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Mally's Deontic Logic

First published Fri Apr 5, 2002; substantive revision Wed Dec 10, 2008

In 1926, Mally presented the first formal system of deontic logic. His system had several consequences which Mally regarded as surprising but defensible. It also had a consequence ("A is obligatory if and only if A is the case") which Menger (1939) and almost all later deontic logicians have regarded as unacceptable. We will not only describe Mally's system but also discuss how it may be repaired.

1. Introduction

In 1926, the Austrian philosopher Ernst Mally (1879-1944) proposed the first formal system of deontic logic. In the book in which he presented this system, The Basic Laws of Ought: Elements of the Logic of Willing, Mally gave the following motivation for his enterprise:

In 1919, everybody was using the word self-determination. I wanted to obtain a clear understanding of this word. But then, of course, I immediately stumbled on the difficulties and obscurities surrounding the concept of Ought, and the problem changed. The concept of Ought is the basic concept of the whole of ethics. It can only serve as a usable foundation for ethics when it is captured in a system of axioms. In the following I will present such an axiomatic system.[1]

As Mally's words indicate, he was not primarily interested in deontic logic for its own sake: he mainly wanted to lay the foundation of "an exact system of pure ethics" (eine exakte reine Ethik). More than half of his book is devoted to the development of this exact system of ethics. In the following, we will, however, concentrate on the formal part of his book, both because it is its "hard core" and because it is the part that has attracted the most interest.

2. Mally's Formal Language

Mally based his formal system on the classical propositional calculus as formulated in Whitehead's and Russell's Principia Mathematica (vol. 1, 1910).

The non-deontic part of Mally's system had the following vocabulary: the sentential letters A, B, C, P and Q (these symbols refer to states of affairs), the sentential variables M and N, the sentential constants V (the Verum, Truth) and Λ (the Falsum, Falsity), the propositional quantifiers ∃ and ∀, and the connectives ¬, &, ∨, → and ↔. Λ is defined by Λ = ¬V.

The deontic part of Mally's vocabulary consisted of the unary connective !, the binary connectives f and ∞, and the sentential constants U and ∩.

f, ∞ and ∩ are defined by:

Def. f . A f B = A → !B (Mally 1926, p. 12)
Def. ∞ . A ∞ B = (A f B) & (B f A)
Def. ∩. ∩ = ¬U

Mally did not only read !A as "it ought to be the case that A." Because a person's willing that a given state of affairs A be the case is often expressed by sentences of the form "A ought to be the case" (for example, someone might say "it ought to be the case that I am rich and famous" to indicate that she wants to be rich and famous), he also read !A as "A is desirable" or "I want it to be the case that A." As a result, his formal system was as much a theory about Wollen (willing) as a theory about Sollen (ought to be the case). This explains the subtitle of his book. In modern deontic logic, the basic deontic connective O is seldom read in this way.

We have just described one respect in which Mally's deontic logic was different from more modern proposals. There are two other conspicuous differences:

3. Mally's Axioms

Mally adopted the following informal deontic principles (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

(i) If A requires B and if B then C, then A requires C.
(ii) If A requires B and if A requires C, then A requires B and C.
(iii) A requires B if and only if it is obligatory that if A then B.
(iv) The unconditionally obligatory is obligatory.
(v) The unconditionally obligatory does not require its own negation.

Mally did not offer much support for these principles. They simply seemed intuitively plausible to him.

Mally formalized his principles as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19):

I. ((A f B) & (B → C)) → (A f C)
II. ((A f B) & (A f C)) → (A f (B & C))
III. (A f B) ↔ !(A → B)
IV. ∃U !U
V. ¬(U f ∩)

Axiom IV is strange:

For these reasons, we replace Axiom IV by the following axiom:[2]

IV. !U

Mally could hardly have objected to this version of Axiom IV because it is equivalent with his theorem (23′), i.e., V f U, in virtue of Def. f. In the following "Axiom IV" will always refer to our version of Axiom IV rather than Mally's.

