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Salomon Maimon

First published Mon Jan 28, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jul 3, 2007

Salomon Maimon (1753–1800), the man whom Kant described as the sharpest of his critics, stands as one of the most acute and complicated thinkers — and certainly one of the most fascinating personalities — of the 1780s and 1790s. By granting the principle of sufficient reason unlimited validity Maimon embraces a radical form of rationalism. His robust criteria for the validity of knowledge suggests that even Kant's attempt to limit epistemological claims to the realm of possible experience cannot be secured without a substantial ontological commitment. Kant faces a severe choice: either adopt elements from the dogmatic metaphysics he set out to challenge, or accept that his system is undermined by skepticism. In revealing what he sees as the skeptical implications of rationalism, Maimon raises important objections to Kant's critical idealism, as well as develops deep insights into the problems of experience and givenness. His ‘skeptically rationalist’ claims about the nature and limits of human cognition present a distinctive perspective on the Kantian project of transcendental idealism, as well as on central epistemological issues concerning the relation between thought and the world. The eminent German scholar, Manfred Frank recently suggested that Maimon is the "last great philosopher" about to be discovered.

1. Intellectual Biography

Scholars of Wisdom have no rest in this world or in the world to come.”

This Talmudic saying, with which Maimon concludes his first philosophical work, applies strikingly well to the life story of Salomon Maimon. Maimon was born in 1753 in Suchowyborg, a village next to the town of Mir in Lithuania. His family, which originally was rather wealthy, fell into poverty due to poor management of its properties. Thus, Maimon's father became a children's teacher, an example that was followed later by his son Salomon. Maimon received a traditional religious education, which concentrated mainly on the study of the Talmud. At the age of 11, shortly after the death of his mother and following a comedy of errors involving the mothers of two young girls, Maimon was married in an arranged ceremony, and three years later his first son, David, was born. During his early adulthood, Maimon developed a keen curiosity about the sciences and philosophy. The most crucial influence was that of Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed, through which Maimon became acquainted with Aristotelian philosophy in its medieval cloth. Maimon's attachment to Maimonides — both personally and philosophically — ran throughout his life. Even Maimon's own name was adopted as an expression of respect towards this teacher (At the time, few Jews adopted family names. Before taking the surname ‘Maimon’, Maimon used to be called after his father: Salomon ben ("son of") Joshua). Maimon also developed an interest in Kabbalistic texts, which in spite of his relatively young age, he attempted to study and interpret according to the bodies of knowledge he had already mastered (i.e., Maimonidean philosophy). In his early twenties Maimon went to visit the Maggid of Mezrich, the contemporary leader and one of the founders of Hassidism. Though in his Lebensgeschichte Maimon passes a strong negative judgment against the Hassidic movement, it seems that several main themes of his later philosophy developed through a careful dialogue with its teachings. In his mid-twenties, hoping to widen his knowledge of philosophy and the sciences, Maimon left his family and went to Berlin (under the pretense of attempting to study medicine there). This first visit to Berlin ended shortly and grimly. Having confided to one of the officers of the Jewish community that the purpose of his visit was to study philosophy and that he intended to publish a new commentary on Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed, Maimon was asked to pack his belongings and leave the shelter of the Jewish community — and thus the city — at once. The following half year Maimon spent as a wandering beggar, till he reached Posen, where he was offered a shelter and a position as a tutor at the house of one of the city's Jews. During his stay in Posen Maimon wrote one of his most fascinating works, Hesheq Shelomo (“Solomon's Desire.” See the Bibliography). In 1780 Maimon went again to Berlin. This journey was much more successful and Maimon established a close connection with Moses Mendelssohn and entered the circles of the Haskala (the Jewish Enlightenment movement) in Berlin. Yet neither Berlin nor its enlightened Jews provided a real home for Maimon. For the cultured Jews of Berlin, Maimon was a rude Ostjude (East-European Jew), who spoke awful German accompanied by a variety of wild gesticulations. They did, however, acknowledge the genius of this person, who could, for example, read a difficult book of mathematics for the first time, and then explain it — in his savage manner — a short while later. Similarly, Maimon had little appreciation for these fine bourgeoises who, free from any barriers which would impede their ability to study the sciences, only contented themselves with a shallow acquaintance with what a civilized person should know. Furthermore, they lacked the sharpness of mind of his fellow Talmudists in Poland. Maimon does seem to have had a genuine appreciation for Mendelssohn, both because of his kindheartedness and because, unlike most others of the circles of the Jewish Enlightenment, Mendelssohn had a reasonable grasp of the Talmud and rabbinic literature.

In 1783, Mendelssohn asked Maimon to leave Berlin due to Maimon's open Spinozism and his bohemian lifestyle. After a journey to Hamburg, Amsterdam and then back to Hamburg, Maimon entered the Gymnasium Christianeum in Altona, where he stayed for two years. During this period Maimon studied several European languages and improved his knowledge of the natural sciences and his command of German. In 1785, Maimon left Altona for Berlin, where he met Mendelssohn for the last time. Later that year Maimon moved to Dessau, where he wrote a Hebrew textbook on mathematics, and subsequently settled in Breslau. Here, after a failed attempt to study medicine, Maimon again took up the position of a tutor. While staying in Breslau, Maimon translated Mendelssohn's Morgenstunden into Hebrew and wrote a Hebrew textbook on Newtonian physics — Ta'alumoth Hochma (“Mysteries of Wisdom”). After more than a decade of separation, Maimon's wife, Sarah, accompanied by their eldest son, David, succeeded in locating him in Breslau, and demanded that he either return to Lithuania or get a divorce. Reluctant to sever his ties with his past, Maimon tried to postpone the decision, but after his wife insisted that he must make the choice, he finally agreed to the divorce.

In 1787 Maimon traveled again to Berlin. There he heard about Kant's new philosophy, and for a couple of months dedicated himself to a careful study of the Critique of Pure Reason. In his Autobiography, Maimon alludes to his “rather curious” methods for understanding this text:

In the first reading I reached a vague sense of each section, which through subsequent readings I then sought to make determinate, and by this to penetrate the meaning of the author. This is what is properly meant when one thinks oneself into a system. Since I had already used this method in mastering the systems of Spinoza, D. Hume, and Leibniz, it was natural that I would be led to think of them as a ‘Coalition-System.’ This I actually discovered, and by and by set it out in the form of notes and observations on the Critique of Pure Reason (GW I, 557 | LB 253).

