# Paraconsistent Logic

*First published Tue Sep 24, 1996; substantive revision Fri Mar 20, 2009*

The contemporary logical orthodoxy has it that, from contradictory
premises, anything can be inferred. To be more precise, let ⊨ be
a relation of logical consequence, defined either semantically or
proof-theoretically. Call ⊨ *explosive* if it validates
{*A* , ¬*A*} ⊨ *B* for every *A*
and *B* (*ex contradictione quodlibet* (ECQ)). The
contemporary orthodoxy, i.e., classical logic, is explosive, but also
some ‘non-classical’ logics such as intuitionist logic and
most other standard logics are explosive.

The major motivation behind *paraconsistent logic* is to
challenge this orthodoxy. A logical consequence relation, ⊨, is
said to be *paraconsistent* if it is not explosive. Thus, if
⊨ is paraconsistent, then even if we are in certain
circumstances where the available information is inconsistent, the
inference relation does not explode into *triviality*. Thus,
paraconsistent logic accommodates inconsistency in a sensible manner
that treats inconsistent information as informative.

There are several reasons driving such motivation. The development of the systems of paraconsistent logic has depended on these. The prefix ‘para’ in English has two meanings: ‘quasi’ (or ‘similar to, modelled on’) or ‘beyond’. When the term ‘paraconsistent’ was coined by Miró Quesada at the Third Latin America Conference on Mathematical Logic in 1976, he seems to have had the first meaning in mind. Many paraconsistent logicians, however, have taken it to mean the second, which provided different reasons for the development of paraconsistent logic as we will see below.

This article is not meant to be a complete survey of paraconsistent logic. The modern history of paraconsistent logic maybe relatively short. Yet the development of the field has grown to the extent that a complete survey is impossible. The aim of this article is to provide some aspects and features of the field that are philosophically salient. This does not mean that paraconsistent logic has no mathematical significance or significance in such areas as computer science and linguistics. Indeed, the development of paraconsistent logic in the last two decades or so indicates that it has important applications in those areas. However, we shall tread over them lightly and focus more on the aspects that are of interest for philosophers and philosophically trained logicians.

- 1. Paraconsistency
- 2. Motivations
- 3. A Brief History of
*ex contradictione quodlibet* - 4. Modern History of Paraconsistent Logic
- 5. Systems of Paraconsistent Logic
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Paraconsistency

A logic is said to be *paraconsistent* iff its logical
consequence relation is not explosive. Paraconsistency is thus a
property of a consequence relation and of a logic. In the literature,
especially in the part of it that contains objections to
paraconsistent logic, there has been some confusion over the
definition of paraconsistency. So before going any further, we make
one clarification.

Paraconsistency, so defined, is to do with the inference relation
{*A* , ¬*A*} ⊨ *B* for every *A*
and *B* (*ex contradictione quodlibet* (ECQ)).
Dialetheism,
on the other hand, is the view that there are true contradictions. If
dialetheism is to be taken as a view that does not entail everything,
then a dialehtiest's preferred logic must better be
paraconsistent. For dialetheism is the view that *some*
contradiction is true and it does not amount to *trivialism*
which is the view that *everything*, including every
contradiction, is true.

Now, a paraconsistent logician may feel the force pulling them towards
dialetheism. Yet the view that a
consequence relation should be paraconsistent does not entail the view
that there *are* true contradictions. Paraconsistency is a
property of an inference relation whereas dialetheism is a view about
some sentences (or propositions, statements, utterances or whatever,
that can be thought of as truth-bearers). The fact that one can define
a non-explosive consequence relation does not mean that some sentences
are true. That is, the fact that one can construct a model where a
contradiction holds but not every sentence of the language holds (or,
if the model theory is given intensionally, where this is the case at
some world) does not mean that the contradiction is true *per
se*. Hence paraconsistency must be distinguished from dialetheism.

Moreover, as we will see below, many paraconsistent logics validate
the Law of Non-Contradiciton (LNC) (⊨ ¬(*A* ∧
¬*A*)) even though they invalidate ECQ. In a discussion of
paraconsistent logic, the primary focus is not the obtainability of
contradictions but the explosive nature of a consequence relation.

## 2. Motivations

The reasons for paraconsistency that have been put forward seem specific to the development of the particular formal systems of paraconsistent logic. However, there are several general reasons for thinking that logic should be paraconsistent. Before we summarise the systems of paraconsistent logic and their motivations, we present some general motivations for paraconsisent logic.

### 2.1 Inconsistent but Non-Trivial Theories

A most telling reason for paraconsistent logic is the fact that there are theories which are inconsistent but non-trivial. Once we admit the existence of such theories, their underlying logics must be paraconsistent. Examples of inconsistent but non-trivial theories are easy to produce. An example can be derived from the history of science. (In fact, many examples can be given from this area.) Consider Bohr's theory of the atom. According to this, an electron orbits the nucleus of the atom without radiating energy. However, according to Maxwell's equations, which formed an integral part of the theory, an electron which is accelerating in orbit must radiate energy. Hence Bohr's account of the behaviour of the atom was inconsistent. Yet, patently, not everything concerning the behavior of electrons was inferred from it, nor should it have been. Hence, whatever inference mechanism it was that underlay it, this must have been paraconsistent.

### 2.2 Dialetheias (True Contradictions)

Despite the fact that dialetheism and paraconsistency needs to be
distinguished, dialetheism can be a motivation for paraconsistent
logic. If there are true contradictions (dialetheias), i.e., there are
sentences, *A*, such that both *A* and ¬*A*
are true, then some inferences of the form {*A* ,
¬*A*} ⊨ *B* must fail. For only true, and not
arbitrary, conclusions follow validly from true premises. Hence logic
has to be paraconsistent. One candidate for a dialetheia is
the *liar paradox*. Consider the sentence: ‘This sentence
is not true’. There are two options: either the sentence is true
or it is not. Suppose it is true. Then what it says is the
case. Hence the sentence is not true. Suppose, on the other hand, it
is not true. This is what it says. Hence the sentence is true. In
either case it is both true and not true. (See the entry on
dialetheism
in this encyclopedia for further details.)

