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Provability Logic

First published Wed Apr 2, 2003

Provability logic is a modal logic that is used to investigate what arithmetical theories can express in a restricted language about their provability predicates. The logic has been inspired by developments in meta-mathematics such as Gödel's incompleteness theorems of 1931 and Löb's theorem of 1953. As a modal logic, provability logic has been studied since the early seventies, and has had important applications in the foundations of mathematics.

From a philosophical point of view, provability logic is interesting because the concept of provability in a fixed theory of arithmetic has a unique and non-problematic meaning, other than concepts like necessity and knowledge studied in modal and epistemic logic. Furthermore, provability logic provides tools to study the notion of self-reference.

1. The history of provability logic

Two strands of research have led to the birth of provability logic. The first one stems from a paper by K. Gödel (1933), where he introduces a translation from intuitionistic propositional logic into modal logic (more precisely, into the system nowadays called S4), and briefly mentions that provability can be viewed as a modal operator. Even earlier, C.I. Lewis started the modern study of modal logic by introducing strict implication as a kind of deducibility, where he may have meant deducibility in a formal system like Principia Mathematica, but this is not clear from his writings.

The other strand starts from research in meta-mathematics: what can mathematical theories say about themselves by encoding interesting properties? In 1952, L. Henkin posed a deceptively simple question inspired by Gödel's incompleteness theorems. In order to formulate Henkin's question, some more background is needed. As a reminder, Gödel's first incompleteness theorem states that, for a sufficiently strong formal theory like Peano Arithmetic, any sentence asserting its own unprovability is in fact unprovable. On the other hand, from "outside" the formal theory, one can see that such a sentence is true in the standard model, pointing to an important distinction between truth and provability.

More formally, let A denote the Gödel number of arithmetical formula A, the result of assigning a numerical code to A. Let Prov be the formalized provability predicate for Peano Arithmetic, which is of the form ∃pProof(p,x). Here, Proof is the formalized proof predicate of Peano Arithmetic, and Proof(p,x) stands for Gödel number p codes a correct proof from the axioms of Peano Arithmetic of the formula with Gödel number x. (For a more precise formulation, see Smorynski (1985), Davis (1958)). Now, suppose that Peano Arithmetic proves A ↔¬ProvA, then by Gödel's result, A is not provable in Peano Arithmetic, and thus it is true, for in fact the self-referential sentence A states “I am not provable”.

Henkin on the other hand wanted to know whether anything could be said about sentences asserting their own provability: supposing that Peano Arithmetic proves BProv(B), what does this imply about B? Three years later, M. Löb took up the challenge and answered Henkin's question in a surprising way. Even though all sentences provable in Peano Arithmetic are indeed true about the natural numbers, Löb showed that the formalized version of this fact, Prov(B) → B, can only be proved in Peano Arithmetic in the trivial case that Peano Arithmetic already proves B itself. This result, now called Löb's theorem, immediately answers Henkin's question. (For a proof of Löb's theorem, see section 4.) Löb also showed a formalized version of his theorem, namely that Peano Arithmetic proves

Prov(Prov(B) → B)→ Prov(B).

In the same paper, Löb formulated three conditions on the provability predicate of Peano Arithmetic, that form a useful modification of the complicated conditions that Hilbert and Bernays introduced in 1939 for their proof of Gödel's second incompleteness theorem. In the following, derivability of A from Peano Arithmetic is denoted by PA ⊢ A:

  1. If PA ⊢ A, then PA ⊢ Prov(A);
  2. PA ⊢ Prov(AB) →(Prov(A) → Prov(B));
  3. PA ⊢ Prov(A) → Prov(Prov(A)).

These Löb conditions, as they are called nowadays, seem to cry out for a modal logical investigation, where the modality □ stands for provability in PA. Ironically, the first time that the formalized version of Löb's theorem was stated as the modal principle

□(□AA) → □A

was in a paper by Smiley in 1963 about the logical basis of ethics, which did not consider arithmetic at all. More relevant investigations, however, only seriously started almost twenty years after publication of Löb's paper. The early seventies saw the rapid development of propositional provability logic, where several researchers in different countries independently proved the most important results, discussed in sections 2, 3, and 4. Propositional provability logic turned out to capture exactly what many formal theories of arithmetic can say by propositional means about their own provability predicate. Recently, researchers have investigated the boundaries of this approach and have proposed several interesting more expressive extensions of provability logic (see section 5).