Maimon put his thoughts about the Critique in a letter he sent to Kant through a common friend, Markus Herz. Kant responded in a letter full of praise for Maimon, describing him as “having an acumen for such deep investigation that very few men have” and claiming that “none of my critics understood me and the main questions as well as Herr Maimon does.” (Ak. 11:48)

Kant's recognition opened for Maimon the salons of Berlin as well as the contemporary leading journals, in which Maimon started publishing. The story of the crude genius who came from the East and penetrated the heart of German philosophy became a common topic of small talk in these circles. In 1790, Maimon published an expanded version of his comments of Kant's first Critique as the Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie (“An Essay on Transcendental Philosophy”). A year later, Maimon collaborated with the members of the Jewish Enlightenment and prepared a Hebrew commentary on Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed. (The publisher decided to publish only the first part of this work, since he found Maimon's commentary much too deep philosophically, and thus unfitting for the political purposes of propagating the ideas of the enlightenment among the Jews.)

During the early 1790s, Maimon struck a close friendship with Karl Philipp Moritz (the author of Anton Reiser). Maimon became a frequent contributor and later the co-editor of Moritz's Magazin zur Erfahrungsseelenkunde, which was in fact the first journal dedicated to the study of psychology. Following Moritz's death in 1793 Maimon attempted to find a new patron. He established a connection with Goethe, who invited him to Weimar, yet because of reasons that remain unclear, this relationship did not succeed. Maimon's material life in that period was quite miserable. He lived in extreme poverty, and spent the little money he earned on alcohol — for the price of a drink one could buy his conversation in a tavern. In 1795, Maimon accepted a generous offer by a young Silesian nobleman, Graf Heinrich Wilhelm Adolf Kalkreuth, and moved to the latter's estate in Siegersdorf (currently: Kozuchow) in Lower Silesia. From this time until his death in November 22, 1800, Maimon led a quiet, though lonely and melancholic, life on Kalkreuth's estate. In May 1800, Maimon wrote to Lazarus Bendavid, one of his Jewish friends in Berlin, attempting to arrange his return to Berlin — and to find financial support for that purpose — but this plan never materialized.

In the last decade of his life, Maimon wrote ten books, and numerous articles. The most important among these books (apart from the Transcendentalphilosophie) are his philosophical works, Versuch einer neuen Logik, oder Theorie des Denkens (An Attempt at a New Logic, or a Theory of Thinking) (1793), Kritische Untersuchungen über den menschlichen Geist, oder das höhere Erkenntniß und Willensvermögen (Critical Investigations on the Human Mind, or the Highest Faculty of Knowledge and Will) (1797), and his Lebensgeschichte (Autobiography) (1792/3), which is his only work which achieved public recognition and popularity.

2. Maimon's Critique of Kant

In the highly polarized German philosophical community in the 1790s, Maimon's intellectual allegiances remained rather ambiguous. In a letter of 1791, Maimon had written to Kant that while he found the skeptical part of the Critique of Pure Reason wholly convincing, he harbored doubts about the more dogmatic aspects of Kant's system. Kant, of course, viewed Maimon not as an ally, but as the best of his critics — it remains an open question whether Maimon saw himself as fundamentally a friend or foe of the critical philosophy. At the very least, however, Maimon's criticisms of the Critique aim at the core of Kant's transcendental idealism, in particular because they engage with what Maimon sees as an internal problem for Kant's system.

Perhaps the most obvious problem — and certainly one of the earliest — that Kant faces concerns the issue of the thing in itself. In order to account for the content of cognition, Kant notoriously posits a thing in itself that stands outside of the realm of possible experience yet nevertheless serves as the causal source of cognitive content. This mysterious entity was attacked most famously by Jacobi, with his accusation that one could not enter into Kant's system without the assumption of the thing in itself, but that with such an assumption one could not remain within it. Maimon too was quick to point out that the thing in itself could not be understood realistically. Rather, Maimon argues, the thing in itself must be understood as completely conceptual determination of an object, which can be approached only asymptotically. Against Kant's claims about a noumenal realm of things as they are in themselves, Maimon holds that the thing in itself stands only as an object of inquiry, rather than an independent, noumenal entity: in a letter he notes that the thing in itself is “nothing other than the complete cognition of appearances. Metaphysics is thus not the study of something apart from experience, but rather merely of the limits (Ideas) of experience itself.” (in Ehrensperger (2004), 250-1) As such, while Maimon agrees with Kant that since we are finite beings the thing in itself is in fact beyond the realm of possible experience, this does not imply that the thing in itself cannot in principle be an object of cognition.

Maimon's criticisms of Kant's account of the thing in itself, however, are connected to a deeper concern about the notions of experience and cognition that stand at the heart of Kant's critical idealism. Kant posits the thing in itself in large part because of his commitment to a type of cognitive dualism, in which human experience is taken to involve both a faculty of thought (the understanding), as well as a faculty of receptivity (sensibility). In order to have any content, experience requires data, which must be given to the subject through the senses. Moreover, the data of experience cannot be produced by the faculty of thought itself. The given content of sensibility plays an ineliminable role in cognition, and its source must ultimately be traced to the subject's being affected by something distinct from itself, a role played by the thing in itself. But while the content of thought is provided by the affection of an object on the faculty of sensibility, the way in which this content is cognized remains the purview of the faculty of the understanding. Mere affection, in other words, is not equivalent to cognition. In Kant's terms, the “understanding is not capable of intuiting anything, and the senses are not capable of thinking anything.” (A52/B56)

For Maimon, Kant's cognitive dualism — which begins with distinct faculties of cognition — fails to explain how the various elements can come together in a way that makes experience possible. On this objection, Kant cannot justify his assumption that concepts and intuitions necessarily unite in cognition. In more Kantian terms, Maimon calls into question Kant's answers to both the quid facti and the quid juris that begin the Transcendental Deduction in the first Critique. According to Maimon, while the quid facti — the question of the fact of our use of a priori concepts in experience — is taken by Kant to be an unproblematic statement about the nature of human experience, the very assumption that we in fact do possess the type of experience Kant ascribes to us can be called into doubt. Kant's central argument in the Transcendental Deduction begins by assuming that experience exhibits a ‘dualistic’ structure, but according to Maimon, this position is not warranted, since the presumed constituent elements of experience (bare intuitions or concepts) are never themselves objects of experience. For Maimon, Kant's transcendental arguments remain mere ‘castles in the air’: while they might be valid, they fail to provide the ‘fact of experience’ that would make them sound. From the beginning, then, Maimon views Kant's transcendental project with suspicion.