### 2.3 Automated Reasoning

Paraconsistent logic is motivated not only by philosophical
considerations, but also by its applications and implications. One of
the applications is *automated reasoning* (*information
processing*). Consider a computer which stores a large amount of
information. While the computer stores the information, it is also
used to operate on it, and, crucially, to infer from it. Now it is
quite common for the computer to contain inconsistent information,
because of mistakes by the data entry operators or because of multiple
sourcing. This is certainly a problem for database operations with
theorem-provers, and so has drawn much attention from computer
scientists. Techniques for removing inconsistent information have been
investigated. Yet all have limited applicability, and, in any case,
are not guaranteed to produce consistency. (There is no algorithm for
logical falsehood.) Hence, even if steps are taken to get rid of
contradictions when they are found, an underlying paraconsistent logic
is desirable if hidden contradictions are not to generate spurious
answers to queries.

### 2.4 Belief Revision

As a part of artificial intelligence research,
*belief revision*
is one of the areas that have been studied widely. Belief revision is
the study of rationally revising bodies of belief in the light of new
evidence. Notoriously, people have inconsistent beliefs. They may even
be rational in doing so. For example, there may be apparently
overwhelming evidence for both something and its negation. There may
even be cases where it is in principle impossible to eliminate such
inconsistency. For example, consider the ‘paradox of the
preface’. A rational person, after thorough research, writes a
book in which they
claim *A*_{1},…, *A*_{n}. But
they are also aware that no book of any complexity contains only
truths. So they rationally believe ¬(*A*_{1}
∧…∧ *A*_{n}) too. Hence,
principles of rational belief revision must work on inconsistent sets
of beliefs. Standard accounts of belief revision, e.g., that of
Gärdenfors *et al*., all fail to do this, since they are
based on classical logic. A more adequate account is based on a
paraconsistent logic.

### 2.5 Mathematical Significance

Another area of significance for paraconsistent logic concerns certain
mathematical theories. Examples of such theories are
formal *semantics*, *set theory*,
and *arithmetic*. The latter concerns *Gödel's
Theorem*.

#### Formal Semantics and Set Theory

Semantics is the study that aims to spell out a theoretical
understanding of meaning. Most accounts of semantics insist that to
spell out the meaning of a sentence is, in some sense, to spell out
its truth-conditions. Now, *prima facie* at least, truth is a
predicate characterised by the Tarski T-scheme:

T() ↔AA

where *A* is a sentence and * A* is its
name. But given any standard means of self-reference, e.g.,
arithmetisation, one can construct a sentence,

*B*, which says that ¬

*T*(

*). The T-scheme gives that*

**B***T*(

*) ↔ ¬*

**B***T*(

*). It then follows that*

**B***T*(

*) ∧ ¬*

**B***T*(

*). (This is, of course, just the liar paradox.)*

**B**
The situation is similar in set theory. The naive, and intuitively
correct, axioms of set theory are the *Comprehension Schema*
and *Extensionality Principle*:

∃y∀x(x∈y↔A)∀

x(x∈y↔x∈z) →y = z

where *x* does not occur free in *A*. As was discovered
by Russell, any theory that contains the Comprehension Schema is
inconsistent. For putting ‘*y* ∉ *y*’
for *A* in the Comprehension Schema and instantiating the
existential quantifier to an arbitrary such object
‘*r*’ gives:

∀y(y∈r↔y∉y)

So, instantiating the universal quantifier to ‘*r*’ gives:

r∈r↔r∉r

It then follows that *r* ∈ *r* ∧ *r* ∉ *r*.

The standard approaches to these problems of inconsistency are, by and large, ones of expedience. However, a paraconsistent approach makes it possible to have theories of truth and sethood in which the mathematically fundamental intuitions about these notions are respected. For example, as Brady (1989) has shown, contradictions may be allowed to arise in a paraconsistent set theory, but these need not infect the whole theory.

#### Arithmetic

Unlike formal semantics and set theory, there may not be any obvious
arithmetical principles that give rise to contradiction. Nonetheless,
just like the classical non-standard models of arithmetic, there is a
class of *inconsistent models of arithmetic* (or more
accurately *models of inconsistent arithmetic*) which have an
interesting and important mathematical structure.

One interesting implication of the existence of inconsistent models of
arithmetic is that some of them are finite (unlike the classical
non-standard models). This means that there are some significant
applications in the metamathematical theorems. For example, the
classical Löwenheim-Skolem theorem states that *Q*
(Robinson's arithmetic which is a fragment of Peano arithmetic) has
models of every infinite cardinality but has no finite
models. But, *Q* can be shown to have models of finite size too
by referring to the inconsistent models of arithmetic.

#### Gödel’s Theorem

It is not only the Löwenheim-Skolem theorem but also other metamathematical theorems can be given a paraconsistent treatment. In the case of other theorems, however, the negative results that are often shown by the limitative theorems of metamathematics may no longer hold. One important such theorem is Gödel’s theorem.

One version of Gödel’s first incompleteness theorem states
that for any consistent axiomatic theory of arithmetic, which can be
recognised to be sound, there will be an arithmetic truth - viz., its
Gödel sentence - not provable in it, but which can be established
as true by intuitively correct reasoning. The heart of
Gödel’s theorem is, in fact, a paradox that concerns the
sentence, *G*, ‘This sentence is not
provable’. If *G* is provable, then it is true and so not
provable. Thus *G* is proved. Hence *G* is true and so
unprovable. If an underlying paraconsistent logic is used to formalise
the arithmetic, and the theory therefore allowed to be inconsistent,
the Gödel sentence may well be provable in the theory
(essentially by the above reasoning). So a paraconsistent approach to
arithmetic overcomes the limitations of arithmetic that are supposed
(by many) to follow from Gödel’s theorem. (For other
‘limitative’ theorems of metamathematics, see Priest
2002.)

## 3. A Brief History of *ex contradictione quodlibet*

It is now standard to view *ex contradictione quodlibet* as a
valid form of inference. This contemporary view, however, should be
put in a historical perspective. It was towards the end of the 19th
century, when the study of logic achieved mathematical articulation,
that an explosive logical theory became the standard. With the work of
logicians such as Boole, Frege, Russell and Hilbert, classical logic
became the orthodox logical account.

