for heads altogether; yet a coin that is never measured does not thereby lack a diameter. Perhaps even more troubling, a coin that is tossed exactly once yields a relative frequency of heads of either 0 or 1, whatever its bias. Famous enough to merit a name of its own, this is the so-called ‘problem of the single case’. In fact, many events are most naturally regarded as not merely unrepeated, but in a strong sense unrepeatable — the 2000 presidential election, the final game of the 2001 NBA play-offs, the Civil War, Kennedy's assassination, certain events in the very early history of the universe. Nonetheless, it seems natural to think of non-extreme probabilities attaching to some, and perhaps all, of them. Worse still, some cosmologists regard it as a genuinely chancy matter whether our universe is open or closed (apparently certain quantum fluctuations could, in principle, tip it one way or the other), yet whatever it is, it is ‘single-case’ in the strongest possible sense.

The problem of the single case is particularly striking, but we really have a sequence of related problems: ‘the problem of the double case’, ‘the problem of the triple case’ … Every coin that is tossed exactly twice can yield only the relative frequencies 0, 1/2 and 1, whatever its bias… A finite reference class of size n, however large n is, can only produce relative frequencies at a certain level of ‘grain’, namely 1/n. Among other things, this rules out irrational probabilities; yet our best physical theories say otherwise. Furthermore, there is a sense in which any of these problems can be transformed into the problem of the single case. Suppose that we toss a coin a thousand times. We can regard this as a single trial of a thousand-tosses-of-the-coin experiment. Yet we do not want to be committed to saying that that experiment yields its actual result with probability 1.

The problem of the single case is that the finite frequentist fails to see intermediate probabilities in various places where others do. There is also the converse problem: the frequentist sees intermediate probabilities in various places where others do not. Our world has myriad different entities, with myriad different attributes. We can group them into still more sets of objects, and then ask with which relative frequencies various attributes occur in these sets. Many such relative frequencies will be intermediate; the finite frequentist automatically identifies them with intermediate probabilities. But it would seem that whether or not they are genuine probabilities, as opposed to mere tallies, depends on the case at hand. Bare ratios of attributes among sets of disparate objects may lack the sort of modal force that one might expect from probabilities. I belong to the reference class consisting of myself, the Eiffel Tower, the southernmost sandcastle on Santa Monica Beach, and Mt Everest. Two of these four objects are less than 7 ft. tall, a relative frequency of 1/2; moreover, we could easily extend this class, preserving this relative frequency (or, equally easily, not). Yet it would be odd to say that my probability of being less than 7 ft. tall, relative to this reference class, is 1/2, even though it is perfectly acceptable (if uninteresting) to say that 1/2 of the objects in the reference class are less than 7 ft. tall.

Some frequentists (notably Venn 1876, Reichenbach 1949, and von Mises 1957 among others), partly in response to some of the problems above, have gone on to consider infinite reference classes, identifying probabilities with limiting relative frequencies of events or attributes therein. Thus, we require an infinite sequence of trials in order to define such probabilities. But what if the actual world does not provide an infinite sequence of trials of a given experiment? Indeed, that appears to be the norm, and perhaps even the rule. In that case, we are to identify probability with a hypothetical or counterfactual limiting relative frequency. We are to imagine hypothetical infinite extensions of an actual sequence of trials; probabilities are then what the limiting relative frequencies would be if the sequence were so extended. Note that at this point we have left empiricism behind. A modal element has been injected into frequentism with this invocation of a counterfactual; moreover, the counterfactual may involve a radical departure from the way things actually are, one that may even require the breaking of laws of nature. (Think what it would take for the coin in my pocket, which has only been tossed once, to be tossed infinitely many times — never wearing out, and never running short of people willing to toss it!) One may wonder, moreover, whether there is always — or ever — a fact of the matter of what such counterfactual relative frequencies are.

Limiting relative frequencies, we have seen, must be relativized to a sequence of trials. Herein lies another difficulty. Consider an infinite sequence of the results of tossing a coin, as it might be H, T, H, H, H, T, H, T, T, … Suppose for definiteness that the corresponding relative frequency sequence for heads, which begins 1/1, 1/2, 2/3, 3/4, 4/5, 4/6, 5/7, 5/8, 5/9, …, converges to 1/2. By suitably reordering these results, we can make the sequence converge to any value in [0, 1] that we like. (If this is not obvious, consider how the relative frequency of even numbers among positive integers, which intuitively ‘should’ converge to 1/2, can instead be made to converge to 1/4 by reordering the integers with the even numbers in every fourth place, as follows: 1, 3, 5, 2, 7, 9, 11, 4, 13, 15, 17, 6, …) To be sure, there may be something natural about the ordering of the tosses as given — for example, it may be their temporal ordering. But there may be more than one natural ordering. Imagine the tosses taking place on a train that shunts backwards and forwards on tracks that are oriented west-east. Then the spatial ordering of the results from west to east could look very different. Why should one ordering be privileged over others?