2. The axiom system of propositional provability logic

The logical language of propositional provability logic contains, in addition to propositional atoms and the usual truth-functional operators as well as the contradiction symbol ⊥, a modal operator □ with intended meaning “is provable in T,” where T is a sufficiently strong formal theory, let us say Peano Arithmetic (see section 4). ◊A is an abbreviation for ¬□¬A. Thus, the language is the same as that of modal systems such as K and S4 presented in the entry modal logic.

2.1 Axioms and rules

Propositional provability logic is often called GL, after Gödel and Löb. (Alternative names found in the literature for equivalent systems are L, KW, K4W, and PrL). The logic GL results from adding the following axiom to the basic modal logic K:

(GL) □(□AA) → □A.

As a reminder, because GL extends K, it contains all formulas having the form of a propositional tautology. For the same reason, GL contains the

Distribution Axiom: □(AB) → (□A → □B).

Furthermore, it is closed under the Modus Ponens Rule allowing to derive B from AB and B, and the Generalization Rule, which says that if A is a theorem of GL, then so is □A.

The notion GL ⊢ A denotes provability of a modal formula A in propositional provability logic. It is not difficult to see that the modal axiom □A → □□A (known as axiom 4 of modal logic) is indeed provable in GL. To prove this, one uses the substitution A∧□A for A in the axiom (GL), and applies the Distribution Axiom and the Generalization Rule as well as some propositional logic. Unless explicitly stated otherwise, in the sequel “provability logic” stands for the system GL of propositional provability logic.

2.2 The fixed point theorem

The main "modal" result about provability logic is the fixed point theorem, which D. de Jongh and G. Sambin independently proved in 1975. Even though it is formulated and proved by strictly modal methods, the fixed point theorem still has great arithmetical significance. It says essentially that self-reference is not really necessary, in the following sense. Suppose that all occurrences of the propositional variable p in a given formula A(p) are under the scope of the provability operator, for example A(p) = ¬□p, or A(p) = □(pq). Then there is a formula B in which p does not appear, such that all propositional variables that occur in B already appear in A(p), and such that

GL ⊢ BA(B).

This formula B is called a fixed point of A(p). Moreover, the fixed point is unique, or more accurately, if there is another formula C such that GL ⊢ CA(C), then we must have GL ⊢ BC. Most proofs in the literature give an algorithm by which one can compute the fixed point (see Smorynski 1985, Boolos 1993).

For example, suppose that A(p) = ¬ □p. Then the fixed point produced by such an algorithm is ¬ □⊥, and indeed one can prove that

GL ⊢ ¬□⊥ ↔ ¬□(¬□⊥).

If this is read arithmetically, the direction from left to right is just the formalized version of Gödel's second incompleteness theorem: if a sufficiently strong formal theory T like Peano Arithmetic does not prove a contradiction, then it is not provable in T that T does not prove a contradiction. Thus, sufficiently strong consistent arithmetical theories cannot prove their own consistency. We will turn to study the relation between provability logic and arithmetic more precisely in section 4, but to that end another “modal” aspect of GL needs to be provided first: semantics.

3. Possible worlds semantics

Provability logic has suitable possible worlds semantics, just like many other modal logics. As a reminder, a possible worlds model (or Kripke model) is a triple M = ⟨W,R,V⟩, where W is a set of possible worlds, R is a binary accessibility relation on W, and V is a valuation that assigns a truth value to each propositional variable for each world in W. The pair F = ⟨W,R⟩ is called the frame of this model. The notion of truth of a formula A in a model M at a world W, notation M,wA, is defined inductively. Let us repeat only the most interesting clause, the one for the provability operator □:

M,w ⊨ □A iff for every w′, if wRw′, then M,w′ ⊨ A.

See the entry modal logic for more information about possible worlds semantics in general.