Using Def. f, Axioms I-V may also be written as follows (Mally 1926, pp. 15-19 and p. 24):

I′. ((A → !B) & (B → C)) → (A → !C)
II′. ((A → !B) & (A → !C)) → (A → !(B & C))
III′. (A → !B) ↔ !(A → B)
IV′. V f U
V′. ¬(U → !∩)

4. Mally's Theorems

Mally derived the following theorems from his axioms (Mally 1926, pp. 20-34).[3]

(1) (A f B) → (A f V)
(2) (A f Λ) ↔ ∀M (A f M)
(3) ((M f A) ∨ (M f B)) → (M f (A ∨ B))
(4) ((M f A) & (N f B)) → ((M & N) f (A & B))
(5) !P ↔ ∀M (M f P)
(6) (!P & (P → Q)) → !Q
(7) !P → !V
(8) ((A f B) & (B f C)) → (A f C)
(9) (!P & (P f Q)) → !Q
(10) (!A & !B) ↔ !(A & B)
(11) (A ∞ B) ↔ !(A ↔ B)
(12) (A f B) ↔ (A → !B) ↔ !(A → B) ↔ !¬(A & ¬B) ↔ !(¬A ∨ B)
(13) (A → !B) ↔ ¬(A & ¬!B) ↔ (¬A ∨ !B)
(14) (A f B) ↔ (¬B f ¬A)
(15) ∀M (M f U)
(16) (U → A) → !A
(17) (U f A) → !A
(18) !!A → !A
(19) !!A ↔ !A
(20) (U f A) ↔ (A ∞ U)
(21) !A ↔ (A ∞ U)
(22) !V
(23) V ∞ U
(23′) V f U
(24) A f A
(25) (A → B) → (A f B)
(26) (A ↔ B) → (A ∞ B)
(27) ∀M (∩ f ¬M)
(28) ∩ f ∩
(29) ∩ f U
(30) ∩ f Λ
(31) ∩ ∞ Λ
(32) ¬(U f Λ)
(33) ¬(U → Λ)
(34) U ↔ V
(35) ∩ ↔ Λ

5. Surprising Consequences

Mally called theorems (1), (2), (7), (22) and (27)-(35) "surprising" (befremdlich) or even "paradoxical" (paradox). He viewed (34) and (35) as the most surprising of his surprising theorems. But Mally's reasons for calling these theorems surprising are puzzling if not confused.

Consider, for example, theorem (1). Mally interpreted this theorem as follows: "if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the case" (Mally 1926, p. 20). He regarded this as a surprising claim, and we agree. However, Mally's interpretation of (1) is not warranted. (1) only says that if A requires B, then A requires the Verum. The expression "if A requires B, then A requires everything that is the case" is to be formalized as

(1′) (A f B) → (C → (A f C))

This formula is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I. In other words, Mally should have reasoned as follows: (1′) is surprising; but (1′) is an immediate consequence of (1) in virtue of Axiom I; Axiom 1 is uncontroversial; so (1) is to be regarded as surprising.

A similar pattern is to be seen in many of Mally's other remarks about theorems which surprised him. He generally read too much into them and confused them with some of the consequences they had in his system:

Mally regarded theorems (28)-(32) as surprising because of their relationships with certain other surprising theorems:

Mally's list of surprising theorems seems too short: for example, (24) is equivalent with A → !A in virtue of Def. f. But A → !A may be paraphrased as "the facts ought to be the case," an assertion which Mally regarded as surprising (Mally 1926, p. 24). So then why didn't he call (24) surprising? Did it not surprise him after (22)?

Even though Mally regarded many of his theorems as surprising, he thought that he had discovered an interesting concept of "correct willing" (richtiges Wollen) or "willing in accordance with the facts" which should not be confused with the notions of obligation and willing used in ordinary discourse. Mally's "exact system of pure ethics" was mainly concerned with this concept, but we will not describe this system because it belongs to the field of ethics rather than deontic logic.

6. Menger's Criticism

Mally's enterprise was received with little enthusiasm. As early as 1926, it was noted that "Mr. Mally's deductions are frequently so amazingly obtuse and irrelevant that (despite his elaborate symbolic apparatus) it is only necessary to state one or two of them to show how far his discussion has strayed from its self-appointed task" (Laird 1926, p. 395).

In 1939, Karl Menger published a devastating attack on Mally's system. He first pointed out that A ↔ !A is a theorem of this system. In other words, if A is the case, then A is obligatory, and if A ought to be the case then A is indeed the case. As we have already noted in connection with theorems (34) and (35), Mally made the same claim in informal terms, but the formula A ↔ !A does not occur in his book.

Menger's theorem A ↔ !A may be proven as follows (Menger's proof was different; PC denotes the propositional calculus).