A well-known objection to any version of frequentism is that relative frequencies must be relativised to a reference class. Consider a probability concerning myself that I care about — say, my probability of living to age 80. I belong to the class of males, the class of non-smokers, the class of philosophy professors who have two vowels in their surname, … Presumably the relative frequency of those who live to age 80 varies across (most of) these reference classes. What, then, is my probability of living to age 80? It seems that there is no single frequentist answer. Instead, there is my probability-qua-male, my probability-qua-non-smoker, my probability-qua-male-non-smoker, and so on. This is an example of the so-called reference class problem for frequentism (although it can be argued that analogues of the problem arise for the other interpretations as well[5]). And as we have seen in the previous paragraph, the problem is only compounded for limiting relative frequencies: probabilities must be relativized not merely to a reference class, but to a sequence within the reference class. We might call this the reference sequence problem.

The beginnings of a solution to this problem would be to restrict our attention to sequences of a certain kind, those with certain desirable properties. For example, there are sequences for which the limiting relative frequency of a given attribute does not exist; Reichenbach thus excludes such sequences. Von Mises (1957) gives us a more thoroughgoing restriction to what he calls collectives — hypothetical infinite sequences of attributes (possible outcomes) of specified experiments that meet certain requirements. Call a place-selection an effectively specifiable method of selecting indices of members of the sequence, such that the selection or not of the index i depends at most on the first i − 1 attributes. The axioms are:

Axiom of Convergence: the limiting relative frequency of any attribute exists.

Axiom of Randomness: the limiting relative frequency of each attribute in a collective ω is the same in any infinite subsequence of ω which is determined by a place selection.

The probability of an attribute A, relative to a collective ω, is then defined as the limiting relative frequency of A in ω. Note that a constant sequence such as H, H, H, …, in which the limiting relative frequency is the same in any infinite subsequence, trivially satisfies the axiom of randomness. This puts some strain on the terminology — offhand, such sequences appear to be as non-random as they come — although to be sure it is desirable that probabilities be assigned even in such sequences. Be that as it may, there is a parallel between the role of the axiom of randomness in von Mises' theory and the principle of maximum entropy in the classical theory: both attempt to capture a certain notion of disorder.

Collectives are abstract mathematical objects that are not empirically instantiated, but that are nonetheless posited by von Mises to explain the stabilities of relative frequencies in the behavior of actual sequences of outcomes of a repeatable random experiment. Church (1940) renders precise the notion of a place selection as a recursive function. Nevertheless, the reference sequence problem remains: probabilities must always be relativized to a collective, and for a given attribute such as ‘heads’ there are infinitely many. Von Mises embraces this consequence, insisting that the notion of probability only makes sense relative to a collective. In particular, he regards single case probabilities as nonsense: “We can say nothing about the probability of death of an individual even if we know his condition of life and health in detail. The phrase ‘probability of death’, when it refers to a single person, has no meaning at all for us” (11). Some critics believe that rather than solving the problem of the single case, this merely ignores it. And note that von Mises understates the commitments of his theory: by his lights, the phrase ‘probability of death’ also has no meaning at all when it refers to a million people, or a billion, or any finite number.

Let us see how the frequentist interpretations fare according to our criteria of adequacy. Finite relative frequencies of course satisfy finite additivity. In a finite reference class, only finitely many events can occur, so only finitely many events can have positive relative frequency. In that case, countable additivity is satisfied somewhat trivially: all but finitely many terms in the infinite sum will be 0. Limiting relative frequencies violate countable additivity (de Finetti 1972, §5.22). Indeed, the domain of definition of limiting relative frequency is not even a field, let alone a sigma field (de Finetti 1972, §5.8). So such relative frequencies do not provide an admissible interpretation of Kolmogorov's axioms. Finite frequentism has no trouble meeting the ascertainability criterion, as finite relative frequencies are in principle easily determined. The same cannot be said of limiting relative frequencies. On the contrary, any finite sequence of trials (which, after all, is all we ever see) puts literally no constraint on the limit of an infinite sequence; still less does an actual finite sequence put any constraint on the limit of an infinite hypothetical sequence, however fast and loose we play with the notion of ‘in principle’ in the ascertainability criterion.

It might seem that the frequentist interpretations resoundingly meet the applicability to frequencies criterion. Finite frequentism meets it all too well, while limiting relative frequentism meets it in the wrong way. If anything, finite frequentism makes the connection between probabilities and frequencies too tight, as we have already observed. A fair coin that is tossed a million times is very unlikely to land heads exactly half the time; one that is tossed a million and one times is even less likely to do so! Facts about finite relative frequencies should serve as evidence, but not conclusive evidence, for the relevant probability assignments. Limiting relative frequentism fails to connect probabilities with finite frequencies. It connects them with limiting relative frequencies, of course, but again too tightly: for even in infinite sequences, the two can come apart. (A fair coin could land heads forever, even if it is highly unlikely to do so.) To be sure, science has much interest in finite frequencies, and indeed working with them is much of the business of statistics. Whether it has any interest in highly idealized, hypothetical extensions of actual sequences, and relative frequencies therein, is another matter. The applicability to rational opinion goes much the same way: it is clear that such opinion is guided by finite frequency information, unclear that it is guided by information about limits of hypothetical frequencies.