The precise force of Maimon's objections to Kant's claims in the Transcendental Deduction remains, however, a bit unclear. Certainly the criticisms are forceful against regressive interpretations of Kant's argument, in which the Deduction begins with strong premises about the nature and objectivity of our experience, but other, less contentious premises perhaps fare better against Maimon's attack. And, as some commentators have noted, Maimon's own characterization of Kant's 'cognitive dualism' itself might be viewed with suspicion, since Maimon attributes to Kant the view that the faculties of sensibility and understanding are really distinct, when in fact Kant's considered position might be better understood as claiming only that there is a modal distinction between the faculties (see Franks (2005) for discussion of this point). But, at the very least, Maimon's concerns demand that the Kantian attempt to clarify what remains a very obscure part of the Critical Philosophy, and Maimon remains suspicious that any suitable answer is possible.

This suspicion becomes an explicit problem, Maimon claims, when the specific structure of Kant's system is examined. Here, Maimon argues, the quid juris of the deduction — the question about the legitimate use of the categories — can likewise be cast into doubt. While Kant claims in the Deduction that the a priori concepts of the understanding — the categories — are necessary conditions on the unity of the manifold of sensible data given in intuition, Maimon argues that such a position leads to serious problems for the later claims Kant makes in the ‘Schematism’ and ‘Principles’ sections of the Critique. According to Maimon, Kant cannot explain how different categories are able to discriminate between different intuitive content. Using the example of causality, Maimon argues that Kant has no way of explaining why some orders of perceptions represent causal connections, and why other orders of perceptions are merely associative. The reason for this claim is found in the fact that while Kant grounds the category of causality in a necessary order of perceptions, his justification for this claim appeals not to the content of the perceptions, but only to their formal ‘rule-governed’ connection — but, as Maimon argues, any order of perceptions can meet this formal requirement. Yet since the content of intuitions does not contain any temporal ordering, Kant explicitly bars an appeal to such content in applying the category of causality. As such, Kant's account of cognition faces a dilemma: either it must appeal to the content of experience and so violate Kant's own strictures, or the application of categories is merely arbitrary. Kant's central epistemological commitment — his ‘cognitive dualism’ — then leads, Maimon claims, to insuperable problems.

While Maimon's objections to Kant focus on specific issues that arise in the Critique, they all rest on Maimon's commitment to a type of ‘skeptical rationalism.’ Maimon notes that in the Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie the important problem of the quid juris was “presented in a much wider sense than that in which Kant takes it, and thereby [such a position] allowed a place for Hume's skepticism in its complete power. On the other hand, the complete solution to this problem necessarily leads to Spinozistic or Leibnizian dogmatism.” (GW I, 558 | LB 254) Maimon's position is then dogmatically rationalist insofar as it endorses the standards of reason found in Leibniz and Spinoza, but it remains empirically skeptical insofar as he agrees with Hume that such standards of reason are never met in our experience of the world.

Moreover, in the face of the question of how the understanding can subsume or comprehend a given object, Maimon notes that “for the Kantian system, [which claims] that our sensibility and understanding are two entirely different sources of our cognition, this question is … unanswerable; on the other hand, for the Leibizian-Wolffian system, in which both [sensibility and understanding] flow from the same cognitive source (their difference consisting only in the grades of completeness of this cognition), the question can easily be answered.” (GW II, 63-4 | VT 63-4) But while Maimon sees in the dogmatism of Spinoza, Leibniz and Wolff a means of avoiding the problems that attend Kant's ‘cognitive dualism,’ he remains a skeptic about whether this solution can ever be carried out.

3. Content, Givenness, and Space and Time

The rejection of cognitive dualism raises a rather vexing problem for Maimon: if the content of cognition is not to be found in the affection of the merely passive faculty of sensibility, where does the content come from? On the face of it, of course, it seems clear that humans are not wholly responsible for the world of experience, but rather encounter it; Maimon must provide some explanation of the ‘given’ content of experience without appealing to something like the Kantian cognitive dualism he finds so problematic.

Although the details of Maimon's answer to this problem remain obscure, the kernel of his position can be found in his analysis of what it is to be a finite cognizer. While Kant moves from the fact of our human finitude to the need for a ‘given’ element of cognition, Maimon claims that such a step need not be taken. Instead of characterizing finitude in terms of the need for a passive faculty of receptivity, Maimon insists that finitude only implies incompleteness in our cognition — but this incompleteness does not warrant any conclusions about the provenance of the matter of cognition. The content of sensibility is simply that which is passive in cognition — namely, that upon which the understanding operates. The expression that content is given from ‘outside of us,’ Maimon writes, means only “something in a representation of which we are conscious of no spontaneity, that is, (in view of our consciousness) a mere passivity without activity.” And, he continues, the word ‘given’ signifies not “something in us that has its cause outside of us … rather, [the given] means merely a representation, whose manner of origin in us is unknown to us.” (GW II, 203 | VT 203) What we take to be merely given to us in experience can in fact be explained in terms of a productive — and hence active — capacity of the mind, although the procedures of this activity remain unknown to us.