In antiquity, however, no one seems to have endorsed the validity of
ECQ. Aristotle presented what is sometimes called the *connexive
principle*: “it is impossible that the same thing should be
necessitated by the being and by the not-being of the same
thing.” (*Prior Analytic* II 4 57b3). (See the entry on
connexive logic
that has been developed based on this principle.) This principle
became a topic of debates in the Middle Ages or Medieval time. Though
the medieval debates seem to have been carried out in the context of
conditionals, we can also see it as debates about consequences. The
principle was taken up by
Boethius
(480–524 or 525) and
Abelard
(1079–1142), who considered two accounts of consequences. The
first one is a familiar one: it is impossible for the premises to be
true but conclusion false. The first account is thus similar to the
contemporary notion of truth-preservation. The second one is less
accepted recently: the sense of the premises contains that of the
conclusion. This account, as in relevant logics, does not permit an
inference whose conclusion is arbitrary. Abelard held that the first
account fails to meet the connexive principle and that the second
account (the account of containment) captured Aristotle's principle.

Abelard's position was shown to face a difficulty by Alberic of Paris in the 1130s. Most medieval logicians didn’t, however, abandon the account of validity based on containment or something similar. (See, for example, Martin 1987.) But one way to handle the difficulty is to reject the connexive principle. This approach, which has become most influential, was accepted by the followers of Adam Balsham or Parvipontanus (or sometimes known as Adam of The Little Bridge) (12th CE). The Parvipontanians embraced the truth-preservation account of consequences and the ‘paradoxes’ that are associated with it. In fact, it was a member of the Parvipontanians, William of Soissons, who discovered in the 12th century what we now call the C.I. Lewis (independent) argument for ECQ. (See Martin 1986.)

The containment account, however, did not
disappear.
John Duns Scotus
(1266–1308) and his followers accepted the containment
account (see Martin 1996). The Cologne School of the late 15th
century argued against ECQ by rejecting *disjunctive
syllogism* (see Sylvan 2000).

Now, the history of logic in the ‘East’, or more
specifically Asia, is moot. There is a tendency, for example, in Jaina
and Buddhist traditions to consider the possibility of statements
being both true and false. Moreover, the logics developed by the major
Buddhist logicians, Dignāga (5th century) and Dharmakīrti
(7th century) do not embrace ECQ. Their logical account is, in fact,
based on the ‘pervasion’ (Skt: *vyāpti*,
Tib: *khyab pa*) relation among the elements of an
argument. Just like the containment account of Abelard, there must be
a tighter connection between the premises and conclusion than the
truth-preservation account allows. (For the logic of Dharmakīrti
and its subsequent development, see for example Dunne 2004 and
Tillemans 1999.)

## 4. Modern History of Paraconsistent Logic

In the 20th century, the idea of challenging the explosive orthodoxy
occurred to different people at different times and places
independently of each other. They were often motivated by different
considerations. The earliest paraconsistent logics in the contemporary
era seem to have been given by two Russians. Starting about 1910,
Vasil’év proposed a modified Aristotelian syllogistic
including statements of the form: *S* is both *P* and
not *P*. In 1929, Orlov gave the first axiomatisation of the
relevant logic *R* which is paraconsistent. (On
Vasil’év, see Arruda 1977 and Arruda 1989, pp. 102f. On Orlov, see Anderson, Belnap
and Dunn 1992, p. xvii.)

The work of Vasil’év or Orlov did not make any impact at the time. The first (formal) logician to have developed paraconsistent logic was the Polish logician, Jaśkowski, who was a student of Łukasiewicz, who envisaged paraconsistent logic in his critique of Aristotle on LNC (Łukasiewicz 1951).

Paraconsistent logics were also developed in South America by Asenjo (1954) and da Costa (1963) in their doctoral dissertations. Since then, an active group of logicians has been working on paraconsistent logic in Brazil, especially in Campinas and in São Paulo.

Paraconsistent logics in the forms of relevant logics were proposed in England by Smiley in 1959 and also at about the same time, in a much more developed form, in the USA by Anderson and Belnap. An active group of relevant logicians grew up in Pittsburgh including Dunn and Meyer. The development of paraconsistent logics (in the form of relevant logics) was transported to Australia. R. Routley (later Sylvan) and V. Routley (later Plumwood) discovered an intentional semantics for some of Anderson/Belnap relevant logics. A school developed around them in Canberra which included Brady and Mortensen, and later Priest who, together with R. Routley, incorporated dialetheism to the development.

By the mid-1970s, the development of paraconsistent logic became international. In Belgium, a group of logicians around Batens in Ghent grew up and remains active. Paraconsistent logic is also actively investigated in Canada by Jennings, Schotch and their student Brown. In 1997, the First World Congress on Paraconsistency was held at the University of Ghent in Belgium. The Second World Congress was held in São Sebastião (São Paulo, Brazil) in 2000, the Third in Toulous (France) in 2003 and the Fourth in Melbourne (Australia) in 2008. We now see logicians working on paraconsistent logic in Bulgaria, China, France, Germany, Italy, Japan, New Zealand to name just a few.

## 5. Systems of Paraconsistent Logic

A number of formal techniques to invalidate ECQ have been devised. Most of the techniques have been summarised elsewhere, for example Brown 2002 and Priest 2002. As the interest in paraconsistent logic grew, different techniques developed in different parts of the world. As a result, the development of the techniques has somewhat a regional flavour (though there are, of course, exceptions, and the regional differences can be over-exagerated). (See Tanaka 2003.)

Most paraconsistent logicians do not propose a wholesale rejection of classical logic. They usually accept the validity of classical inferences in consistent contexts. It is the need to isolate an inconsistency without spreading everywhere that motivates the rejection of ECQ. Depending on how much revision one thinks is needed, we have a technique for paraconsistency. The taxonomy given here is based on the degree of revision to classical logic. Since the logical novelty can be seen at the propositional level, we will concentrate on the propositional paraconsistent logics.

### 5.1 Discussive Logic

The first formal paraconsistent logic to have been developed
was *discussive* (or *discursive*) *logic* by the
Polish logician Jaśkowski (1948). The thought behind discussive
logic is that, in a discourse, each participant puts forward some
information, beliefs or opinions. Each assertion is true according to
the participant who puts it forward in a discourse. But what is true
in a discourse on whole is the sum of assertions put forward by
participants. Each participant's opinions may be self-consistent, yet
may be inconsistent with those of others. Jaśkowski formalised
this idea in the form of discussive logic.

