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Relevance Logic

First published Wed Jun 17, 1998; substantive revision Mon Jan 2, 2006

Relevance logics are non-classical logics. Called ‘relevant logics” in Britain and Australasia, these systems developed as attempts to avoid the paradoxes of material and strict implication. Among the paradoxes of material implication are

Among the paradoxes of strict implication are the following:

Many philosophers, beginning with Hugh MacColl (1908), have claimed that these theses are counterintuitive. They claim that these formulae fail to be valid if we interpret → as representing the concept of implication that we have before we learn classical logic. Relevance logicians claim that what is unsettling about these so-called paradoxes is that in each of them the antecedent seems irrelevant to the consequent.

In addition, relevance logicians have had qualms about certain inferences that classical logic makes valid. For example, consider the classically valid inference

The moon is made of green cheese. Therefore, either it is raining in Ecuador now or it is not.

Again here there seems to be a failure of relevance. The conclusion seems to have nothing to do with the premise. Relevance logicians have attempted to construct logics that reject theses and arguments that commit "fallacies of relevance".

Relevant logicians point out that what is wrong with some of the paradoxes (and fallacies) is that is that the antecedents and consequents (or premises and conclusions) are on completely different topics. The notion of a topic, however, would seem not to be something that a logician should be interested in — it has to do with the content, not the form, of a sentence or inference. But there is a formal principle that relevant logicians apply to force theorems and inferences to “stay on topic”. This is the variable sharing principle. The variable sharing principle says that no formula of the form A → B can be proven in a relevance logic if A and B do not have at least one propositional variable (sometimes called a proposition letter) in common and that no inference can be shown valid if the premises and conclusion do not share at least one propositional variable.

At this point some confusion is natural about what relevant logicians have attempted to do. The variable sharing principle is only a necessary condition that a logic must have to count as a relevance logic. It is not sufficient. Moreover, this principle does not give us a criterion that eliminates all of the paradoxes and fallacies. Some remain paradoxical or fallacious even though they satisfy variable sharing. As we shall see, however, relevant logic does provide us with a relevant notion of proof in terms of the real use of premises (see the section “Proof Theory” below), but it does not by itself tell us what counts as a true (and relevant) implication. It is only when the formal theory is put together with a philosophical interpretation that it can do this (see the section “Semantics” below).

In this article we will give a brief and relatively non-technical overview of the field of relevance logic.

1. Semantics

Our exposition of relevant logic is backwards to most found in the literature We will begin, rather than end, with the semantics, since most philosophers at present are semantically inclined.

The semantics that I present here is the ternary relation semantics due to Richard Routley and Robert K. Meyer. This semantics is a development of Alasdair Urquhart's “semilattice semantics” (Urquhart 1972). There is a similar semantics (which is also based on Urquhart's ideas), due to Kit Fine, that was developed at the same time as the Routley-Meyer theory (Fine 1974). And there is an algebraic semantics due to J. Michael Dunn. Urquhart's, Fine's, and Dunn's models are very interesting in their own right, but we do not have room to discuss them here.

The idea behind the ternary relation semantics is rather simple. Consider C.I. Lewis' attempt to avoid the paradoxes of material implication. He added a new connective to classical logic, that of strict implication. In post-Kripkean semantic terms, A fishhookB is true at a world w if and only if for all w′ such that w′ is accessible to w, either A fails in w′ or B obtains there. Now, in Kripke's semantics for modal logic, the accessibility relation is a binary relation. It holds between pairs of worlds. Unfortunately, from a relevant point of view, the theory of strict implication is still irrelevant. That is, we still make valid formulae like p fishhook(q fishhookq). We can see quite easily that the Kripke truth condition forces this formula on us.

Like the semantics of modal logic, the semantics of relevance logic relativises truth of formulae to worlds. But Routley and Meyer go modal logic one better and use a three-place relation on worlds. This allows there to be worlds at which qq fails and that in turn allows worlds at which p → (qq) fails. Their truth condition for → on this semantics is the following:

AB is true at a world a if and only if for all worlds b and c such that Rabc (R is the accessibility relation) either A is false at b or B is true at c.

For people new to the field it takes some time to get used to this truth condition. But with a little work it can be seen to be just a generalisation of Kripke's truth condition for strict implication (just set b = c).