In this respect Maimon revives the Leibnizian notion that there is not a difference in kind, but only in degree, between a finite and an infinite intellect. Maimon argues that for an infinite intellect, all of the content of thought is consciously produced through the mind's own activity — by virtue of its infinity, nothing needs to be given to such an intellect. By the same token, Maimon holds that we can think of finite cognizers in the same terms, but with the crucial difference that finite minds are not aware of the productive capacities that create the matter of experience. The supposedly given content provided by sensibility, in other words, can in fact be explained in terms of the ‘subconscious’ productive capacities of the active mind. In this respect, Maimon argues that our minds are limited reflections of the divine or infinite mind; our active powers are conscious, he claims, in mathematics, where we display a ‘god-like’ ability to create content according to rules of thought. Mathematical objects, that is, are constructed according to the complete determinations of our concepts, rather than merely encountered in our sensible interactions with the world. In the case of empirical content, however, the creative process remains uncognized, since the 'manner of origination' of empirical objects or the complete conceptual determination that guides construction remains unknown to us.

These ‘subconscious’ products become conscious to the finite mind, Maimon claims, by being represented in space and time. The contrast with Kant is again important, for while Kant claims that space and time are forms of human intuition, Maimon maintains that space and time are in fact the ways in which humans represent conceptual differences between thoughts. Space and time, that is, “are both concepts and intuitions, and the latter presupposes the former.” (GW II, 18 | VT 18) Space and time are concepts as representations of the differences of things in general, but they are intuitions when they represent a particular sensible object in relation to other sensible objects. As finite cognizers, we represent in space and time what we have not completely conceptualized. The fact that we represent content spatially and temporally indicates only that there is some incompleteness in our conception of the world, and not that this content is provided by a realm of wholly independent objects. Maimon claims that the representations of space and time as intuitions arise as the result of the faculty of imagination, which is, as he describes it, the faculty of fictions (GW III, 61 | PW 37). Space and time are then taken to be fictions in that they add properties to objects that are not present in the conceptual determination of these objects. As such, they serve as “negative criteria” for the incompleteness of our knowledge of objects (GW V, 192 | VnL 134). Although we never have complete determination, we do get nearer to the complete concept of an object. The fact that we represent objects in space and time points to the fact that something remains to be determined — spatial or temporal diversities, that is, must have their ground in some conceptual differences. The representations of space and time provide indications that “the concepts of experience, and consequently also the determined relations of objects of experience, are incomplete.” (GW V, 192 | VnL 134)

This emphasis on the fictional nature of spatial and temporal properties again echoes the Leibnizian explanation of space and time as the representation of conceptual differences, but where Leibniz claims that space and time are derived from monadic relations, Maimon argues that the intuitions of space and time are in fact a priori human forms of representation, or, in Maimon's terms, ‘forms of difference’. In order to represent an object in space and time, Maimon maintains, the conceptual content that grounds such a representation must contain a diversity in order to be represented spatially and temporally. An intuited visual field of homogeneous red, for example, would not be spatially represented, since there would not be any diversity present. Spatiality would arise only with the introduction of some distinct content — a spot of green in the red field, for example.

For Maimon, the formal nature of space and time suffices to yield mathematical and geometric necessity. In mathematics, Maimon claims, space and time are given a priori to the faculty of cognition; the objects of mathematics are “nothing but space and time in all their possible modifications.” (GW V, 184 | VnL 126) Mathematics, that is, relates to an object given a priori, or rather “itself determines these objects a priori.” (GW V, 183 | VnL 125) The objects of mathematics and geometry are then directly constructed or determined according to the understanding's a priori rules of production. For Maimon, as for Kant, the ground of the a priority and necessity of geometry and arithmetic lies in the need for the construction and exhibition of concepts.

Space and time are then presented as a priori ‘forms of difference,’ but a question remains about the content of experience: the supposedly independent world of objects, in all of its variety and multiplicity, still needs to be explained. On this question, unfortunately, Maimon's position is particularly obscure. In the Versuch über die Transcendentalphilosophie, Maimon develops a theory about the content of experience in terms of what he calls ‘infinitesimals of perception.’ Here the invocation of the calculus is deliberate, for he argues that the content of experience can be explained in terms analogous to the way in which infinitesimals are treated in mathematics. A line, for example, can be understood as composed of an infinite number of points, each of which stands in relation to the others; moreover, these points are densely ordered, for there are an infinite number of points between any two points. But while the differences between the points of the line are themselves infinitely small, the relation between them is a determinate value — the slope, which can be calculated for any point on the line. Likewise, Maimon claims, the content of experience can be understood as analogous to a ‘perceptible line’ that is composed of an infinite number of smaller components, none of which is ontologically distinct from the experience itself. On this view, “sensibility provides the differentials to a determined consciousness; the imagination produces from these [differentials] finite (determinate) objects of intuition; the understanding produces from the relations of these different differentials, which are its objects, the relation from which arise sensible objects.” (GW II, 31-2 | VT 31-2) In this sense, there is — at least in principle — no need to appeal to a content given from outside of experience; instead, experience is itself composed or ‘integrated’ from the posited infinitesimal elements of thought. As finite cognizers, we represent in space and time the purely conceptual differences that are simply presented in thought. (A similar strategy for dealing with the problem of the thing-in-itself was developed a century later by the Marburg Neo-Kantians, especially Hermann Cohen.)

The theory of the infinitesimals of perception is both complex and exceedingly opaque, and perhaps for this reason it largely disappears from Maimon's later work. But despite its gradual diminution in Maimon's thought, the spirit it reflects continues to be expressed in Maimon's steadfast commitment to his 'skeptical rationalism.' Both his objections to Kant's account of cognition as well as his own positive project turn on a rejection of what might be called ‘brute givens.’ For Maimon, givenness stands in opposition to cognition, for he holds that no explanation can be provided for how merely given content can be taken up in thought — how, that is, the active faculties of thought can legitimately apply to a passively received given. By attempting to explain givenness within a larger framework of an active consciousness, Maimon presents a position that avoids — at least in principle — the problems that Maimon sees with Kant's cognitive dualism.