A formalisation of discussive logic is by means of modelling a
discourse in a modal logic. For simplicity, Jaśkowski
chose *S5*. We think of each participant’s belief set as the
set of sentences true at a world in a *S5*
model *M*. Thus, a sentence *A* asserted by a
participant in a discourse is interpreted as “it is possible
that *A*” (◊*A*). That is, a
sentence *A* of discussive logic can be translated into a
sentence ◊*A* of *S5*. Then *A* holds in a
discourse iff *A* is true at some world
in *M*. Since *A* may hold in one world but not in
another, both *A* and ¬*A* may hold in a
discourse. Indeed, one should expect that participants disagree on
some issue in a rational discourse.

To be more precise, let *d* be a translation function from a
formula of discussive logic into a formula of *S5*. Then
(*p*)^{d} = ◊*p*. For complex
formulas

(¬A)^{d}= ¬(A^{d})

(A∨B)^{d}=A^{d}∨B^{d}

(A∧B)^{d}=A^{d}∧B^{d}

(A⊃B)^{d}=A^{d}⊃B^{d}

(A≡B)^{d}=A^{d}≡B^{d}

It is easy to show that *B* is a discussive consequence
of *A*_{1}, …, *A*_{n} iff
the formula ◊*A*_{1}^{d} ⊃
(… ⊃ (◊*A*_{n}^{d}
⊃ ◊*B*^{d})…) is a theorem
of *S5*.

To see that discussive logic is paraconsistent, consider a *S5*
model, *M*, such that *A* holds
at *w _{1}*,

*¬A*holds at a different world

*w*but

_{2}*B*does not hold at any world for some

*B*. Then both

*A*and ¬

*A*hold, yet

*B*does not hold in

*M*. Hence discussive logic invalidates ECQ.

However, there is no *S5* model where *A* ∧
¬*A* holds at some world. So an inference of the form
{*A * ∧ ¬*A*} ⊨ *B* is valid in
discussive logic. This means that, in discussive
logic, *adjunction* ({*A*, ¬*A*}
⊨ *A* ∧ ¬*A*) fails. But one can define a discussive conjunction, ∧_{d},
as *A* ∧ ◊*B* (or ◊*A*
∧ *B*). Then adjunction holds for
∧_{d} (Jaśkowski 1949).

One difficulty is a formulation of a conditional. In *S5*, the
inference from ◊*p* and ◊(*p* ⊃ *q*)
to ◊*q* fails. Jaśkowski chose to introduce a
connective which he called *discussive implication*,
⊃_{d}, defined as ◊*A* ⊃ *B*. This
connective can be understood to mean that “if some participant
states that *A*, then *B*”. As the inference from
◊*A* ⊃ *B* and ◊*A* to
◊*B* is valid in *S5*, *modus ponens* for
⊃_{d} holds in discussive logic. A discussive
bi-implication, ≡_{d}, can also be defined as
(◊*A* ⊃ *B*) ∧ ◊(◊*A*
⊃ *B*) (or ◊(◊*A* ⊃ *B*) ∧
(◊*A* ⊃ *B*)).

### 5.2 Non-Adjunctive Systems

A non-adjunctive system is a system that does not validate adjunction
(i.e., {*A*, *B*} ⊭ *A*
∧ *B*). As we saw above, discussive logic without a
discussive conjunction is non-adjunctive. Another non-adjunctive
strategy was suggested by Rescher and Manor 1970-71. In effect, we
can conjoin premises, but only up to maximal
consistency. Specifically, if Σ is a set of premises, a
maximally consistent subset is any consistent subset Σ′
such that if *A* ∈ Σ − Σ′ then
Σ′ ∪ {*A*} is inconsistent. Then we say
that *A* is a consequence of Σ iff *A* is a
classical consequence of Σ′ for some maximally consistent
subset Σ′. Then {*p*, *q*}
⊨ *p* ∧ *q* but {*p*, ¬*p*}
⊭ *p* ∧ ¬*p*.

### 5.3 Preservationism

In the non-adjunctive system of Rescher and Manor, a consequence
relation is defined over some maximally consistent subset of the
premises. This can be seen as a way to ‘measure’
the *level* of consistency in the premise set. The level of
{*p*, *q*} is 1 since the maximally consistent subset is
the set itself. The level of {*p*, ¬*p*}, however,
is 2: {*p*} and {¬*p*}.

If we define a consequence relation over some maximally consistent
subset, then the relation can be thought of as preserving the level of
consistent fragments. This is the approach which has come to be
called *preservationism*. It was first developed by the
Canadian logicians Ray Jennings and Peter Scotch.

To be more precise, a (finite) set of formulas, Σ, can be
partitioned into classically consistent fragments whose union is
Σ. Let ⊢ be the classical consequence
relation. A *covering* of Σ is a set
{Σ_{i} : *i* ∈ *I*}, where
each member is consistent, and Σ
= ∪_{i ∈ I}
Σ_{i}. The *level* of
Σ, *l*(Σ), is the least *n* such that
Σ can be partitioned into *n* sets if there is
such *n*, or ∞ if there is no such *n*. A
consequence relation, called *forcing*, [⊢, is defined as
follows. Σ [⊢ *A* iff *l*(Σ) =
∞, or *l*(Σ) = *n* and for every covering of
size *n* there is a *j* ∈ *I* such that
Σ_{j}
⊢ *A*. If *l*(Σ) = 1 or ∞ then the
forcing relation coincides with classical consequence relation. In
case where *l*(Σ) = ∞, there must be a sentence of
the form *A* ∧ ¬*A* and so the forcing relation
explodes.

A chunking strategy has also been applied to capture the inferential
mechanism underlying some theories in science and mathematics. In
mathematics, the best available theory concerning infinitesimals was
inconsistent. In the infinitesimal calculus of Leibniz and Newton, in
the calculation of a derivative infinitesimals had to be both zero and
non-zero. In order to capture the inference mechanism underlying the
infinitesimal calculus of Leibniz and Newton (and Bohr’s theory of the
atom), we need to add to the chunking a mechanism that allows a
limited amount of information to flow between the consistent fragments
of these inconsistent but non-trivial theories. That is, certain
information from one chunk may permeate into other chunks. The
inference procedure underlying the theories must be *Chunk and
Permeate*.