The ternary relation semantics can be adapted to be a semantics for a wide range of logics. Placing different constraints on the relation makes valid different formulae and inferences. For example, if we constrain the relation so that Raaa holds for all worlds a, then we make it true that if (AB) & A is true at a world, then B is also true there. Given other features of the Routley-Meyer semantics, this makes the thesis ((AB) & A) → B valid. If we make the ternary relation symmetrical in its first two places, that is, we constrain it so that, for all worlds a, b, and c, if Rabc then Rbac, then we make valid the thesis A((AB) → B).

The ternary accessibility relation needs a philosophical interpretation in order to give relevant implication a real meaning on this semantics. Recently there have been three interpretations developed based on theories about the nature of information. One interpretation of the ternary relation, due to Dunn, develops the idea behind Urquhart's semilattice semantics. On Urquhart's semantics, instead of treating indices as possible (or impossible) worlds, they are taken to be pieces of information. In the semilattice semantics, an operator ° combines the information of two states — a°b is the combination of the information in a and b. The Routley-Meyer semantics does not contain a combination or “fusion” operator on worlds, but we can get an approximation of it using the ternary relation. On Dunn's reading, ‘Rabc’ says that “the combination of the information states a and b is contained in the information state c” (Dunn 1986).

Another interpretation is suggested in Jon Barwise (1993) and developed in Restall (1996). On this view, worlds are taken to be information-theoretic "sites" and “channels”. A site is a context in which information is received and a channel is a conduit through which information is transferred. Thus, for example, when the BBC news appears on the television in my living room, we can consider the living room to be a site and the wires, satellites, and so on, that connect my television to the studio in London to be a channel. Using channel theory to interpret the Routley-Meyer semantics, we take Rabc to mean that a is an information-theoretic channel between sites b and c. Thus, we take AB to be true at a if and only if, whenever a connects a site b at which A obtains to a site c, B obtains at c.

Similarly, Mares (1997) uses a theory of information due to David Israel and John Perry (1990). In addition to other information a world contains informational links, such as laws of nature, conventions, and so on. For example, a Newtonian world will contain the information that all matter attracts all other matter. In information-theoretic terms, this world contains the information that two things' being material carries the information that they attract each other. On this view, Rabc if and only if, according to the links in a, all the information carried by what obtains in b is contained in c. Thus, for example, if a is a Newtonian world and the information that x and y are material is contained in b, then the information that x and y attract each other is contained in c.

Another interpretation is developed in Mares (2004). This interpretation takes the Routley-Meyer semantics to be a formalisation of the notion of “situated implication”. This interpretation takes the “worlds” of the Routley-Meyer semantics to be situations. A situation is a perhaps partial representation of the universe. The information contained in two situations, a and b might allow us to infer further information about the universe that is contained in neither situation. Thus, for example, suppose in our current situation that we have the information contained in the laws of the theory of general relativity (this is Einstein's theory of gravity). Then we hypothesise a situation in which we can see a star moving in an ellipse. Then, on the basis of the information that we have and the hypothesised situation, we can infer that there is a situation in which there is a very heavy body acting on this star.

We can model situated inference using a relation I (for “implication”). Then we have IabP, where P is a proposition, if and only if the information in a and b together license the inference to there being a situation in which P holds. We can think of a proposition itself as a set of situations. We set AB to hold at a if and only if, for all situations b in which A holds, Iab|B|, where |B| is the set of situations at which B is true. We set Rabc to hold if and only if c belongs to every proposition P such that IabP. With the addition of the postulate that, for any set of propositions P such that IabP, the intersection of that set X is such that IabX, we find that the implications that are made true on any situation using the truth condition that appeals to I are the same as those that are made true by the Routley-Meyer truth condition. Thus, the notion of situated inference gives a way of understanding the Routley-Meyer semantics. (This is a very brief version of the discussion of situated inference that is in chapters 2 and 3 of Mares (2004).)

By itself, the use of the ternary relation is not sufficient to avoid all the paradoxes of implication. Given what we have said so far, it is not clear how the semantics can avoid paradoxes such as (p & ¬p) → q and p → (q ∨¬q). These paradoxes are avoided by the inclusion of inconsistent and non-bivalent worlds in the semantics. For, if there were no worlds at which p & ¬p holds, then, according to our truth condition for the arrow, (p & ¬p) → q would also hold everywhere. Likewise, if q ∨¬q held at every world, then p → (q ∨¬q) would be universally true.