3.4 Propensity Interpretations

Like the frequency interpretations, propensity interpretations locate probability ‘in the world’ rather than in our heads or in logical abstractions. Probability is thought of as a physical propensity, or disposition, or tendency of a given type of physical situation to yield an outcome of a certain kind, or to yield a long run relative frequency of such an outcome. This view was motivated by the desire to make sense of single-case probability attributions such as ‘the probability that this radium atom decays in 1600 years is 1/2’. Indeed, Popper (1957) advances his propensity theory as an account of such quantum mechanical probabilities.

Popper develops the theory further in (1959a). For him, a probability p of an outcome of a certain type is a propensity of a repeatable experiment to produce outcomes of that type with limiting relative frequency p. For instance, when we say that a coin has probability 1/2 of landing heads when tossed, we mean that we have a repeatable experimental set-up — the tossing set-up — that has a propensity to produce a sequence of outcomes in which the limiting relative frequency of heads is 1/2. With its heavy reliance on limiting relative frequency, this position risks collapsing into von Mises-style frequentism according to some critics. Giere (1973), on the other hand, explicitly allows single-case propensities, with no mention of frequencies: probability is just a propensity of a repeatable experimental set-up to produce sequences of outcomes. This, however, creates the opposite problem to Popper's: how, then, do we get the desired connection between probabilities and frequencies?

It is thus useful to follow Gillies (2000) in distinguishing long-run propensity theories and single-case propensity theories:

A long-run propensity theory is one in which propensities are associated with repeatable conditions, and are regarded as propensities to produce in a long series of repetitions of these conditions frequencies which are approximately equal to the probabilities. A single-case propensity theory is one in which propensities are regarded as propensities to produce a particular result on a specific occasion (822).

Hacking (1965) and Gillies offer long-run (though not infinitely long-run) propensity theories; Fetzer (1982, 1983) and Miller (1994) offer single-case propensity theories. Note that ‘propensities’ are categorically different things depending on which sort of theory we are considering. According to the long-run theories, propensities are tendencies to produce relative frequencies with particular values, but the propensities are not the probability values themselves; according to the single-case theories, the propensities are the probability values. According to Popper, for example, a fair die has a propensity — an extremely strong tendency — to land ‘3’ with long-run relative frequency 1/6. The small value of 1/6 does not measure this tendency. According to Giere, on the other hand, the die has a weak tendency to land ‘3’. The value of 1/6 does measure this tendency.

It seems that those theories that tie propensities to frequencies do not provide an admissible interpretation of the (full) probability calculus, for the same reasons that relative frequencies do not. It is prima facie unclear whether single-case propensity theories obey the probability calculus or not. To be sure, one can stipulate that they do so, perhaps using that stipulation as part of the implicit definition of propensities. Still, it remains to be shown that there really are such things — stipulating what a witch is does not suffice to show that witches exist. Indeed, to claim, as Popper does, that an experimental arrangement has a tendency to produce a given limiting relative frequency of a particular outcome, presupposes a kind of stability or uniformity in the workings of that arrangement (for the limit would not exist in a suitably unstable arrangement). But this is the sort of ‘uniformity of nature’ presupposition that Hume argued could not be known either a priori, or empirically. Now, appeals can be made to limit theorems — so called ‘laws of large numbers’ — whose content is roughly that under suitable conditions, such limiting relative frequencies almost certainly exist, and equal the single case propensities. Still, these theorems make assumptions (e.g., that the trials are independent and identically distributed) whose truth again cannot be known, and must merely be postulated.

Part of the problem here, say critics, is that we do not know enough about what propensities are to adjudicate these issues. There is some property of this coin tossing arrangement such that this coin would land heads with a certain long-run frequency, say. But as Hitchcock (2002) points out, “calling this property a ‘propensity’ of a certain strength does little to indicate just what this property is.” Said another way, propensity accounts are accused of giving empty accounts of probability, à la Molière's ‘dormative virtue’ (Sober 2000, 64). Similarly, Gillies objects to single-case propensities on the grounds that statements about them are untestable, and that they are “metaphysical rather than scientific” (825). Some might level the same charge even against long-run propensities, which are supposedly distinct from the testable relative frequencies.

This suggests that the propensity account has difficulty meeting the applicability to science criterion. Some propensity theorists (e.g., Giere) liken propensities to physical magnitudes such as electrical charge that are the province of science. But Hitchcock observes that the analogy is misleading. We can only determine the general properties of charge — that it comes in two varieties, that like charges repel, and so on — by empirical investigation. What investigation, however, could tell us whether or not propensities are non-negative, normalized and additive?

More promising, perhaps, is the idea that propensities are to play certain theoretical roles, and that these place constraints on the way they must behave, and hence what they could be (in the style of the Ramsey/Lewis/‘Canberra plan’ approach to theoretical terms — see Lewis 1970 or Jackson 2000). The trouble here is that these roles may pull in opposite directions, overconstraining the problem. The first role, according to some, constrains them to obey the probability calculus (with finite additivity); the second role, according to others, constrains them to violate it.