Let *C* = {Σ_{i} : *i*
∈ *I*} and ρ a permeability relation on *C*
such that ρ is a map from *I* × *I* to subsets
of formulas of the language. If *i*_{0}
∈ *I*, then any structure ⟨*C*,
ρ, *i*_{0}⟩ is called a C&P structure on
Σ. If
B
is a C&P structure on Σ, we define
the C&P consequences of Σ with respect to
B,
as follows. For each *i* ∈ Σ, a set of
sentences,
Σ_{i}^{n} ,
is defined by recursion on *n*:

That is, Σ_{i}^{n+1}
comprises the consequences from
Σ_{i}^{n}
together with the information that permeates into chunk *i*
from the other chunk at level *n*. We then collect up all
finite stages:

The C&P consequences of Σ can be defined in terms of the
sentences that can be inferred in the designated
chunk *i*_{0} when all appropriate information has been
allowed to flow along the permeability relations. (See Brown and
Priest 2004.)

### 5.4 Adaptive Logics

One may think not only that an inconsistency needs to be isolated but
also that a serious need for the consideration of inconsistencies is a
rare occurrence. The thought may be that consistency is the norm until
proven otherwise: we should treat a sentence or a theory as
consistently as possible. This is essentially the motivation
for *adaptive logics*, pioneered by Diderik Batens in Belgium.

An adaptive logic is a logic that adapts itself to the situation at
the time of application of inference rules. It models the dynamics of
our reasoning. There are two senses in which reasoning is dynamic:
external and internal. Reasoning is *externally* dynamic if as
new information becomes available expanding the premise set,
consequences inferred previously may have to be withdrawn. The
external dynamics is thus the *non-monotonic* character of some
consequence relations: Γ ⊢ *A* and Γ ∪
Δ ⊬ *A* for some Γ, Δ
and *A*. However, even if the premise-set remains constant,
some previously inferred conclusion may considered as not derivable at
a later stage. As our reasoning proceeds from a premise set, we may
encounter a situation where we infer a consequence provided that no
abnormality, in particular no contradiction, obtains at some stage of
the reasoning process. If we are forced to infer a contradiction at a
later stage, our reasoning has to adapt itself so that an application
of the previously used inference rule is withdrawn. In such a case,
reasoning is *internally* dynamic. Our reasoning may be
internally dynamic if the set of valid inferences is not recursively
enumerable (i.e., there is no decision procedure that leads to
‘yes’ after finitely many steps if the inference is indeed
valid). It is the internal dynamics that adaptive logics are devised
to capture.

In order to illustrate the idea behind adaptive logics, consider the
premise set Γ = {*p*, *q*, ¬*p*
∨ *r*, ¬*r* ∨ *s*,
¬*s*}. One may start reasoning with *p* and
¬*p* ∨ *r*. Provided that *p* ∧
¬*p* does not obtain at some stage in the reasoning
process, DS can be applied to derive *r*. Now, we can apply DS
to ¬*r* ∨ *s* and *r* to derive *s*
provided that *s* ∧ ¬*s* does not
obtain. However, by conjoining *s* and ¬*s*, we can
obtain *s* ∧ ¬*s*. Hence we must withdraw
the *application* of DS to ¬*r* ∨ *s*
and *r* so that *s* would not be a consequence of this
reasoning process. A consequence of this reasoning is what cannot be
defeated at any stage of the process.

A system of adaptive logic can generally be characterised as consisting of three elements:

- A lower limit logic (LLL)
- A set of abnormalities
- An adaptive strategy

LLL is the part of an adaptive logic that is not subject to
adaptation. It consists essentially of a number of inferential rules
(and/or axioms) that one is happy to accept regardless of the
situation in a reasoning process. A set of abnormalities is a set of
formulas that are presupposed as not holding (or as absurd) at the
beginning of reasoning until they are shown to be otherwise. For many
adaptive logics, a formula in this set is of the form *A* ∧
¬*A*. An adaptive strategy specifies a strategy of handling
the applications of inference rules based on the set of
abnormalities. If LLL is extended with the requirement that no
abnormality is logically possible, one obtains the upper limit logic
(ULL). ULL essentially contains not only the inferential rules (and/or
axioms) of LLL but also supplementary rules (and/or axioms) that can
be applied in the absence of abnormality, such as DS. By specifying
these three elements, one obtains a system of adaptive logic.

### 5.5 Logics of Formal Inconsistency

The approaches taken for motivating the systems of paraconsistent
logic which we have so far seen isolate inconsistency from consistent
parts of the given theory. The aim is to retain as much classical
machinery as possible in developing a system of paraconsistent logic
which, nonetheless, avoids explosion when faced with a
contradiction. One way to make this aim explicit is to extend the
expressive power of our language by encoding the metatheoretical
notions of consistency (and inconsistency) in the object
language. The *Logics of Formal Inconsistency* (*LFIs*)
are a family of paraconsistent logics that constitute consistent
fragments of classical logic yet which reject explosion principle
where a contradiction is present. The investigation of this family of
logics was initiated by Newton da Costa in Brazil.

An effect of encoding consistency (and inconsistency) in the object language is that we can explicitly separate inconsistency from triviality. With a language rich enough to express inconsistency (and consistency), we can study inconsistent theories without assuming that they are necessarily trivial. This makes it explicit that the presence of a contradiction is a separate issue from the non-trivial nature of paraconsistent inferences.

The thought behind *LFIs* is that we should respect classical
logic as much as possible. It is only when there is a contradiction
that logic should deviate from it. This means that we can admit the
validity of ECQ in the absence of contradictions. In order to do so,
we encode ‘consistency’ into our object language by
. Then ⊢ is a consequence
relation of an *LFI* iff

- ∃Γ∃
*A*∃*B*(Γ,*A*, ¬*A*⊬*B*) and - ∀Γ∀
*A*∀*B*(Γ,*A*,*A*, ¬*A*⊢*B*).