This brings us to the semantics for negation. The use of non-bivalent and inconsistent worlds requires a non-classical truth condition for negation. In the early 1970s, Richard and Val Routley invented their "star operator" to treat negation. The operator is an operator on worlds. For each world a, there is a world a*. And

¬A is true at a if and only if A is false at a*.

Once again, we have the difficulty of interpreting a part of the formal semantics. One interpretation of the Routley star is that of Dunn (1993). Dunn uses a binary relation, C, on worlds. Cab means that b is compatible with a. a*, then, is the maximal world (the world containing the most information) that is compatible with a.

There are other semantics for negation. One, due to Dunn and developed by Routley, is a four-valued semantics. This semantics is treated in the entry on paraconsistent logics. Other treatments of negation, some of which have been used for relevant logics, can be found in Wansing (2001).

2. Proof Theory

There is now a large variety of approaches to proof theory for relevant logics. There is a sequent calculus for the negation-free fragment of the logic R due to Gregory Mints (1972) and J.M. Dunn (1973) and an elegant and very general approach called "Display Logic" developed by Nuel Belnap (1982). For the former, see the supplementary document:

Logic R

But here I will only deal with the natural deduction system for the relevant logic R due to Anderson and Belnap.

Anderson and Belnap's natural deduction system is based on Fitch's natural deduction systems for classical and intuitionistic logic. The easiest way to understand this technique is by looking at an example.

1. A{1} Hyp
2. (AB){2} Hyp
3. B{1,2} 1,2, → E

This is a simple case of modus ponens. The numbers in set brackets indicate the hypotheses used to prove the formula. We will call them ‘indices’. The indices in the conclusion indicate which hypotheses are really used in the derivation of the conclusion. In the following “proof” the second premise is not really used:

1. A{1} Hyp
2. B{2} Hyp
3. (AB){3} Hyp
4. B{1,3} 1,3, → E

This “proof” really just shows that the inference from A and AB to B is relevantly valid. Because the number 2 does not appear in the subscript on the conclusion, the second “premise” does not really count as a premise.

Similarly, when an implication is proven relevantly, the assumption of the antecedent must really be used to prove the conclusion. Here is an example of the proof of an implication:

1. A{1} Hyp
2. (AB){2} Hyp
3. B{1,2} 1,2, → E
4. ((AB) → B){1} 2,3, → I
5. A → ((AB) → B) 1,4, → I

When we discharge a hypothesis, as in lines 4 and 5 of this proof, the number of the hypothesis must really occur in the subscript of the formula that is to become the consequent of the implication.

Now, it might seem that the system of indices allows irrelevant premises to creep in. One way in which it might appear that irrelevances can intrude is through the use of a rule of conjunction introduction. That is, it might seem that we can always add in an irrelevant premise by doing, say, the following:

1. A{1} Hyp
2. B{2} Hyp
3. (A & B){1,2} 1,2, &I
4. B{1,2} 3, &E
5. (BB){1} 2,4, → I
6. A → (BB) 1,5, → I

To a relevance logician, the first premise is completely out of place here. To block moves like this, Anderson and Belnap give the following conjunction introduction rule:

From Ai and Bi to infer (A & B)i.

This rule says that two formulae to be conjoined must have the same index before the rule of conjunction introduction can be used.

There is, of course, a lot more to the natural deduction system (see Anderson and Belnap 1975 and Anderson, Belnap, and Dunn 1992), but this will suffice for our purposes. The theory of relevance that is captured by at least some relevant logics can be understood in terms of how the corresponding natural deduction system records the real use of premises.

3. Systems of Relevance Logic

In the work of Anderson and Belnap the central systems of relevance logic were the logic E of relevant entailment and the system R of relevant implication. The relationship between the two systems is that the entailment connective of E was supposed to be a strict (i.e. necessitated) relevant implication. To compare the two, Meyer added a necessity operator to R (to produce the logic NR). Larisa Maksimova, however, discovered that NR and E are importantly different — that there are theorems of NR (on the natural translation) that are not theorems of E. This has left some relevant logicians with a quandary. They have to decide whether to take NR to be the system of strict relevant implication, or to claim that NR was somehow deficient and that E stands as the system of strict relevant implication. (Of course, they can accept both systems and claim that E and R have a different relationship to one another.)