On the one hand, propensities are said to constrain the degrees of belief, or credences, of a rational agent. We will have more to say in the next section about what credences are and what makes them rational, but for now recall the ‘applicability to rational belief’ criterion: an interpretation should clarify the role that probabilities play in constraining the credences of rational agents. One such putative role for propensities is codified by Lewis' ‘Principal Principle’ (1980). Roughly, the principle is that rational credences strive to ‘track’ propensities — sometimes called “chances” — so that if a rational agent knows the propensity of a given outcome, her degree of belief will be the same. More generally, where ‘P’ is the subjective probability function of a rational agent, and ‘ch’ is the propensity (chance) function,

P(A | ch(A) = x) = x,
    for all A and for all x such that P(ch(A) = x) > 0.[6]

For example, my degree of belief that this coin toss lands heads, given that its propensity of landing heads is 3/4, is 3/4. The Principal Principle underpins an argument (Lewis 1980) that whatever they are, propensities must obey the usual probability calculus (with finite additivity). After all, it is argued, rational credences, which are guided by them, do — see the next section.

On the other hand, Humphreys (1985) gives an influential argument that propensities do not obey Kolmogorov's probability calculus. The idea is that the probability calculus implies Bayes' theorem, which allows us to ‘invert’ a conditional probability:

P(A | B) =
P(B | A).P(A)

Yet propensities seem to be measures of ‘causal tendencies’, and much as the causal relation is asymmetric, so these propensities supposedly do not invert. Suppose that we have a test for an illness that occasionally gives false positives and false negatives. A given sick patient may have a (non-trivial) propensity to give a positive test result, but it apparently makes no sense to say that a given positive test result has a (non-trivial) propensity to have come from a sick patient. Thus, we have an argument that whatever they are, propensities must not obey the usual probability calculus. ‘Humphreys' paradox’, as it is known, is really an argument against any formal account of propensities that has as a theorem:

(*) if the probability of B, given A exists, then the probability of A, given B exists,

however one understands these conditional probabilities. The argument has prompted Fetzer and Nute (in Fetzer 1981) to offer a “probabilistic causal calculus” that looks quite different from Kolmogorov's calculus.[7] But one could respond more conservatively. For example, Popper's axiomatization of primitive conditional probabilities does not have (*) as a theorem, and thus propensities may conform to it despite Humphreys' argument.[8] At least to that extent they may still deserve to be called ‘probabilities'.

Or perhaps all this shows that the notion of ‘propensity’ bifurcates: on the one hand, there are propensities that bear an intimate connection to relative frequencies and rational credences, and that obey the usual probability calculus (with finite additivity); on the other hand, there are causal propensities that behave rather differently. In that case, there would be still more interpretations of probability than have previously been recognized.

3.5 Subjective probability

3.5.1 Probability as degree of belief

We may characterize subjectivism (also known as personalism and subjective Bayesianism) with the slogan: ‘Probability is degree of belief’. We identify probabilities with degrees of confidence, or credences, or “partial” beliefs of suitable agents. Thus, we really have many interpretations of probability here, as many as there are doxastic states of suitable agents: we have Aaron's degrees of belief, Abel's degrees of belief, Abigail's degrees of belief, … , or better still, Aaron's degrees of belief-at-time-t1, Aaron's degrees of belief-at-time-t2, Abel's degrees of belief-at-time-t1, … . Of course, we must ask what makes an agent ‘suitable’. What we might call unconstrained subjectivism places no constraints on the agents — anyone goes, and hence anything goes. Various studies by psychologists (see, e.g., several articles in Kahneman et al. 1982) show that people commonly violate the usual probability calculus in spectacular ways. We clearly do not have here an admissible interpretation (with respect to any probability calculus), since there is no limit to what agents might assign. Unconstrained subjectivism is not a serious proposal.

More interesting, however, is the claim that the suitable agents must be, in a strong sense, rational. Beginning with Ramsey (1926), various subjectivists have wanted to assimilate probability to logic by portraying probability as the logic of partial belief. A rational agent is required to be logically consistent, now taken in a broad sense. These subjectivists argue that this implies that the agent obeys the axioms of probability (although perhaps with only finite additivity), and that subjectivism is thus (to this extent) admissible. Before we can present this argument, we must say more about what degrees of belief are.

3.5.2 The betting interpretation and the Dutch Book argument

Subjective probabilities are traditionally analyzed in terms of betting behavior. Here is a classic statement by de Finetti (1980):

Let us suppose that an individual is obliged to evaluate the rate p at which he would be ready to exchange the possession of an arbitrary sum S (positive or negative) dependent on the occurrence of a given event E, for the possession of the sum pS; we will say by definition that this number p is the measure of the degree of probability attributed by the individual considered to the event E, or, more simply, that p is the probability of E (according to the individual considered; this specification can be implicit if there is no ambiguity). (62)

This boils down to the following analysis:

Your degree of belief in E is p iff p units of utility is the price at which you would buy or sell a bet that pays 1 unit of utility if E, 0 if not E.

The analysis presupposes that, for any E, there is exactly one such price — let's call this the agent's fair price for the bet on E. This presupposition may fail. There may be no such price — you may refuse to bet on E at all (perhaps unless coerced, in which case your genuine opinion about E may not be revealed), or your selling price may differ from your buying price, as may occur if your probability for E is vague. There may be more than one fair price — you may find a range of such prices acceptable, as may also occur if your probability for E is vague. For now, however, let us waive these concerns, and turn to an argument that uses the betting interpretation purportedly to show that rational degrees of belief must conform to the probability calculus (with at least finite additivity).