3.1 Characterization and modal soundness

The modal logic K is valid in all Kripke models. Its extension GL however, is not: we need to restrict the class of possible worlds models to a more suitable one. Let us say that a formula A is valid in frame F, notation F ⊨ A, iff A is true in all worlds in Kripke models M based on F. It turns our that the new axiom (GL) of provability logic corresponds to a condition on frames, as follows:

For all frames F = <W,R>, F ⊨ □(□pp) → □p iff R is transitive and conversely well-founded.

Here, transitivity is the well-known property that for all worlds w1, w2, w3 in W, if w1Rw2 and w2Rw3, then w1Rw3. A relation is conversely well-founded iff there are no infinite ascending sequences, that is sequences of the form w1Rw2Rw3 R…. Note that conversely well-founded frames are also irreflexive, for if wRw, this gives rise to an infinite ascending sequence wRwRwR….

The above correspondence result immediately shows that GL is modally sound with respect to the class of possible worlds models on transitive conversely well-founded frames, because all axioms and rules of GL are valid on such models. The question is whether completeness also holds: for example, the formula □A → □□A, which is valid on all transitive frames, is indeed provable in GL, as was mentioned in Section 1. But are all valid formulas provable in GL?

3.2 Modal completeness

Unaware of the arithmetical significance of GL, K. Segerberg proved in 1971 that GL is indeed complete with respect to transitive conversely well-founded frames; D. de Jongh and S. Kripke independently proved this result as well. Segerberg showed that GL is complete even with respect to the more restricted class of finite transitive irreflexive trees, a fact which later turned out to be very useful for Solovay's proof of the arithmetical completeness theorem (see Section 4).

The modal soundness and completeness theorems immediately give rise to a decision procedure to check for any modal formula A whether A follows from GL or not. Looking at the procedure a bit more precisely, it can be shown that GL is decidable in the computational complexity class PSPACE, like the well-known modal logics K, T and S4. This means that there is a Turing machine that, given a formula A as input, answers whether A follows from GL or not; the size of the memory that the Turing machine needs for its computation is only polynomial in the length of A.

To give some more perspective on complexity, the class P of functions computable in an amount of time polynomial in the length of the input, is included in PSPACE, which in turn is included in the class EXPTIME of functions computable in exponential time. It remains a famous open problem whether these two inclusions are strict, although many complexity theorists believe that they are. Some other well-known modal logics, like epistemic logic with common knowledge, are decidable in EXPTIME, thus they may be more complex than GL, depending on the open problems.

3.3 Failure of strong completeness

Many well-known modal logics S are not only complete with respect to an appropriate class of frames, but even strongly complete in the sense that for all (finite or infinite) sets Γ and all formulas A:

If, on appropriate S-frames, A is true in all worlds in which all formulas of Γ are true, then Γ ⊢ A in the logic S.

This condition holds for systems like K, M, K4, S4, and S5. If restricted to finite sets Γ, the above condition corresponds to completeness.

Strong completeness does not hold for provability logic, however, because semantic compactness fails. Semantic compactness is the property that for each infinite set Γ of formulas,

If every finite subset Δ of Γ has a model on an appropriate S-frame, then Γ also has a model on an appropriate S-frame.

As a counterexample, take the infinite set of formulas

Γ = {◊p0, □(p0 → ◊p1), □(p1 → ◊p2), □(p2 → ◊p3),…, □(pn → ◊pn+1),…}

Then for every finite subset Δ of Γ, one can construct a model on a transitive, conversely well-founded frame and a world in the model where all formulas of Δ are true. So by modal soundness, GL does not prove ⊥ from Δ for any finite Δ ⊆ Γ, and a fortiori GL does not prove ⊥ from Γ, as any GL-proof is finite. On the other hand, it is easy to see that there is no model on a transitive, conversely well-founded frame where in any world, all formulas of Γ hold. Thus ⊥ follows semantically from Γ, but is not provable from it in GL, contradicting the condition of strong completeness.