4. Logic and the Law of Determinability

In the Critique of Pure Reason Kant contemplates the possibility of a law that would govern the content of synthetic judgements. This law is supposed to be a complement to the principles of non-contradiction and excluded middle, which govern the logical form of both synthetic and analytic propositions. The law, which Kant terms “The Principle of Thoroughgoing Determinability” (Grundsatz der durchgaengigen Bestimmung), states that “of every pair of possible [and opposite] predicates, one of them must apply” to every single thing [A573/B601]. As a result, every single thing would be thoroughly determined with regard to any pair of opposite predicates. This law seems to necessitate the idea of the sum total of all possibility, and as a further result, the concept of an ens realismus. Kant argues, however, that this derivation is not valid insofar as it attempts to apply a principle that is limited to possible experience to all things (including things in themselves) [A583/B661]. Like Kant, Maimon too suggests a transcendental principle that will govern synthetic propositions with regard to their content and not their form (which is governed by the law of non-contradiction). In spite of these similarities, Maimon's Law of Determinability (Satz der Bestimmbarkeit) is significantly different from the one offered by Kant. The two laws not only differ with regard to their contents, but they also serve different functions, and have different weight in the two systems. While the Kantian law has a relatively marginal place within his systems (and is considered by many scholars as a mere residue of the metaphysical inheritance of Baumgarten and Wolff), Maimon's law seems to be the crucial axis of his positive philosophy.

… [T]he principle of determinability laid down in this work is a principle of all objectively real thought, and consequently of philosophy as a whole too. All the propositions of philosophy can be derived from, and be determined by it. (Between Kant and Hegel: Texts in the Development of Post-Kantian Idealism , George di Giovanni and H.S. Harris (trans. & ed.), 165 | Maimon, Gesammelte Werke, V 368).

The two laws also differ with regard to their domains of applicability. While Kant restricts his law to possible experience, Maimon argues that the demands of his law are satisfied only within the domain of a priori thinking, and that empirical cognition fails to pass its test.

The main aim of Maimon's Law of Determinability is to provide a criterion that would distinguish between syntheses that reflect a real connection between concepts, and arbitrary syntheses, which result from the activity of the imagination. Real syntheses are of crucial importance for Maimon, since through this kind of syntheses we can create new concepts, and, in the case of a priori syntheses, even create genuine objects. According to Maimon in any real synthesis of a subject and a predicate, the following two principles must be observed:

(1) A principle for the subject in general: every subject must be a possible object of consciousness, not only as a subject but also in itself;

(2) A principle for predicates: every predicate must be a possible object of consciousness, not in itself, but only as a predicate (in connection with the subject) What does not conform to this principle can be a merely formal, or arbitrary, but not a real thought (GW V, 78 | VnL 20).

A synthetic judgment then accords with the law of determinability when its predicate is a real determination of the subject (i.e., when its predicate is asymmetrically dependent upon its subject). Thus, for example, in the synthesis 'straight line', the predicate 'straight' is a real determination of the subject 'line', since one can think of the subject without the concept of the predicate, while one can conceive of straightness only through the concept of a line. In an empirical synthesis, such as, 'red line', the predicate is merely an arbitrary determination insofar as our intellect does not decipher any internal connection and dependence between the subject and the predicate (and since we can easily imagine other subjects having the same predicate) (GW II, 92-3 | VT 92-3).

Relying on the principle of determinability we can distinguish between the subject and the predicate of a given synthesis, e.g., in the synthesis ‘acute triangle’ we can see that ‘triangle’ can be thought without ‘acute’ but not the other way around, and hence ascertain that ‘acute’ is the predicate and ‘triangle’ the subject. Now, we can of course go one step further and try to unfold the concept of ‘triangle’. But here, the principle of determinability could assist us only to a limited degree. It will not tell us what is the genus under which ‘triangle’ falls. All it can do is to provide a negative criterion once we suggest such a genus. Thus, the principle will tell us that ‘triangle’ is not a determination of a specific figure which I see in front of me (since I can conceive of a triangle without thinking of the figure in front of me). Once I come with another candidate, such as ‘space’ and suggest that ‘triangle’ might be a determination of ‘space’, the principle will approve this suggestion, since we cannot think of a ‘triangle’ without ‘space’, though we can think of ‘space’ without ‘triangle’. This is the first main role of the principle of determinability: it assists us in uncovering the main categories of thought and their interrelations.

The other main role of the principle is to assist us in forming new concepts (this is Maimon's attempt to have an “ars invendi”). Here again, the principle provides us only with a negative criterion. If we ask ourselves: what are the possible determinations of ‘line’, the principle would not tell us that ‘straight’ is such a determination. Only once we suggest ‘straight’ as such a determination, could the principle evaluate — and in this case, approve — the relation of ‘straight’ to ‘line’.

Maimon's reliance on mathematical examples is not coincidental, since it is (primarily) in mathematics that we find real syntheses, namely, syntheses that pass the test of the law of determinability. This special advantage of mathematics is due to the role of construction in mathematics. Thus, in the case of the straight line the intellect commands a construction of a line in pure intuition according to the concept of straight. In such a way, the connection between the subject and the predicate, while synthetic, is nevertheless necessary. By contrast, a judgment such as "The cup is green" fails to accord with the law of determinability, for the connection between the subject and the predicate remains merely problematic. For our intellect, the greenness of the cup is something that is merely encountered, rather than consciously constructed, and thus it fails to express any internal connection between the subject and its predicate. By using the Law of Determinability Maimon thought to provide a way both to generate new concepts as well as to decipher the basic categories of thought. Mathematics provides us with an example of how should these derivations work. However, this law also seems to point out the unreliability of empirical judgments.

Determinability then provides a standard of synthetic judgments: it tells us not merely the form that such judgments must take, but also specifies what counts as a legitimate content of such a judgment. In this sense, determinability provides a certain cohesion between the products of the mind. But while the Law of Determinability presents the standard which real thought must meet, it is important to note that Maimon remains dubious about the possibility of ever achieving real thought except in the realm of mathematics. Only when the determinable relation between the subject and predicate of a judgment is constructed can real thought be reached; in empirical judgments about the world, no such determinable relation can be proved. And it is just this concern that leads to Maimon's skepticism.