A Dutch book (against an agent) is a series of bets, each acceptable to the agent, but which collectively guarantee her loss, however the world turns out. Ramsey notes, and it can be easily proven (e.g., Skyrms 1984), that if your subjective probabilities violate the probability calculus, then you are susceptible to a Dutch book. For example, suppose that you violate the additivity axiom by assigning P(AB) < P(A) + P(B), where A and B are mutually exclusive. Then a cunning bettor could buy from you a bet on AB for P(AB) units, and sell you bets on A and B individually for P(A) and P(B) units respectively. He pockets an initial profit of P(A) + P(B) − P(AB), and retains it whatever happens. Ramsey offers the following influential gloss: “If anyone's mental condition violated these laws [of the probability calculus], his choice would depend on the precise form in which the options were offered him, which would be absurd.” (1980, 41)

Equally important, and often neglected, is the converse theorem that establishes how you can avoid such a predicament. If your subjective probabilities conform to the probability calculus, then no Dutch book can be made against you (Kemeny 1955); your probability assignments are then said to be coherent. In a nutshell, conformity to the probability calculus is necessary and sufficient for coherence.[8]

But let us return to the betting analysis of credences. It is an attempt to make good on Ramsey's idea that probability “is a measurement of belief qua basis of action” (34). While he regards the method of measuring an agent's credences by her betting behavior as “fundamentally sound” (34), he recognizes that it has its limitations.

The betting analysis gives an operational definition of subjective probability, and indeed it inherits some of the difficulties of operationalism in general, and of behaviorism in particular. For example, you may have reason to misrepresent your true opinion, or to feign having opinions that in fact you lack, by making the relevant bets (perhaps to exploit an incoherence in someone else's betting prices). Moreover, as Ramsey points out, placing the very bet may alter your state of opinion. Trivially, it does so regarding matters involving the bet itself (e.g., you suddenly increase your probability that you have just placed a bet). Less trivially, placing the bet may change the world, and hence your opinions, in other ways (betting at high stakes on the proposition ‘I will sleep well tonight’ may suddenly turn you into an insomniac). And then the bet may concern an event such that, were it to occur, you would no longer value the pay-off the same way. (During the August 11, 1999 solar eclipse in the UK, a man placed a bet that would have paid a million pounds if the world came to an end.)

These problems stem largely from taking literally the notion of entering into a bet on E, with its corresponding payoffs. The problems may be avoided by identifying your degree of belief in a proposition with the betting price you regard as fair, whether or not you enter into such a bet; it corresponds to the betting odds that you believe confer no advantage or disadvantage to either side of the bet (Howson and Urbach 1993). There is something of the Rawlsian ‘veil of ignorance’ reasoning here: imagine that you are to set the price for the bet, but you do not yet know which side of the bet you are to take. At your fair price, you should be indifferent between taking either side.[9]

de Finetti speaks of “an arbitrary sum” as the prize of the bet on E. The sum had better be potentially infinitely divisible, or else probability measurements will be precise only up to the level of ‘grain’ of the potential prizes. For example, a sum that can be divided into only 100 parts will leave probability measurements imprecise beyond the second decimal place, conflating probabilities that should be distinguished (e.g., those of a logical contradiction and of ‘a fair coin lands heads 8 times in a row’). More significantly, if utility is not a linear function of such sums, then the size of the prize will make a difference to the putative probability: winning a dollar means more to a pauper more than it does to Bill Gates, and this may be reflected in their betting behaviors in ways that have nothing to do with their genuine probability assignments. De Finetti responds to this problem by suggesting that the prizes be kept small; that, however, only creates the opposite problem that agents may be reluctant to bother about trifles, as Ramsey points out.

Better, then, to let the prizes be measured in utilities: after all, utility is infinitely divisible, and utility is a linear function of utility.

3.5.3 Probabilities and utilities

Utilities (desirabilities) of outcomes, their probabilities, and rational preferences are all intimately linked. The Port Royal Logic (Arnauld, 1662) showed how utilities and probabilities together determine rational preferences; de Finetti's betting interpretation derives probabilities from utilities and rational preferences; von Neumann and Morgenstern (1944) derive utilities from probabilities and rational preferences. And most remarkably, Ramsey (1926) (and later, Savage 1954 and Jeffrey 1966) derives both probabilities and utilities from rational preferences alone.

First, he defines a proposition to be ethically neutral — relative to an agent and an outcome — if the agent is indifferent between having that outcome when the proposition is true and when it is false. The idea is that the agent doesn't care about the ethically neutral proposition as such — it is a means to an end that he might care about, but it has no intrinsic value. Now, there is a simple test for determining whether, for a given agent, an ethically neutral proposition N has probability 1/2. Suppose that the agent prefers A to B. Then N has probability 1/2 iff the agent is indifferent between the gambles:

A if N, B if not

B if N, A if not.

Ramsey assumes that it does not matter what the candidates for A and B are. We may assign arbitrarily to A and B any two real numbers u(A) and u(B) such that u(A) > u(B), thought of as the desirabilities of A and B respectively. Having done this for the one arbitrarily chosen pair A and B, the utilities of all other propositions are determined.