First, A → !A is a theorem:

1. A → ((!B → !B) & (B → A)) [ PC ][5]
2. ((!B → !B) & (B → A)) → (!B → !A) [ I′ ]
3. A → (!B → !A) [ 1, 2, PC ]
4. !B → (A → !A) [ 3, PC ]
5a. !U [ Ax. IV ]
5b. !(!A → A) [ III′(→), PC ]
6. A → !A [ 4, either 5a or 5b, PC ]

Second, !A → A is a theorem:

1. ((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) → (U → !∩) [ I′ ]
2. ¬((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) [ 1, V′, PC ]
3. ¬((U → !A) & (A → ∩)) → (!A → A) [ PC ][6]
4. !A → A [ 2, 3, PC ]

Because A → !A and !A → A are theorems, A ↔ !A is a theorem as well.

Menger gave the following comment:

This result seems to me to be detrimental for Mally's theory, however. It indicates that the introduction of the sign ! is superfluous in the sense that it may be cancelled or inserted in any formula at any place we please. But this result (in spite of Mally's philosophical justification) clearly contradicts not only our use of the word "ought" but also some of Mally's own correct remarks about this concept, e.g. the one at the beginning of his development to the effect that p → (!q or !r) and p → !(q or r) are not equivalent. Mally is quite right that these two propositions are not equivalent according to the ordinary use of the word "ought." But they are equivalent according to his theory by virtue of the equivalence of p and !p (Menger 1939, p. 58).

Almost all deontic logicians have accepted Menger's verdict. After 1939, Mally's deontic system has seldom been taken seriously.

7. Where Did Mally Go Wrong?

Where did Mally go wrong? How could one construct a system of deontic logic which does more justice to the notion of obligation used in ordinary discourse? Three types of answers are possible:

We will only explore the first two suggestions. Each of them will turn out to be sufficient, so the third proposal is overkill.

We will first show that if Mally's deontic principles are added to a system in which the so-called paradoxes of material and strict implication are avoided, many of the "surprising" theorems (such as (34) and (35)) are no longer derivable and A ↔ !A is no longer derivable either. But most of the theorems which Mally regarded as "plausible" are still derivable. The resulting system is closely related to Anderson's relevant deontic logic (1967).

After this, we will show that one might also modify some of the specifically deontic principles: Def. f and Axiom I may be modified in such a way that the resulting system is almost identical with the system nowadays known as standard deontic logic. The resulting system agrees less well with Mally's deontic expectations (as revealed by his expressions of surprise) than the first one does, but it is adequate in the sense that (34), (35) and A ↔ !A are no longer derivable.

8. Alternative Non-Deontic Bases

Mally's informal postulates (i)-(iii) and (v) are conditionals or negations of conditionals, i.e., of the form "if … then —" or "not: if … then —." Føllesdal and Hilpinen (1981, pp. 5-6) have suggested that such conditionals should not be formalized in terms of material implication and that some sort of strict implication would be more appropriate. But this suggestion is not altogether satisfactory, for A → !A is derivable in S2 plus I′ and III′, and A ↔ !A is derivable in S4 plus I′ and III′, where → is the symbol of strict implication.[7]

In systems of strict implication the so-called paradoxes of material implication (such as A → (B → A)) are avoided, but the so-called paradoxes of strict implication (such as (A & ¬A) → B) remain. What would happen to Mally's system if both kinds of paradoxes were avoided? This question can be answered by adding Mally's axioms to a system in which none of the so-called "fallacies of relevance" can be derived (see the entry on relevance logic).

In the following, we will add Mally's axioms to the most popular system of this type, relevant system R. The result is better than in the case of strict implication: most of the theorems which Mally regarded as surprising are no longer derivable, and Menger's theorem A ↔ !A is not derivable either. But many "plausible" theorems can still be derived.

Relevant system R with the propositional constant t ("the conjunction of all truths") has the following axioms and rules (Anderson & Belnap 1975, ch. V; ↔ is defined by A ↔ B = (A → B) & (B → A)):

Self-implication. A → A
Prefixing. (A → B) → ((C → A) → (C → B))
Contraction. (A → (A → B)) → (A → B)
Permutation. (A → (B → C)) → (B → (A → C))
& Elimination. (A & B) → A, (A & B) → B
& Introduction. ((A → B) & (A → C)) → (A → (B & C))
∨ Introduction. A → (A ∨ B), B → (A ∨ B)
∨ Elimination. ((A → C) & (B → C)) → ((A ∨ B) → C)
Distribution. (A & (B ∨ C)) → ((A & B) ∨ C)
Double Negation. ¬¬A → A
Contraposition. (A → ¬B) → (B → ¬A)
Ax. t. A ↔ (t → A)
Modus Ponens. A, A → B / B
Adjunction. A, B / A & B

A relevant version RD of Mally's deontic system may be defined as follows:

RD has the following properties.