Let ⊢_{C} be the classical consequence (or
derivability) relation and
(Γ)
express the consistency of the set of formulas Γ such that if
*A* and
*B* then
(*A* *
*B*) where * is any two place logical
connective. Then we can capture derivability in the consistent context
in terms of the equivalence:
∀Γ∀*B*∃Δ(Γ
⊢_{C} *B* iff
(Δ), Γ ⊢ *B*).

Now take the positive fragment of classical logic with *modus
ponens* plus double negation elimination (¬¬*A*
→ *A*) as an axiom and some axioms governing
:

A→ (A→ (¬A→B))

(A∧B) → (A∧B)

(A∧B) → (A→B)

Then ⊢ provides da Costa’s system *C _{1}*. If
we let

*A*

^{1}abbreviate the formula ¬(

*A*∧ ¬

*A*) and

*A*

^{n+1}the formula (¬(

*A*∧ ¬

^{n}*A*))

^{n}^{1}, then we obtain

*C*for each natural number

_{i}*i*greater than 1.

To obtain da Costa’s system *C _{ω}*, instead of
the positive fragment of classical logic, we start with positive
intuitionist logic instead.

*C*systems for finite

_{i}*i*do not rule out (

*A*∧ ¬

^{n}*A*∧

^{n}*A*

^{n+1}) from holding in a theory. By going up the hierarchy to ω,

*C*rules out this possibility. Note, however, that

_{ω}*C*is not a

_{ω}*LFC*as it does not contain classical positive logic.

For the semantics for da Costa’s *C*-systems, see for example
da Costa and Alves 1977 and Loparic 1977.

### 5.6 Many-Valued Logics

Perhaps the simplest way of generating a paraconsistent logic, first
proposed by Asenjo in his PhD dissertation, is to use a many-valued
logic. Classically, there are exactly two truth values. The
many-valued approach is to drop this classical assumption and allow
more than two truth values. The simplest strategy is to use three
truth values: *true (only)*, *false (only)* and *both
(true and false)* for the evaluations of formulas. The truth
tables for logical connectives, except conditional, can be given as
follows:

¬ tfbbft

∧ tbfttbfbbbfffff

∨ tbfttttbtbbftbf

These tables are essentially those of Kleene’s and Łukasiewicz’s
three valued logics where the middle value is thought of
as *indeterminate* or *neither (true nor false)*.

For a conditional ⊃, following Kleene’s three valued logic, we might specify a truth table as follows:

⊃ tbfttbfbtbbfttt

Let *t* and *b* be the *designated* values. These
are the values that are preserved in valid inferences. If we define a
consequence relation in terms of preservation of these designated
values, then we have the paraconsistent logic *LP* of Priest
1979. In *LP*, ECQ is invalid. To see this, we
assign *b* to *p* and *f* to *q*. Then
¬*p* is also evaluated as *b* and so both *p*
and ¬*p* are designated. Yet *q* is not evaluated as
having a designated value. Hence ECQ is invalid in *LP*.

As we can see, *LP* invalidates ECQ by assigning a designated
value, *both true and false*, to a
contradiction. Thus, *LP* departs from classical logic more so
than the systems that we have seen previously. But, more
controversially, it is also naturally aligned with
dialetheism. However, we can interpret truth values not in an aletheic
sense but in an epistemic sense: truth values (or designated values)
express epistemic or doxastic commitments. (See for example Belnap
1992.) Or we might think that the value *both* is needed for a
semantic reason: we might be required to express the contradictory
nature of some of our beliefs, assertions and so on. (See Dunn 1976,
p. 157.) If these interpretative strategy is successful, we can
separate *LP* from necessarily falling under dialetheism.

One feature of *LP* which requires some attention is that
in *LP* *modus ponens* comes out to be invalid. For
if *p* is both true and false but *q* false (only),
then *p* ⊃ *q* is both true and false and hence is
designated. So both *p* and *p* ⊃ *q* are
designated, yet the conclusion *q* is not. Hence *modus
ponens* for ⊃ is invalid in *LP*. (One way to rectify
the problem is to add an appropriate conditional connective as we will
see in the section on relevant logics.)

Another way to develop a many-valued paraconsistent logic is to think
of an assignment of a truth value not as a function but as
a *relation*. Let *P* be the set of propositional
parameters. Then an evaluation, *η*, is a subset
of *P* × {0, 1}. A proposition may only relate to 1
(true), it may only relate to 0 (false), it may relate to both 1 and 0
or it may relate to neither 1 nor 0. The evaluation is extended to a
relation for all formulas by the following recursive clauses:

¬

Aη1 iffAη0

¬Aη0 iffAη1

A∧Bη1 iffAη1 andBη1

A∧Bη0 iffAη0 orBη0

A∨Bη1 iffAη1 orBη1

A∨Bη0 iffAη0 andBη0

If we define validity in terms of truth preservation under all
relational evaluations then we obtain *First Degree Entailment*
(*FDE*) which is a fragment of relevant logics. These
relational semantics for *FDE* are due to Dunn 1976.

### 5.7 Relevant Logics

The approaches to paraconsistency we have examined above all focus on
the inevitable presence or the truth of some contradictions. A
rejection of ECQ, in these approaches, depends on an analysis of the
premises containing a contradiction. One might think that the real
problem with ECQ is not to do with the contradictory premises but to
do with the lack of connection between the premises and the
conclusion. The thought is that the conclusion must
be *relevant* to the premises in a valid inference.

Relevant logics were pioneered in order to study the relevance of the conclusion with respect to the premises by Anderson and Belnap (1975) in Pittsburgh. Anderson and Belnap motivated the development of relevant logics using natural deduction systems; yet they developed a family of relevant logics in axiomatic systems. As development proceeded and was carried out also in Australia, more focus was given to the semantics.

The semantics for relevant logics were developed by Fine (1974),
Routley and Routley (1972), Routley and Meyer (1993) and Urquhart
(1972). (There are also algebraic semantics. See for example Dunn and
Restall 2002, pp. 48ff.) In the Routleys-Meyer semantics, based on
possible-world semantics (which is the most studied semantics for
relevant logics, especially in Australia), conjunction and disjunction
behave in the usual way. But each world, *w*, has an associate
world, *w**, and negation is evaluated in terms of *w**:
¬*A* is true at *w* iff *A* is false, not
at *w*, but at *w**. Thus, if *A* is true
at *w*, but false at *w**, then *A* ∧
¬*A* is true at *w*. To obtain the standard relevant
logics, one needs to add the constraint that *w***
= *w*. As is clear, negation in these semantics is an
intensional operator.