4. Provability logic and Peano Arithmetic

From the time GL was formulated, researchers wondered whether it was adequate for formal theories like Peano Arithmetic (PA): does GL prove everything about the notion of provability that can be expressed in a propositional modal language and can be proved in Peano Arithmetic, or should more principles be added to GL? To make this notion of adequacy more precise, we define a realization (sometimes called translation or interpretation) to be a function f that assigns to each propositional atom of modal logic a sentence of arithmetic, where

4.1 Arithmetical soundness

It was already clear in the early seventies that GL is arithmetically sound with respect to PA, formally:

If GL ⊢ A, then for all realizations f, PA ⊢ f(A).

To give some taste of meta-mathematics, let us sketch the soundness proof.

Proof sketch of arithmetical soundness. PA indeed proves realizations of propositional tautologies, and provability of the Distribution Axiom of GL translates to

PA ⊢ Prov(AB) →(Prov(A) → Prov(B))

for all formulas A and B, which is just Löb's second derivability condition (see Section 1). Moreover, PA obeys Modus Ponens, as well as the translation of the Generalization Rule:

If PA ⊢ A, then PA ⊢ Prov(A),

which is just Löb's first derivability condition. Finally, the translation of the main axiom (GL) is indeed provable in PA:

PA ⊢ Prov(Prov(A) →A) → Prov(A).

This is exactly the formalized version of Löb's theorem mentioned in Section 1 .

Let us give a sketch of the proof of Löb's theorem itself from his derivability conditions (the proof of the formalized version is similar). The proof is based on Gödel's Diagonalization lemma, which says that for any arithmetical formula C(x) there is an arithmetical formula B such that

PA ⊢ BC(B).

In words, the formula B says “I have property C.”

Proof of Löb's theorem:. Suppose that PA ⊢ Prov(A)→A, we need to show that PA ⊢ A. By the Diagonalization lemma, there is a formula B such that

PA ⊢ B↔(Prov(B)→A).

From this it follows by Löb's first and second derivability conditions plus some propositional reasoning that

PA ⊢ Prov(B) ↔ Prov(Prov (B) →A).

Thus, again by Löb's second condition,

PA ⊢ Prov(B) →(Prov( Prov(B) )→ Prov(A)).

On the other hand Löb's third condition gives

PA ⊢ Prov(B)→ Prov(Prov(B)),


PA ⊢ Prov(B)→ Prov(A).

Together with the assumption that PA ⊢ Prov(A) →A, this gives

PA ⊢ Prov(B)→A.

Finally, the equation produced by Diagonalization implies that PA ⊢ B, so PA ⊢ Prov(B), thus

PA ⊢ A,

as desired.

Note that substituting ⊥ for A in Löb's theorem, we derive that PA ⊢ ¬Prov () implies PA ⊢ ⊥, which is just the contraposition of Gödel's second incompleteness theorem.

4.2 Arithmetical completeness

The landmark result in provability logic is R. Solovay's arithmetical completeness theorem of 1976, showing that GL is indeed adequate for Peano Arithmetic:

GL ⊢ A if and only if for all realizations f, PA ⊢ f(A).

This theorem says essentially that the modal logic GL captures everything that Peano Arithmetic can say in modal terms about its own provability predicate. The direction from left to right, arithmetical soundness of GL, is discussed above. Solovay set out to prove the other, much more difficult, direction by contraposition. His proof is based on intricate self-referential techniques, and only a small glimpse can be given here.

The modal completeness theorem by Segerberg was an important first step in Solovay's proof of arithmetical completeness of GL with respect to Peano Arithmetic. Suppose that GL does not prove the modal formula A. Then, by modal completeness, there is a finite transitive irreflexive tree such that A is false at the root of that tree. Now Solovay devised an ingenious way to simulate such a finite tree in the language of Peano Arithmetic. Thus he found a realization f from modal formulas to sentences of arithmetic, such that Peano Arithmetic does not prove f(A).