5. From Dogmatism to Skepticism (and Back?)

Maimon describes his position as “Humean dogmatism,” (or, alternately, as “Leibnizian skepticism”), and this characterization is apt. His commitment to both camps, however, makes the question of his ultimate allegiance a difficult one. While Maimon agrees with the rationalists about the standards provided by reason, he claims to follow Hume in denying that there can ever be a proof of the applicability of reason to the world of experience. In this respect, the status of the principle of determinability encapsulates Maimon's position: while we can comprehend what the standard of real thought involves (since we have an example in mathematics), we can never be sure about its application to empirical matters (since we cannot guarantee the requisite determinable relation between subject and predicate). Maimon's skepticism arises “from the lack of the required ground for this use [of the categories], namely, the insight into the relation of determinability (that the subject, as the determinable, can be an object of consciousness in itself, while the predicate cannot be so in itself, but only as a determination [of the subject]). The categories are therefore, according to me, determined not for empirical use, but only for the objects of mathematics determined a priori” (GW V, 495-6 | VnL 437-8).

Maimon here exposes what seem to be the skeptical implications of his rationalism, for while the standards of real thought are available to us as finite cognizers, the satisfaction of these criteria remains beyond our power. According to this skeptical rationalism, the conditions that allow us entry into the realm of reason can never be satisfied in our relations to the sensible world: reason tells us what standards our explanations must meet, but nothing in our experience can discharge these demands. Rather, in our dealings with the sensible world, we must remain Humean skeptics, who can appeal to regularities and customs in our attempts to explain the empirical world, but who recognize that these explanations always remain provisional and unsure, since they never meet the demands of reason.

But while Maimon's skepticism commits him to the view that human knowledge remains incomplete, he does not abandon the notion of intellectual progress. While we can despair of ever reaching complete knowledge, the rationalist project at least holds out the hope of advancing us in our conceptual grasp of the world. In this sense, while Maimon is led by his skeptical conclusions to see human cognition as essentially antinomial, he retains the prospect of a solution:

Thought in general consists in a relation of a form (a rule of the understanding) to matter (the given subsumed by [the form]). Without matter one cannot attain consciousness of the form, and consequently the matter is a necessary condition of thought; that is, for the real thought of a form or rule of the understanding, there must necessarily be given a matter to which this form relates. On the other hand, however, the completeness of the thought of an object requires that nothing be given in [this completeness], but rather that everything must be thought. Since we cannot deny either of these demands, we must therefore try to satisfy both, in that we make our thought ever more complete, whereby the matter always approaches the form, through infinity — and this is the solution of this antinomy (GW III, 186-7 | PW 162-3).

This relation between skepticism and rationalism is nicely captured in a biblical metaphor Maimon offers:

Reason, which in its theoretical employment is conditioned by given objects, and is thus very limited, is now, in its practical use in relation to the will, absolute. The principle which it presents is both determined in itself, and in its application is capable of no illegitimacy. This highly pleasant prospect is certainly doubted by the skeptic, who reduces any law, as an original fact, into many. An uplifting and at once humbling voice calls out to him: “You should see the promised land from afar, but you may not enter it!” [Deut 34:4] Still, fortunately the seeing and the entering are the same: for those who boast of being able to enter can, for their legitimation, do no more than show the distant view (GW VII, 554).

The vision of the promised land is an especially apt characterization of Maimon's skepticism: we can see what conditions would need to be satisfied for real cognition, but we are barred from ever knowing if these conditions are met. When pressed for a warrant for his claims to certainty, the dogmatist can do no more than simply point to the far-off land of philosophical milk and honey.

6. Ethics

Unlike Kant and most of the German Idealists, Maimon denies that practical reason enjoys a primacy over theoretical reason. For Maimon, the force of both morality and epistemology resides in the notion of universal validity: as rational beings we are bound by both philosophical truth and moral duty. As Maimon puts the matter, “the moral good is good only because it is true.” (GW II, 405 | VT 409) As such, the theoretical and the practical go hand in hand; for Maimon, it makes no sense to follow Kant's claim to have denied knowledge to make room for faith. Rather, Maimon revives something like the Aristotelian notion that the highest virtue and pleasure are found in philosophical contemplation. This results, Maimon claims, because both practical and theoretical cognition follow from the same notion of freedom:

Just as I have produced the principle of practical cognition from the mere widening of the theoretical, so I find practical freedom from the mere widening of what is theoretically given as a fact, and this concept of freedom first makes possible the use of this principle (GW VII, 275 | KU 273).

Our cognitive situations in the theoretical and moral arenas are then identical; in each, the conflicts that characterize our cognitive capacities can be resolved only by assuming that our cognition is a ‘schema’ of an infinite intellect, which is to embrace a type of dogmatism that echoes Spinoza, Leibniz and Wolff.

The similarities between the theoretical and the practical realms allow for an explanation of the possibility of freedom, even though “this concept [of freedom] is capable of no empirical presentation.” (GW VII 241 | KU 241) Thought, Maimon argues, is an absolutely free activity of the faculty of cognition, which is not determined a priori by natural laws, but rather according to the laws of the faculty of cognition itself. The will that is related to the faculty of cognition (the will to think) is likewise not determined through objects of thought, but rather through the a priori form of thought (which precedes the actual thought of these objects). We thus have an instance of a free will in general (GW VII 242 | KU 240).

Although Maimon's account of freedom is related to Kant's position, Maimon diverges from the critical philosophy by insisting that since the moral law provides only the form of the determination of the will, the actualization of this form “must be connected to an originally agreeable feeling (which does not arise from habit).” (GW VII 243 | KU 241) This feeling, Maimon argues, must be understood not in terms of a particular sensuous desire, but rather as “abstracted from all individuality.” (GW VII 245 | KU 243) Here the close connection between the theoretical and the practical spheres is again important, for Maimon argues that the ‘abstract feeling’ is best understood in terms of a ‘drive for cognition’:

Man considers himself as an object of nature, and consequently as a limited being, and yet, since his faculty of cognition extends to all possible objects, he finds himself in a position to strive to infinity, and to get ever closer to the infinite faculty of cognition (divinity). Can a greater worth for a being be thought than to get closer to divinity? And must not all other motives vanish in the face of the motives of cognition and morality (whereby all lofty preferences extend to outer actions)? Here we have the prevailing motive of morality, whose power no one who has considered the case can doubt (GW VII 246-7 | KU 244-5).