Given various assumptions about the richness of the preference space, and certain ‘consistency assumptions’, he can define a real-valued utility function of the outcomes A, B, etc — in fact, various such functions will represent the agent's preferences. He is then able to define equality of differences in utility for any outcomes over which the agent has preferences. It turns out that ratios of utility-differences are invariant — the same whichever representative utility function we choose. This fact allows Ramsey to define degrees of belief as ratios of such differences. For example, suppose the agent is indifferent between A, and the gamble “B if X, C otherwise.” Then it follows from considerations of expected utility that her degree of belief in X, P(X), is given by:

P(X) =
u(A) − u(C)
u(B) − u(C)

Ramsey shows that degrees of belief so derived obey the probability calculus (with finite additivity). He calls what results “the logic of partial belief,” and indeed he opens his essay with the words “In this essay the Theory of Probability is taken as a branch of logic….”

Ramsey avoids some of the objections to the betting interpretation, but not all of them. Notably, the essential appeal to gambles again raises the concern that the wrong quantities are being measured. And his account has new difficulties. It is unclear what facts about agents fix their preference rankings. It is also dubious that consistency requires one to have a set of preferences as rich as Ramsey requires, or that one can find ethically neutral propositions of probability 1/2. This in turn casts some doubt on Ramsey's claim to assimilate probability theory to logic.

Savage (1954) likewise derives probabilities and utilities from preferences among options that are constrained by certain putative ‘consistency’ principles. For a given set of such preferences, he generates a class of utility functions, each a positive linear transformation of the other (i.e. of the form U1 = aU2 + b, where a > 0), and a unique probability function. Together these are said to ‘represent’ the agent's preferences. Jeffrey (1966) refines the method further. The result is theory of decision according to which rational choice maximizes ‘expected utility’, a certain probability-weighted average of utilities. Some of the difficulties with the behavioristic betting analysis of degrees of belief can now be resolved by moving to an analysis of degrees of belief that is functionalist in spirit. According to Lewis (1986a, 1994a), an agent's degrees of belief are represented by the probability function belonging to a utility function/probability function pair that best rationalizes her behavioral dispositions, rationality being given a decision-theoretic analysis.

There is a deep issue that underlies all of these accounts of subjective probability. They all presuppose the existence of necessary connections between desire-like states and belief-like states, rendered explicit in the connections between preferences and probabilities. In response, one might insist that such connections are at best contingent, and indeed can be imagined to be absent. Think of an idealized Zen Buddhist monk, devoid of any preferences, who dispassionately surveys the world before him, forming beliefs but no desires. It could be replied that such an agent is not so easily imagined after all — even if the monk does not value worldly goods, he will still prefer some things to others (e.g., truth to falsehood).

Once desires enter the picture, they may also have unwanted consequences. For example, how does one separate an agent's enjoyment or disdain for gambling from the value she places on the gamble itself? Ironically, a remark that Ramsey makes in his critique of the betting interpretation seems apposite here: “The difficulty is like that of separating two different co-operating forces” (1980, 35). See Eriksson and Hájek (2007) for further criticism of preference-based accounts of credence.

The betting interpretation makes subjective probabilities ascertainable to the extent that an agent's betting dispositions are ascertainable. The derivation of them from preferences makes them ascertainable to the extent that his or her preferences are known. However, it is unclear that an agent's full set of preferences is ascertainable even to himself or herself. Here a lot of weight may need to be placed on the ‘in principle’ qualification in the ascertainability criterion. The expected utility representation makes it virtually analytic that an agent should be guided by probabilities — after all, the probabilities are her own, and they are fed into the formula for expected utility in order to determine what it is rational for her to do.

3.5.4 Orthodox Bayesianism, and further constraints on rational credences

But do they function as a good guide? Here it is useful to distinguish different versions of subjectivism. Orthodox Bayesians in the style of de Finetti recognize no rational constraints on subjective probabilities beyond:

  1. conformity to the probability calculus, and
  2. a rule for updating probabilities in the face of new evidence, known as conditioning. An agent with probability function P1, who becomes certain of a piece of evidence E, should shift to a new probability function P2 related to P1 by:
    (Conditioning) P2(X) = P1(X | E) (provided P1(E) > 0).

This is a permissive epistemology, licensing doxastic states that we would normally call crazy. Thus, you could assign probability 1 to this sentence ruling the universe, while upholding such extreme subjectivism — provided, of course, that you assign probability 0 to this sentence not ruling the universe, and that your other probability assignments all conform to the probability calculus.

Some otherwise extreme subjectivists impose the further rationality requirement of regularity: only a priori falsehoods get assigned probability 0. This is sometimes also called ‘strict coherence’, and it is advocated by authors such as Kemeny (1955), Jeffreys (1961), Edwards et al. (1963), Shimony (1970), and Stalnaker (1970). It is meant to capture a form of open-mindedness and responsiveness to evidence. But then, perhaps unintuitively, someone who assigns probability 0.999 to this sentence ruling the universe can be judged rational, while someone who assigns it probability 0 is judged irrational. Note also that the requirement of regularity seems to afford a new argument for the non-existence of God as traditionally conceived: an omniscient agent, who gives probability 1 to all truths, would be convicted of irrationality. Thus regularity seems to require ignorance, or false modesty. See, e.g., Levi (1978) for further opposition to regularity.