Solovay's completeness theorem provides an alternative way to construct many arithmetical sentences that are not provable in Peano Arithmetic. For example, it is easy to make a possible worlds model to show that GL does not prove □p ∨ □¬p, so by Solovay's theorem, there is an arithmetical sentence f(p) such that Peano Arithmetic does not prove Prov(f(p)) ∨ Prov(¬f(p)). In particular, this implies that neither f(p) nor ¬f(p) is provable in Peano Arithmetic; for suppose on the contrary that PA ⊢ f(p), then by Löb's first condition and propositional logic, PA ⊢ Prov(f(p)) ∨ Prov(¬f(p)), leading to a contradiction, and similarly if one supposes that PA ⊢ ¬F(p).

Solovay's theorem is so significant because it shows that an interesting fragment of an undecidable formal theory like Peano Arithmetic -- namely that which arithmetic can express in propositional terms about its own provability predicate -- can be studied by means of a decidable modal logic, GL, with a perspicuous possible worlds semantics.

5. The scope of provability logic

In this section, some recent trends in research on provability logic are discussed. One important strand concerns the limits on the scope of GL, where the main question is, for which formal theories, other than Peano Arithmetic, is GL the appropriate propositional provability logic? Next, we discuss some generalizations of propositional provability logic in more expressive modal languages.

5.1 Boundaries

In recent years, logicians have investigated many other systems of arithmetic that are weaker than Peano Arithmetic. Often these logicians took their inspiration from computability issues, for example the study of functions computable in polynomial time. They have given a partial answer to the question: “For which theories of arithmetic does Solovay's arithmetical completeness theorem (with respect to the appropriate provability predicate) still hold?” To discuss this question, two concepts are needed. Δ0-formulas are arithmetical formulas in which all quantifiers are bounded by a term, for example

yss0 ∀zyxy+z (x+y ≤ (y+(y+z))),

where s is the successor operator (“+1”). The arithmetical theory I Δ0 (where I stands for "induction"), is similar to Peano Arithmetic, except that it allows less induction: the induction scheme

A(0) ∧ ∀x(A(x)→ A(sx)) → ∀x A(x)

is restricted to Δ0-formulas A.

As De Jongh and others (1991) pointed out, arithmetical completeness certainly holds for theories T that satisfy the following two conditions:

  1. T proves induction for Δ0-formulas, and T proves EXP, the formula expressing that for all x, its power 2x exists. In more standard notation: T extends IΔ 0+EXP;
  2. T does not prove any false sentences of the form ∃x A(x), with A(x) a Δ0-formula.

For such theories, arithmetical soundness and completeness of GL hold, provided that □ translates to ProvT, a natural provability predicate with respect to a sufficiently simple axiomatization of T. Thus for modal sentences A:

GL ⊢ A if and only if for all realizations f, Tf(A).

It is not clear yet whether condition 1 gives a lower bound on the scope of provability logic. For example, it is still an open question whether GL is the provability logic of IΔ01, a theory which is somewhat weaker than IΔ0+EXP in that Ω1 is the axiom asserting that for all x, its power xlog(x) exists. Provability logic GL is arithmetically sound with respect to IΔ01, but except for some partial results by Berarducci et al. (1993), providing arithmetic realizations consistent with IΔ0 + Ω1 for a restricted class of sentences consistent with GL, the question remains open. Its answer may hinge on open problems in computational complexity theory.

The above result by De Jongh et al. shows a strong feature of provability logic: for many different arithmetical theories, GL captures exactly what those theories say about their own provability predicates. At the same time this is a weakness. For example, propositional provability logic does not point to any differences between those theories that are finitely axiomatizable and those that are not.

5.2 Interpretability logic

In order to be able to speak in a modal language about important distinctions between theories, researchers have extended provability logic in many different ways. Let us mention a few. One extension is to add a binary modality ⊳, where for a given arithmetical theory T, the modal sentence AB is meant to stand for “T+B is interpretable in T+A.” Visser characterized the interpretability logic of the most common finitely axiomatized theories, and Berarducci and Shavrukov independently characterized the one for PA. It appears that indeed, the interpretability logic of finitely axiomatizable theories is different from the interpretability logic of Peano Arithmetic, which is not finitely axiomatizable (see Visser (1990,1997), Berarducci (1990), Shavrukov (1988)).