On the other hand, there are those relevance logicians who reject both R and E. There are those, like Arnon Avron, who accept logics stronger than R (Avron 1990). And there are those, like Ross Brady, John Slaney, Steve Giambrone, Richard Sylvan, Graham Priest, Greg Restall, and others, who have argued for the acceptance of systems weaker than R or E. One extremely weak system is the logic S of Robert Meyer and Errol Martin. As Martin has proven, this logic contains no theorems of the form AA. In other words, according to S, no proposition implies itself and no argument of the form ‘A, therefore A’ is valid. Thus, this logic does not make valid any circular arguments.

For more details on these logics see supplements on the logic E, logic R, logic NR, and logic S.

Among the points in favour of weaker systems is that, unlike R or E, many of them are decidable. Another feature of some of these weaker logics that makes them attractive is that they can be used to construct a naïve set theory. A naïve set theory is a theory of sets that includes as a theorem the naïve comprehension axiom, viz., for all formulae A(y),


In set theories based on strong relevant logics, like E and R, as well as in classical set theory, if we add the naïve comprehension axiom, we are able to derive any formula at all. Thus, naïve set theories based on systems such as E and R are said to be “trivial”. Here is an intuitive sketch of the proof of the triviality of a naïve set theory using principles of inference from the logic R. Let p be an arbitrary proposition:

1. ∃xy(yx ↔ (yyp)) Naïve Comprehension
2. ∀y(yz ↔ (yyp)) 1, Existential Instantiation
3. zz ↔ (zzp) 2, Universal Instantiation
4. zz → (zzp) 3, df of ↔ , &-Elimination
5. (zz → (zzp)) → (zzp) Axiom of Contraction
6. zzp 4,5, Modus Ponens
7. (zzp)) → zz 3, df of ↔ , &-Elimination
8. zz 6,7, Modus Ponens
9. p 6,8, Modus Ponens

Thus we show that any arbitrary proposition is derivable in this naïve set theory. This is the infamous Curry Paradox. The existence of this paradox has led Grishen, Brady, Restall, Priest, and others to abandon the axiom of contraction ((A → (AB)) → (AB)). Brady has shown that by removing contraction, plus some other key theses, from R we obtain a logic that can accept naïve comprehension without becoming trivial (Brady 2005).

In terms of the natural deduction system, the presence of contraction corresponds to allowing premises to be used more than once. Consider the following proof:

1. A → (AB){1} Hyp
2. A{2} Hyp
3. AB{1,2} 1,2, → E
4. B{1,2} 2,3, → E
5. AB{1} 2-4, → I
6. (A → (AB)) → (AB) 1-5, → I

What enables the derivation of contraction is the fact that our subscripts are sets. We do not keep track of how many times (more than once) that a hypothesis is used in its derivation. In order to reject contraction, we need a way of counting the number of uses of hypotheses. Thus natural deduction systems for contraction-free systems use “multisets” of relevance numerals instead of sets — these are structures in which the number of occurrences of a particular numeral counts, but the order in which they occurs does not. Even weaker systems can be constructed, which keep track also of the order in which hypotheses are used (see Read 1986 and Restall 2000).

4. Applications of Relevance Logic

Apart from the motivating applications of providing better formalisms of our pre-formal notions of implication and entailment and providing a basis for naïve set theory, relevance logic has been put to various uses in philosophy and computer science. Here I will list just a few.

Dunn has developed a theory of intrinsic and essential properties based on relevant logic. This is his theory of relevant predication. Briefly put, a thing i has a property F relevantly iff ∀x(x=iF(x)). Informally, an object has a property relevantly if being that thing relevantly implies having that property. Since the truth of the consequent of a relevant implication is by itself insufficient for the truth of that implication, things can have properties irrelevantly as well as relevantly. Dunn's formulation would seem to capture at least one sense in which we use the notion of an intrinsic property. Adding modality to the language allows for a formalisation of the notion of an essential property as a property that is had both necessarily and intrinsically (see Anderson, Belnap, and Dunn 1992, §74).