Probabilistic coherence plays much the same role for degrees of belief that consistency plays for ordinary, all-or-nothing beliefs. What an extreme subjectivist, even one who demands regularity, lacks is an analogue of truth, some yardstick for distinguishing the ‘veridical’ probability assignments from the rest (such as the 0.999 one above), some way in which probability assignments are answerable to the world. It seems, then, that the subjectivist needs something more.

And various subjectivists offer more. Having isolated the “logic” of partial belief as conformity to the probability calculus, Ramsey goes on to discuss what makes a degree of belief in a proposition reasonable. After canvassing several possible answers, he settles upon one that focuses on habits of opinion formation — “e.g. the habit of proceeding from the opinion that a toadstool is yellow to the opinion that it is unwholesome” (50). He then asks, for a person with this habit, what probability it would be best for him to have that a given yellow toadstool is unwholesome, and he answers that “it will in general be equal to the proportion of yellow toadstools which are in fact unwholesome” (50). This resonates with more recent proposals (e.g., van Fraassen 1984, Shimony 1988) for evaluating degrees of belief according to how closely they match the corresponding relative frequencies — in the jargon, how well calibrated they are. Since relative frequencies obey the axioms of probability (up to finite additivity), it is thought that rational credences, which strive to track them, should do so also.[10]

However, rational credences may strive to track various things. For example, we are often guided by the opinions of experts. We consult our doctors on medical matters, our weather forecasters on meteorological matters, and so on. Gaifman (1988) coins the terms “expert assignment” and “expert probability” for a probability assignment that a given agent strives to track: “The mere knowledge of the [expert] assignment will make the agent adopt it as his subjective probability” (193). This idea may be codified as follows:

(Expert) P(A | pr(A) = x) = x,
    for all x such that P(pr(A) = x) > 0

where ‘P’ is the agent's subjective probability function, and ‘pr(A)’ is the assignment that the agent regards as expert. For example, if you regard the local weather forecaster as an expert on your local weather, and she assigns probability 0.1 to it raining tomorrow, then you may well follow suit:

P(rain | pr(rain) = 0.1) = 0.1

More generally, we might speak of an entire probability function as being such a guide for an agent over a specified set of propositions. van Fraassen (1989, 198) gives us this definition: “If P is my personal probability function, then q is an expert function for me concerning family F of propositions exactly if P(A | q(A) = x) = x for all propositions A in family F.”

Let us define a universal expert function for a given rational agent as one that would guide all of that agent's probability assignments in this way: an expert function for the agent concerning all propositions. van Fraassen (1984, 1995a), following Goldstein (1983), argues that an agent's future probability functions are universal expert functions for that agent. He enshrines this idea in his Reflection Principle, where Pt is the agent's probability function at time t, and Pt is her function at a later time t+Δ:

Pt(A | Pt(A) = x) = x,
    for all A and for all x such that Pt(Pt( A) = x) > 0.

The principle encapsulates a certain demand for ‘diachronic coherence’ imposed by rationality. Van Fraassen defends it with a ‘diachronic’ Dutch Book argument (one that considers bets placed at different times), and by analogizing violations of it to the sort of pragmatic inconsistency that one finds in Moore's paradox.

We may go still further. There may be universal expert functions for all rational agents. Let us call such a function a universal expert function, without any relativization to an agent. The Principle of Direct Probability regards the relative frequency function as a universal expert function; we have already seen the importance that proponents of calibration place on it. Let A be an event-type, and let relfreq(A) be the relative frequency of A (in some suitable reference class). Then for any rational agent with probability function P, we have (cf. Hacking 1965):

P(A | relfreq(A) = x) = x,
    for all A and for all x such that P(relfreq(A) = x) > 0.

Lewis, as we have seen, posits a similar universal expert role for the objective chance function, ch, in his Principal Principle:

P(A | ch(A) = x) = x,
    for all A and for all x such that P(ch(A) = x) > 0.

A frequentist who thinks that chances just are relative frequencies would presumably think that the Principal Principle just is the Principle of Direct Probability; but Lewis' principle may well appeal to those who have a very different view about chances — e.g., propensity theorists. The argument that we saw in the previous section, using the Principal Principle to show that propensities (chances) must obey the probability calculus, can now be turned on its head: assuming that they do obey it, rational degrees of belief, which aim to track these propensities, must do so too.

The ultimate expert, presumably, is the truth function — the function that assigns 1 to all the true propositions and 0 to all the false ones. Knowledge of its values should surely trump knowledge of the values assigned by human experts (including one's future selves), frequencies, or chances. Note that for any putative expert q,

P(A | q(A) = xA) = 1,
    for all A and for all x such that P(q(A) = xA) > 0

— the truth of A overrides anything the expert might say. So all of the proposed expert probabilities above should really be regarded as defeasible. Joyce (1998) portrays the rational agent as estimating truth values, seeking to minimize a measure of distance between them and her probability assignments. He argues that for any measure of distance that satisfies certain intuitive properties, any agent who violates the probability axioms could serve this epistemic goal better by obeying them instead, however the world turns out.