Although most of Mally's surprising theorems are not derivable in RD, this has nothing to do with Mally's own reasons for regarding these theorems as surprising. They are not derivable in RD because they depend on fallacies of relevance. Mally never referred to such fallacies to explain his surprise. His considerations were quite different, as we have already described.

RD is closely related to Anderson's relevant deontic logic ARD, which is defined as R supplemented with the following two axioms (Anderson 1967, 1968, McArthur 1981; Anderson used the unary connective O instead of !):

ARD1. !A ↔ (¬A → ∩)
ARD2. !A → ¬!¬A

Anderson's system has several problematical features (McArthur 1981, Goble 1999, 2001) and RD shares most of these features. But we will not go into this issue here. It is at any rate clear that RD is better than Mally's original system.

9. Alternative Deontic Principles

Instead of changing the non-deontic propositional basis of Mally's system, one might also modify the specifically deontic axioms and rules. This might of course be done in various ways, but the following approach works well without departing too much from Mally's original assumptions.[18]

First, regard f as primitive and replace Mally's definition of f in terms of → and ! (Def. f, the very first specifically deontic postulate in Mally's book) by the following definition of ! in terms of V and f :

Def. !. !A = V f A

Second, replace Axiom I, which may also be written as (B → C) → ((A f B) → (A f C)), with the following rule of inference:

R f . B → C / (A f B) → (A f C)

We may then derive:

1. B → C / !B → !C [ Def. !, R f ]
2. (!A & !B) → !(A & B) [ Def. !, Ax. II ]
3. !V [ 1, Ax. IV, PC ]
4. ¬!Λ [ 1, Ax. III(←), Ax. V, PC (ex falso) ]

The so-called standard system of deontic logic KD is defined as PC supplemented with 1-4 (except that ! is usually written as O: see the entry on deontic logic), so the new system is at least as strong as KD. It is not difficult to see that it is in fact identical with KD supplemented with OU (Mally's Axiom IV) and the following definition of f : A f B = O(A → B). In modern deontic logic, the notion of commitment is sometimes defined in this way.

In the new system, Mally's theorems have the following status.

There were only 12 mismatches in the case of RD, so the new system does less justice to Mally's deontic expectations than RD did. But it agrees better with his general outlook because it is still based on classical propositional logic, a system to which Mally did not object (not that he had much choice in the 1920s).

Many of Mally's surprising theorems are derivable in KD, but they have, as it were, lost their sting: those theorems lead to surprising consequences when combined with Mally's Axiom I and his definition of f , but they are completely harmless without these postulates.

The standard system of deontic logic has several problematical features. The fact that each provable statement is obligatory is often regarded as counterintuitive, and there are many other well-known "paradoxes." The revised version of Mally's system shares these problematical features. But we will not discuss these issues here. The standard system is at any rate better than Mally's original proposal.

10. Conclusion

Mally's deontic logic is unacceptable for the reasons stated by Menger (1939). But it is not as bad as it may seem at first sight. Only relatively minor modifications are needed to turn it into a more acceptable system. One may either change the non-deontic basis to get a system that is similar to Anderson's system, or apply two patches to the deontic postulates to obtain a system similar to standard deontic logic.

Some authors have refused to view Mally's deontic logic as a "real" deontic system and say that they "mention it only by way of curiosity" (Meyer and Wieringa 1993, p. 4). The above shows that this judgment is too harsh. It is only a small step, not a giant leap, from Mally's system to modern systems of deontic logic, so Mally's pioneering effort deserves rehabilitation rather than contempt.


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logic: deontic | logic: relevance


The author is very grateful to Lou Goble, whose extensive comments on two earlier drafts led to many substantial improvements. The author would also like to thank Lou Goble and Edgar Morscher for making their papers on Anderson's and Mally's deontic logic available to him, Robert K. Meyer for helping him find the matrices used in note 10, and John Slaney for providing him with the proof of II* mentioned in note 8.