Relevant logic has been used as the basis for mathematical theories other than set theory. Meyer has produced a variation of Peano arithmetic based on the logic R. Meyer gave a finitary proof that his relevant arithmetic does not have 0 = 1 as a theorem. Thus Meyer solved one of Hilbert's central problems in the context of relevant arithmetic; he showed using finitary means that relevant arithmetic is absolutely consistent. This makes relevant Peano arithmetic an extremely interesting theory. Unfortunately, as Meyer and Friedman have shown, relevant arithmetic does not contain all of the theorems of classical Peano arithmetic. Hence we cannot infer from this that classical Peano arithmetic is absolutely consistent (see Meyer and Friedman 1992).

Anderson (1967) formulated a system of deontic logic based on R and, more recently, relevance logic has been used as a basis for deontic logic by Mares (1992) and Lou Goble (1999). These systems avoid some of the standard problems with more traditional deontic logics. One problem that standard deontic logics face is that they make valid the inference from A's being a theorem to OA's being a theorem, where ‘OA’ means ‘it ought to be that A’. The reason that this problem arises is that it is now standard to treat deontic logic as a normal modal logic. On the standard semantics for modal logic, if A is valid, then it is true at all possible worlds. Moreover, OA is true at a world a if and only if A is true at every world accessible to a. Thus, if A is a valid formula, then so is OA. But it seems silly to say that every valid formula ought to be the case. Why should it be the case that either it is now raining in Ecuador or it is not? In the semantics for relevant logics, not every world makes true every valid formula. Only a special class of worlds (sometimes called “base worlds” and sometimes called “normal worlds”) make true the valid formulae. Any valid formula can fail at a world. By allowing these “non-normal worlds” in our models, we invalidate this problematic rule.

Other sorts of modal operators have been added to relevant logic as well. See, Fuhrmann (1990) for a general treatment of relevant modal logic and Wansing (2002) for a development and application of relevant epistemic logic.

Routley and Val Plumwood (1989) and Mares and André Fuhrmann (1995) present theories of counterfactual conditionals based on relevant logic. Their semantics adds to the standard Routley-Meyer semantics an accessibility relation that holds between a formula and two worlds. On Routley and Plumwood's semantics, A>B holds at a world a if and only if for all worlds b such that SAab, B holds at b. Mares and Fuhrmann's semantics is slightly more complex: A>B holds at a world a if and only if for all worlds b such that SAab, AB holds at b (also see Brady (ed.) 2002, §10 for details of both semantics). Mares (2004) presents a more complex theory of relevant conditionals that includes counterfactual conditionals. All of these theories avoid the analogues of the paradoxes of implication that appear in standard logics of counterfactuals.

Relevant logics have been used in computer science as well as in philosophy. Linear logics — a branch of logic initiated by Jean-Yves Girard — is a logic of computational resources. Linear logicians read an implication AB as saying that having a resource of type A allows us to obtain something of type B. If we have A → (AB), then, we know that we can obtain a B from two resources of type A. But this does not mean that we can get a B from a single resource of type A, i.e. we don't know whether we can obtain AB. Hence, contraction fails in linear logic. Linear logics are, in fact, relevant logics that lack contraction and the distribution of conjunction over disjunction ((A & (BC)) → ((A & B) ∨(A & C))). They also include two operators (! and ?) that are known as “exponentials”. Putting an exponential in front of a formula gives that formula the ability to act classically, so to speak. For example, just as in standard relevance logic, we cannot usually merely add an extra premise to a valid inference and have it remain valid. But we can always add a premise of the form !A to a valid inference and have it remain valid. Linear logic also has contraction for formulae of the form !A, i.e., it is a theorem of these logics that (!A → (!AB)) → (!AB) (see Troelstra 1992). The use of ! allows for the treatment of resources “that can be duplicated or ignored at will” (Restall 2000, p 56). For more about linear logic, see the entry on substructural logic.


An extremely good, although slightly out of date, bibliography on relevance logic was put together by Robert Wolff and is in Anderson, Belnap, and Dunn (1992). What follows is a brief list of introductions to and books about relevant logic and works that are referred to above.

Books on Relevance Logic and Introductions to the Field:

Other Works Cited:

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with other suggestions.]

Related Entries

logic: modal | logic: paraconsistent | logic: substructural | mathematics: inconsistent