There are some unifying themes in these approaches to subjective probability. An agent's degrees of belief determine her estimates of certain quantities: the values of bets, or the desirabilities of gambles more generally, or the probability assignments of various ‘experts’ — humans, relative frequencies, objective chances, or truth values. The laws of probability then are claimed to be constraints on these estimates: putative necessary conditions for minimizing her ‘losses’ in a broad sense, be they monetary, or measured by distances from the assignments of these experts.

4. Conclusion: Future Prospects?

It should be clear from the foregoing that there is still much work to be done regarding the interpretation of probability. Each interpretation that we have canvassed seems to capture some crucial insight into it, yet falls short of doing complete justice to it. Perhaps the full story about probability is something of a patchwork, with partially overlapping pieces. In that sense, the above interpretations might be regarded as complementary, although to be sure each may need some further refinement. My bet, for what it is worth, is that we will retain at least three distinct notions of probability: one quasi-logical, one objective, and one subjective.

There are already signs of the rehabilitation of classical and logical probability, and in particular the principle of indifference and the principle of maximum entropy, by authors such as Stove (1986), Bartha and Johns (2001), Festa (1993), Paris and Vencovská (1997), and Maher (2000, 2001). Relevant here may also be advances in information theory and complexity theory (see Fine 1973, Li and Vitanyi 1997). These theories have already proved to be fruitful in the study of randomness (Kolmogorov 1965, Martin-Löf 1966), which obviously is intimately related to the notion of probability. Refinements of our understanding of randomness, in turn, should have a bearing on the frequency interpretations (recall von Mises' appeal to randomness in his definition of ‘collective’), and on propensity accounts (especially those that make explicit ties to frequencies). Given the apparent connection between propensities and causation adumbrated in Section 3, powerful causal modeling techniques by authors such as Spirtes, Glymour and Scheines (1993) and Pearl (2000), and recent work on causation more generally (e.g., Hall 2003, Woodward 2003) should also prove fruitful here.

An outgrowth of frequentism is Lewis' (1986b, 1994b) account of chance. It runs roughly as follows. The laws of nature are those regularities that are theorems of the best theory: the true theory of the universe that best balances simplicity, strength, and likelihood (that is, the probability of the actual course of history, given the theory). If any of the laws are probabilistic, then the chances are whatever these laws say they are. Now, it is somewhat unclear exactly what ‘simplicity’ and ‘strength’ consist in, and exactly how they are to be balanced. Perhaps insights from statistics and computer science may be helpful here: approaches to statistical model selection, and in particular the ‘curve-fitting’ problem, that attempt to characterize simplicity, and its trade-off with strength — e.g., the Akaike Information Criterion (see Forster and Sober 1994), the Bayesian Information Criterion (see Kieseppä 2001), Minimum Description Length theory (see Rissanen 1999) and Minimum Message Length theory (see Wallace and Dowe 1999).

State-of-the-art contributions to the subjectivist theory of probability include Schervish, Seidenfeld and Kadane's (2000) research on degrees of incoherence (measuring the extent of departures from obedience to the probability calculus) and on the aggregation of the opinions of multiple agents (Seidenfeld et al. 1989; see also Hild forthcoming). And a recently burgeoning area of research has concerned subjective probability ascriptions - whether they should be to propositions (sets of possible worlds), or to more fine-grained self-locating propositions (sets of centered worlds - see Lewis 1979). Thus, an agent may not assign credences simply to propositions concerning the way the world is, but to more specific propositions concerning who she is, where she is, or what time it is. This in turn has ramifications for updating rules, in particular calling into question the appropriateness of conditionalization. The so-called Sleeping Beauty problem (Elga 2000) has generated much discussion in this regard. These promise to be fertile areas of future research. We may expect that further criteria of adequacy for subjective probabilities will be developed — perhaps refinements of ‘scoring rules’ (Winkler 1996), and more generally, candidates for playing a role for subjective probability analogous to the role that truth plays for belief. Here we may come full circle. For belief is answerable both to logic and to objective facts. A refined account of degrees-of-belief may be answerable both to a refined quasi-logical and a refined objective notion of probability.

Well may we say that probability is a guide to life; but the task of understanding exactly how and why it is has still to be completed, and will surely prove to be a guide to future theorizing about it.

Suggested Further Reading

Kyburg (1970) contains a vast bibliography of the literature on probability and induction pre-1970. Also useful for references before 1967 is the bibliography for “Probability” in the Macmillan Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Earman (1992) and Howson and Urbach (1993) have more recent bibliographies, and give detailed presentations of the Bayesian program. Skyrms (2000) is an excellent introduction to the philosophy of probability. Von Plato (1994) is more technically demanding and more historically oriented, with another extensive bibliography that has references to many landmarks in the development of probability theory in the last century. Fine (1973) is still a highly sophisticated survey of and contribution to various foundational issues in probability, with an emphasis on interpretations. Billingsley (1995) and Feller (1968) are classic textbooks on the mathematical theory of probability.[11]


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Carnap, Rudolf | causation: probabilistic | epistemology: Bayesian | Laplace, Pierre Simon | Popper, Karl | Ramsey, Frank | Reichenbach, Hans


I thank Branden Fitelson, Matthias Hild, Christopher Hitchcock, Ralph Miles, Teddy Seidenfeld, Elliott Sober, and Jim Woodward for their many helpful comments, and especially Jim Joyce, who gave me very detailed and incisive feedback.