The role played by the pleasure of the striving after knowledge, however, recedes in importance as Maimon becomes more skeptical about the possibility of explaining the motivations that lead to moral actions. Perhaps the clearest formulation of Maimon's later position is in ‘The Moral Skeptic,’ a late work from 1800, where a sketch of the difference between moral dogmatism and skepticism is provided. As in the theoretical realm, Maimon focuses on the problem of the legitimate application of universal rules to particular cases (a problem that Kant in the Groundwork is well aware of). Just as we can be skeptical of whether the category of causality is legitimately applied to particular intuitions, so too can the connection between the moral law and particular actions be called into doubt. While the moral law presents the rule of conduct that I ought to follow, there is no way, Maimon claims, to determine whether in fact I act only according to it, or whether other motivations have insinuated themselves into the action. Kant, of course, agrees with this point, but Maimon attempts to draw a more skeptical conclusion from it than Kant does. On Maimon's view, one cannot determine whether an action simply accords with the moral law “and hence possesses mere legality” or whether it in fact follows from the motive of duty itself, and as such lays claim to morality. This uncertainty arises, Maimon argues, because the moral character of an action is not immediately present to cognition. Rather, one can ascribe a moral character to a person or action only after excluding all other possible motives as insufficient to explain the action — but, Maimon notes, such a strategy would require an ‘infinite faculty of cognition’ in order to accomplish this task. Given the uncertainty about motivations, Maimon argues that the moral law can at best be viewed as an “idea that provides only a regulative use (for legality).” (GW VII 547 | MS 285) As such, while the moral law presents a universal command, it cannot be shown to be the ground of human actions, since — to employ a term from Maimon's theoretical philosophy — there is no determinate relation between the moral law and particular actions. For Maimon, the moral law stands, as do the Kantian categories in the theoretical realm, as a ‘castle in the air,’ incapable of reaching the solid ground of particular actions.

7. Maimon's Influence on the Formation of German Idealism

Kant's high regard for Maimon was shared by a number of the important figures of the movements of German Enlightenment and Idealism. Mendelssohn, of course, had initially recognized the genius beneath Maimon's coarse exterior, and Reinhold too took Maimon seriously, although their relation soured after Maimon published a volume of their increasingly acrimonious correspondence without Reinhold's permission. On a much more positive note, Fichte wrote that his admiration for Maimon's talent “[k]nows no limit,” and he continues that “Maimon has completely overturned the entire Kantian philosophy as it has been understood by everyone until now.” (Gesamtausgabe III, 2: 275)

Although Maimon's positive system was of interest to the German philosophical community in the 1790s, his greatest influence was as a skeptic, and in particular as a critic of the ‘cognitive dualism’ that characterized Kant's critical philosophy. The force of Maimon's objections to Kant was felt most directly by Fichte, who in the Wissenschaftslehre devotes considerable attention to Maimon's skeptical challenge to Kant. For Fichte, Maimon pointed out the fatal shortcomings of Kant's system, but failed to move beyond a skepticism about the prospects for knowledge. This is reflected in Fichte's claim that Maimon's position “would ground a skepticism that taught us to doubt our own existence.” (GA I, 2: 369) Fichte sought to remedy this situation by developing a more thoroughgoing idealistic account of experience, one which placed the notion of ‘positing’ at the center of the system. Only in so doing, Fichte claims, can both Kant's dualism and Maimon's skepticism be avoided.

In the Wissenschaftslehre, Fichte expresses the central themes of Absolute Idealism: the centrality of a productive faculty of mind, as well as an embrace of a rationalist methodology and a concomitant rejection of any type of dualism. In this respect, the project of Absolute Idealism owes much to Maimon, who himself had developed just these themes in his various works. But where Fichte — and Schelling and Hegel — stand as optimists about the prospects for this type of philosophical inquiry, Maimon remains much less sanguine about the ability of finite minds to reach a final ‘System’ of philosophy. It is perhaps testament to the force of Maimon's skepticism that while the Systems of German Idealism have collapsed, the skeptical challenge Maimon poses for accounts of experience remains vital and forceful — if unduly neglected — today. Maimon, that is, anticipates key points of the contemporary debates about the nature of Givenness, and his skeptical position offers and interesting and novel perspective on discussions of the issue.

Maimon also seems to have played an important role in the reception of Spinoza in German Idealism. Maimon was not only the first to try to create a synthesis between Kantian idealism and Spinozistic pantheism (GW III 455), but he was also apparently the first to suggest that Spinoza's philosophy was not atheistic, but rather a strong though unorthodox religious view. Instead of characterizing Spinoza's philosophy as atheism, a view which denies Gods existence, Maimon argues that it should rather be called acosmism, insofar as it denies the reality of the diverse world and affirms the sole reality of God. This characterization of Spinoza was later adopted by Hegel (See Hegel's Encyclopedia Logic, sections 50 and 151, and his discussion of Spinoza in the Lectures on the History of Philosophy) and seems to play a central role in Hegel's perception of Spinoza.

8. Jewish Philosophy and Culture

Being raised in an East-European Jewish surrounding, Maimon's thought was influenced by the major intellectual movements of this arena. Talmud, Kabbalah, contemporary Hassidism and medieval Jewish philosophy played a crucial role in the formation of Maimon's philosophy as well as the style of his writings. The strongest influence was that of Maimonides, whose unbiased and strict rationalism Maimon took as a guiding example throughout his life (even when he no longer adhered to Maimonidean metaphysics). Following Maimonides, Maimon held intellectual perfection as the ultimate human end, and saw moral perfection merely as means for achieving this end. Like Maimonides, Maimon argued that God's image in humanity is the intellect and that to the extent that we activate and develop our intellectual capacities we become closer and more similar to God.