5.3 Propositional quantifiers

Another way to extend the framework of propositional provability logic is to add propositional quantifiers, so that one can express principles like Goldfarb's:

pqr□((□p ∨ □q) ↔ □r),

saying that for any two sentences there is a third sentence which is provable if and only if either of the first two sentences is provable. This principle is provable in Peano Arithmetic. The set of sentences of GL with propositional quantifiers that is arithmetically valid turns out to be undecidable (Shavrukov (1997)).

5.4 Predicate provability logic

Finally, one can of course study predicate provability logic. The language is that of predicate logic without function symbols, together with the operator □. Here, the situation becomes much more complex than in the case of propositional provability logic. Is there a nicely axiomatized predicate provability logic that is adequate, proving exactly the valid principles of provability? The answer is unfortunately a resounding no: Vardanyan (1986) has proved on the basis of ideas by Artëmov (1985) that the set of sentences of predicate provability logic all of whose realizations are provable in PA is not even recursively enumerable, so it has no reasonable axiomatization.

5.5 Other generalizations

Left out in the above discussion are many other important strands of research in provability logic and its extensions. The interested reader is pointed to the following areas:

6. Philosophical significance

Even though propositional provability logic is a modal logic with a kind of “necessity” operator, it withstands Quine's (1976) critique of modal notions as unintelligible, because of its clear and unambiguous arithmetic interpretation. For example, unlike for many other modal logics, formulas with nested modalities like □◊ p →□⊥ are not problematic, nor are there any disputes about which ones should be tautologies. In fact, provability logic embodies all the desiderata that Quine (1953) set out for syntactic treatments of modality.

Quine's main arrows were pointed towards modal predicate logics, especially the construction of sentences that contain modal operators under the scope of quantifiers (“quantifying in”). In predicate provability logic, however, where quantifiers range over natural numbers, both de dicto and de re modalities have straightforward interpretations, contrary to the case of other modal logics (see the note on the de dicto / de re distinction). For example, formulas like

x□∃y(y = x)

are not at all problematic. If the number n is assigned to x, then □∃y(y = x) is true with respect to this assignment iff the sentence ∃y(y = In) is provable in Peano Arithmetic; here, In is the numeral of n, i.e., the term sss0 with n occurrences of the successor operator s. This sentence is true for all n in the standard model of the natural numbers, and ∀x□∃y(y = x) is even provable in Peano Arithmetic.

By the way, the Barcan Formula

xA(x) → □∀xA(x)

is not true for the integers, let alone provable (for example, take for A(x) the formula “x does not code a proof of ⊥”). Its converse

□∀xA(x) → ∀xA(x),

on the other hand, is provable in Peano Arithmetic for any formula A.

Provability logic has very different principles from other modal logics, even those with a seemingly similar purpose. For example, while provability logic captures provability in formal theories of arithmetic, epistemic logic endeavors to describe knowledge, which could be viewed as a kind of informal provability. In many versions of epistemic logic, one of the most important principles is the truth axiom (5):

S5 ⊢ □AA, (if one knows A, then A is true).

The analogous principle clearly does not hold for GL: after all,

if GL ⊢ □AA, then GL ⊢ A.

Thus, it seems misguided to compare the strength of both notions or to combine them in one modal system. Perhaps formal provability is indeed in some sense a stronger notion than informal provability, but definitely this is not an arithmetic truth or validity, nor is the other direction. Discussions of the consequences of Gödel's incompleteness theorems sometimes involve confusion around the notion of provability, giving rise to claims that humans could beat formal systems in “knowing” theorems (see Davis (1990, 1993) for good discussions of such claims).

All in all, formal provability is a precisely defined concept, much more so than truth and knowledge. Thus, self-reference within the scope of provability does not lead to semantic paradoxes like the Liar. Instead, it has led to some of the most important results about mathematics, such as Gödel's incompleteness theorems.


General references on provability logic


Provability and Peano Arithmetic

The scope of provability logic

Philosophical significance

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

artificial intelligence | logic: classical | logic: intuitionistic | logic: modal | logic: relevance | mathematics: constructive | model theory | possible worlds | Quine, Willard van Orman | Turing, Alan