The primary concern with relevant logics is not so much with negation
as with a conditional connective → (satisfying *modus
ponens*). In relevant logics, if *A* → *B* is
a logical truth, then *A* is relevant to *B*, in the
sense that *A* and *B* share at least one propositional
variable.

Semantics for the relevant conditional are obtained by furnishing each
Routleys-Meyer model with a *ternary* relation. In the
simplified semantics of Priest and Sylvan 1992 and Restall 1993
and 1995, worlds are divided into normal and
non-normal. If *w* is a normal world, *A*
→ *B* is true at *w* iff at all worlds
where *A* is true, *B* is true. If *w* is
non-normal, *A* → *B* is true at *w* iff for
all *x*, *y*, such that *Rwxy*, if *A* is
true at *x*, *B* is true at *y*. If *B* is
true at *x* but not at *y* where *Rwxy*,
then *B* → *B* is not true at *w*. Then one
can show that *A* → (*B* → *B*) is not
a logical truth. (Validity is defined as truth preservation
over *normal* worlds.) This gives the basic relevant
logic, *B*. Stronger logics, such as the logic *R*, are
obtained by adding constraints on the ternary relation.

There are also versions of world-semantics for relevant logics based
on Dunn’s relational semantics for *FDE*. Then negation is
extensional. A conditional connective, now needs to be given both
truth and falsity conditions. So we have: *A* → *B*
is true at *w* iff for all *x*, *y*, such
that *Rwxy*, if *A* is true at *x*, *B* is
true at *y*; and *A* → *B* is false
at *w* iff for some *x*, *y*, such
that *Rwxy*, if *A* is true at *x*, *B* is
false at *y*. Adding various constraints on the ternary
relation provides stronger logics. However, these logics are not the
standard relevant logics developed by Anderson and Belnap. To obtain
the standard family of relevant logics, one needs neighbourhood
frames. (See Mares 2004.) Further details
concerning relevant logics can be
found in the article on that topic in this encyclopedia.

## Bibliography

### For Paraconsistency in general:

- Priest, G., Routley, R., and Norman, J. (eds.)
(1989).
*Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent*, München: Philosophia Verlag. - Priest, G. (2002). “Paraconsistent Logic”,
*Handbook of Philosophical Logic*(Second Edition), Vol. 6, D. Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 287-393.

### For Inconsistent but Non-Trivial Theories

- Brown, B. and G. Priest. (2004). “Chunk and Permeate: A
Paraconsistent Inference Strategy. Part 1: The Infinitesimal
Calculus”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 33: 379-388.

### On Dialetheism

- Priest, G. (1987).
*In Contradiction: A Study of the Transconsistent*, Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff; second edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006. - Priest, G., J.C. Beall and B. Armour-Garb (eds.) (2004).
*The Law of Non-Contradiction*, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

### For Automated Reasoning

- Belnap, N.D., Jr. (1992). “A Useful Four-valued Logic: How a
computer should think”,
*Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and Necessity*, Volume II, A.R. Anderson, N.D. Belnap, Jr, and J.M. Dunn, Princeton: Princeton University Press; first appeared as “A Usuful Four-valued Logic”,*Modern Use of Multiple-valued Logic*, J.M. Dunn and G. Epstein (eds.), Dordrecht: D. Reidel, 1977, and “How a Computer Should Think”,*Comtemporary Aspects of Philosophy*, G. Ryle (ed.), Oriel Press, 1977. - Besnard, P. and Hunter, A. (eds.) (1998).
*Handbook of Deasible Reasoning and Uncertainty Management Systems*, Volume 2,*Reasoning with Actual and Potential Contradictions*, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers.

### For Belief Revision

- Priest, G. (2001). “Paraconsistent Belief
Revision”,
*Theoria*, 67: 214-228. - Restall, G. and Slaney, J. (1995). “Realistic Belief
Revision”,
*Proceedings of the Second World Conference in the Fundamentals of Artificial Intelligence*, M. De Glas and Z. Pawlak (eds.), Paris: Angkor, pp. 367-378. - Tanaka, K. (2005). “The AGM Theory and Inconsistent Belief
Change”,
*Logique et Analyse*, 48: 113-150.

### For Mathematical Significance

- Brady, R.T. (1989). “The Non-Triviality of Dialectical Set
Theory”,
*Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent*, G. Priest, R. Routley and J. Norman (eds.), München: Philosophia Verlag, pp. 437-471. - Mortensen, C. (1995).
*Inconsistent Mathematics*, Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers. - Priest, G. (2003). “Inconsistent Arithmetic: Issues
Technical and Philosophical”, in
*Trends in Logic: 50 Years of Studia Logica*(Studia Logica Library, Volume 21), V. F. Hendricks and J. Malinowski (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 273-99.

### For a History of *ex contradictione quodlibet*

- Sylvan, R. (2000). “A Preliminary Western History of
Sociative Logics”,
*Sociative Logics and Their Applications: Essays by the late Richard Sylvan*, D. Hyde and G. Priest (eds.), Aldershot: Ashgate Publishers.

### For Modern History of Paraconsistent Logic

- Arruda, A. (1989). “Aspects of the Historical Development of
Paraconsistent Logic”,
*Paraconsistent Logic: Essays on the Inconsistent*, G. Priest, R. Routley and J. Norman (eds.), München: Philosophia Verlag, pp. 99-130. - Priest, G. (2007). “Paraconsistency and Dialetheism”,
in
*Handbook of the History of Logic*, Volume 8, D. Gabbay and J. Woods (eds.), Amsterdam: North Holland, pp. 129-204.

### For the Systems of Paraconsistent Logic in general

- Brown, B. (2002). “On Paraconsistency”, in
*A Companion to Philosophical Logic*, Dale Jacquette (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 628-650.