Maimon's relation to the Kabbalah was a bit more ambivalent. While he had no sympathy for the anthropomorphic teachings of some of the major Kabbalistic works, Maimon attempted to disclose the rationalistic core of the Kabbalah, which he identified with Spinoza's pantheistic teachings. In his early Hebrew writings Maimon develops the view that God is also the material cause of the world (i.e., that all things are merely predicates of God, who is their substratum). Since Maimon conceives God to be a pure intellect, the result is a genuine form of radical — and pantheistic — idealism. This form of idealism plays a significant role in Maimon's thought in the 1790s, and possibly also in the development of German Idealism in general.

Maimon also seems to borrow from Kabbalistic and contemporary Hassidic writings the idea of an infinite process through which one “strives to turn matter into form,” though he will interpret this formula in metaphysical rather than ethical terms.

In his early Hebrew writings Maimon expresses a deep interest and curiosity about astrology and magic, an interest that he returns to as a contributor and editor of the Magazin zur Erfahrungsseelenkunde.

After his migration from Lithuania to Germany, Maimon entered the circles of the Haskala (the Jewish Enlightenment movement) in Berlin. Maimon shared with this circle the idea that there is a need to propagate the enlightenment and scientific education among traditional Jews; yet, he seemed to have a very different understanding of what Enlightenment is. While for the Berlin Haskala, ‘Enlightenment’ was primarily the attempt to acculturate the Jewish masses in order to allow their acceptance into modern German society, Maimon's idea of Enlightenment was that of propagating science and philosophy. This understanding of Enlightenment was deeply imbedded in Maimon's inheritance of Maimonidean philosophy, which took philosophy and the sciences to be the highest stages of religious work, through which one comes to know God in the deepest sense. This attitude is clearly demonstrated in Maimon's 1791 commentary on the Guide of the PerplexedGiva'ath ha-Moreh (Hebrew: The Hill of the Guide). In this work Maimon frequently interprets the claims of Maimonides according to 18th century science and philosophy (especially Kant). While this form of intentional anachronism reveals Maimon's view of philosophy as a perennial discourse, it was also designed to serve the propagation of modern science and thought among its readers (Maimon himself explains in a similar way Maimonides' decision to open his legal codex, the Mishne Torah, with a summary of Aristotelian first philosophy).

Like other members of the Jewish enlightenment, Maimon criticized traditional Jewish society, and primarily the Talmudists, for their prejudices and idleness. Yet, along with this straightforward criticism, Maimon also expressed a deep appreciation for the sharpness, devotion and moral character of the Talmudists. In his Autobiography, Maimon writes that he “would have to write a book, had I wished to answer all the unjust charges and ridicule brought against the Talmud by both Christian authors as well as wishing-to-be-enlightened Jews.” (GW I 172 | LB I 172). Here Maimon gives a detailed picture of various streams and aspects of the Jewish culture. In most cases his account is a masterpiece of a thoughtful, thoroughly informed, and unbiased exploration of one's own culture.

Maimon's reception by both traditional and enlightened Jews was quite poor. In a few texts Maimon was lumped together with Spinoza and Acosta to form “the great chain of Jewish heretics,” but mostly Maimon's writings and philosophy were ignored. The traditional community could not forgive him his infidelity and his desertion of their ranks (A certain literary source tells us that in Maimon's funeral the children of the nearby Jewish community of Glogau ran after his coffin and threw stones on it. Maimon's corpse was buried at the margin of the Jewish cemetery in Glogau. When Maimon's friend, Graf Kalkreuth, asked why he was treated with such disrespect, he was told that “the edge of the cemetery is an honorary place designated traditionally for philosophers and their like”). For the enlightened Jews of Germany, Maimon was too much of an Ostjude and had too much sympathy for and similarity to the Talmudists. Furthermore, Maimon never took part in the attempt to define the “essence” of Judaism and by this to provide a theology that would imitate and be able to compete with modern Protestant theology. Being thoroughly knowledgeable about the variety of aspects and streams of Judaism, Maimon simply could not participate in this reductive project which unfortunately was quite central to modern Jewish philosophy. Thus, in spite of the fact that Maimon's erudition in Jewish literature was hardly equaled by any other modern Jewish thinker, Maimon's name is omitted in many, if not most, 20th century surveys of modern Jewish philosophy.


Original editions of Maimon's main Works:

Modern editions and translations of Maimon's Works:

Unpublished Manuscripts

Missing Manuscripts

Throughout his wanderings Maimon kept manuscripts of several works which he never published. After his death, Maimon's patron, Graf Adolf Kalkreuth, gave the manuscripts to Benjamin Fraenkel from the nearby Jewish community in Glogau. During the 19th century Maimon's manuscripts and letters were dispersed and held by several prominent Jewish scholars and bibliophiles such as Abraham Geiger, Leopold Zunz and Heimann Michael. The collection of the latter — which included Maimon's Ta'alumoth Hochma — was purchased by the Bodleian library in 1848. Several other manuscripts found different ways to the collection of the Berlin Hochschule für die Wissenschaft des Judentums where they were held till World War II. Before and during the war the Hochschule's collection was smuggled out of Germany. The most important Maimonian MS held by the Hochschule arrived, in the 1980s, at the National and University Library in Jerusalem. Other manuscripts of Maimon, held before the war by various individuals and institutions, are still missing. The authors of this entry participate in the search after these missing manuscripts (and letters), the most important of which are:

  1. The Early Commentary on Maimonides' Guide. [A text which Maimon wrote before his first arrival in Berlin].
  2. Maimon's translation of Mendelssohn's Morgenstunden.
  3. Parts two and three of Giva'ath ha-Moreh. [In his Autobiography Maimon writes that these parts were ready to print and were supposed to be published soon thereafter. Apparently, the publishers were not interested in the work due to its lack of popular appeal].
  4. A fragmentary commentary on Aristotle's Ethics.
  5. Die Mysterien der Philosophie (“The Mysteries of Philosophy”). [Apparently, a complete book, ready for print].
  6. Über Logik (“On Logic”). [Mainly remarks on Kiesewetter's book on logic].

Selected Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Fichte, Johann Gottlieb | Ibn Ezra, Abraham | Kant, Immanuel | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Maimonides | Mendelssohn, Moses | Reinhold, Karl Leonhard | Spinoza, Baruch