### For Discussive Logic

- Jaśkowski, S. (1948). “Rachunek zdań dla
systemów dedukcyjnych sprzecznych”,
*Studia Societatis Scientiarun Torunesis*(Sectio A), 1 (5): 55-77; an English translation appeared as “Propositional Calculus for Contradictory Deductive Systems”,*Studia Logica*, 24 (1969): 143-157. - Jaśkowski, S. (1949). “O koniunkcji dyskusyjnej w
rachunku zdań dla systemów dedukcyjnych
sprzecznych”,
*Studia Societatis Scientiarum Torunensis*(Sectio A), 1 (8): 171-172; an English translation appeared as “On the Discussive Conjunction in the Propositional Calculus for Inconsistent Deductive Systems”,*Logic and Logical Philosophy*, 7 (1999): 57-59. - da Costa, N.C.A. and Dubikajtis, L. (1977). “On
Jaśkowski’s Discussive Logic”, in
*Non-Classical Logics, Modal Theory and Computability*, A.I. Arruda, N.C.A. da Costa and R. Chuaqui (eds.), Amsterdam: North-Holland Publishing Company, pp. 37-56.

### For Non-Adjunctive Systems

- Rescher, N. and R. Manor (1970-71). “On Inference from
Inconsistent Premises”,
*Theory and Decision*, 1: 179-217.

### For Preservationism

- Schotch, P.K. and R.E. Jennings (1980). “Inference and
Necessity”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 9: 327-340.

### For Adaptive Logics

- Batens, D. (2001). “A General Characterization of Adaptive
Logics”,
*Logique et Analyse*, 173-175: 45-68. - Batens, D. (2007). “A Universal Logic Approach to Adaptive
Logics",
*Logica Universalis*, 1: 221-242.

### For Logics of Formal Inconsistency

- Carnielli, W.A., M.E. Coniglio and J. Marcos (2007). “Logics
of Formal Inconsistency”,
*Handbook of Philosophical Logic*, Volume 14 (Second Edition), D. Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.), Berlin: Springer, pp. 15-107. - da Costa, N.C.A. (1974). “On the Theory of Inconsistent
Formal Systems”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 15 (4): 497-510.

### For Many-Valued Logics

- Asenjo, F.G. (1966). “A Calculus of
Antinomies”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 7: 103-5. - Dunn, J.M. (1976). “Intuitive Semantics for First Degree
Entailment and Coupled Trees”,
*Philosophicl Studies*, 29: 149-68. - Priest, G. (1979). “Logic of Paradox”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 8: 219-241.

### For Relevant Logics

- Anderson, A. and N. Belnap. (1975).
*Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and Necessity*, Volume 1, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Anderson, A., N. Belnap and J.M. Dunn. (1992).
*Entailment: The Logic of Relevance and Necessity*, Volume 2, Princeton: Princeton University Press. - Dunn, J.M. and G. Restall (2002). “Relevance
Logic”,
*Handbook of Philosophical Logic*, Volume 6, second edition, D. Gabbay and F. Guenthner (eds.), Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic Publishers, pp. 1-136. - Routley, R., Plumwood, V., Meyer, R.K., and Brady,
R.T. (1982).
*Relevant Logics and Their Rivals*, Volume 1, Ridgeview: Atascadero. - Brady, R.T. (ed.) (2003).
*Relevant Logics and Their Rivals*, Volume 2, Aldershot: Ashgate.

### Other Works Cited

- Arruda, A. (1977). “On the Imaginary Logic of
N.A. Vasil’év”, in
*Non-Classicl Logic, Model Theory and Cpmputability*, A. Arruda, N, da Costa and R. Chuanqui (eds.), Amsterdam: North Holland, pp. 3-24. - da Costa, N.C.A. and E.H. Alves (1977). “Semantical Analysis
of the Calculi Cn”,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 18 (4): 621-630. - Dunne, J.D. (2004).
*Foundations of Dharmakīrti’s Philosophy*, Boston: Wisdom Publications. - Fine, K. (1974). “Models for Entailment”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 3: 347-372. - Loparic, A. (1977). “Une etude semantique de quelques
calculs propositionnels”,
*Comptes Rendus Hebdomadaires des Seances de l’Academie des Sciences*, 284: 835-838. - Łukasiewicz, J. (1951).
*Atistotle’s Syllogistic: From the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. - Mares, E. (2004). “‘Four-Valued’ Semantics for
the Relevant Logic R”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 33: 327-341. - Martin, C. (1986). “William’s Machine”,
*Journal of Philosophy*, 83: 564-572. - Martin, C. (1987). “Embarrassing Arguments and Surprising
Conclusions in the Development Theories of the Conditional in the
Twelfth Century”,
*Gilbert De Poitiers Et Ses Contemporains*, J. Jolivet, A. De Libera (eds.), Naples: Bibliopolis, pp. 377-401. - Martin, C. (1996). “Impossible Positio as the Foundation of
Metaphysics or, Logic on the Scotist Plan?”,
*Vestigia, Imagines, Verba: Semiotics and Logic in Medieval Theological Texts*, C. Marmo (ed.), Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 255-276. - Priest, G. and R. Sylvan (1992). “Simplified Semantics for
Basic Relevant Logics”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 21: 217-232. - Restall, G. (1993). “Simplified Semantics for Relevant
Logics (and some of their rivals)”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 22: 481-511. - Restall, G. (1995). “Four-Valued Semantics for Relevant
Logics (and some of their rivals)”,
*Journal of Philosophical Logic*, 24: 139-160. - Routley, R. and R. Meyer (1993). “Semantics of
Entailment”,
*Truth, Syntax and Modality*, H. Leblanc (ed.), Amsterdam: North Holland, pp. 194-243. - Routley, R. and V. Routley (1972). “Semantics of First Degree
Entailment”,
*Noûs*, 3: 335-359. - Tanaka, K. (2003). “Three Schools of
Paraconsistency”,
*The Australasian Journal of Logic*, 1: 28-42. - Tillemans, Tom J.F. (1999).
*Scripture, Logic, Language: Essays on Dharmakīrti and His Tibetan Successors*, Boston: Wisdom Publications. - Urquhart, A. (1972). “Semantics for Relevant
Logics”,
*Journal of Symbolic Logic*, 37: 159-169.

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## Related Entries

dialetheism [dialethism] | logic: many-valued | logic: relevance | logic: substructural | mathematics: inconsistent | Sorites paradox