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Margaret Lucas Cavendish

First published Fri Oct 16, 2009

Margaret Lucas Cavendish was a philosopher, poet, scientist, fiction-writer, and playwright who lived in the Seventeenth Century. Her work is important for a number of reasons. One is that it lays out an early and very compelling version of the naturalism that is found in current-day philosophy and science. It also offers important insights that bear on recent discussions of the nature and characteristics of intelligence and the question of whether or not the bodies that surround us are intelligent or have an intelligent cause. Another reason that the work of Cavendish is important is that it anticipates some of the central views and arguments that are more commonly associated with figures like Thomas Hobbes and David Hume. She also anticipates discussions in contemporary philosophers like David Chalmers and Colin McGinn about whether or not our ability to understand how matter thinks is relevant to the question of whether it does think.

1. Introduction and Biography

Margaret Lucas was born in 1623 in Colchester, Essex. She did not receive a formal education in disciplines like mathematics, history, philosophy, and the classical languages, but she had access to scholarly libraries and was an avid reader. She began to put her own ideas to paper at a very early age, and although it was regarded as unseemly at the time for a woman to be publicly intellectual, she was able to be an intellectual in private in regular conversations with her middle-brother John. This is noteworthy because John was already a well-established scholar: a student of law, philosophy, and natural science, he was fluent in Hebrew, Latin and Greek, and would eventually become a founding member of the Royal Society (Whitaker 2002, 11–12). In 1643, seeking a life of independence, Lucas applied to be a maid of honor at the court of Queen Henrietta Maria. When the queen was exiled to France in 1644, Lucas accompanied her and shortly thereafter met William Cavendish. They married in 1645, and would remain in exile (in Paris, then Rotterdam, then Antwerp) until the restoration of the crown in 1660 (Battigelli 1998, 1–10).

There are two reasons why it is important to mention the marriage of Margaret Lucas and William Cavendish. One is that in the mid-Seventeenth-Century it was extremely unusual for a publisher to print the philosophical and scientific work of a woman. Cavendish's writings were brilliant, but that of course was not the relevant factor. Her husband William and his brother Charles were extremely well-connected, however, and they promoted her writing to publishers who otherwise would not have given it a chance (Whitaker 2002, 165). The second reason why it is important to mention the marriage of Lucas to Cavendish is that through the “Cavendish Circle” meetings that he had organized in the 1640s, she interacted with such figures as Thomas Hobbes, Rene Descartes, Marin Mersenne, Pierre Gassendi, and Kenelm Digby (Hutton 1997a, 422–3; Whitaker 2002, 92–4; Clucas 1994, 256–64). But these philosophers would not engage with her directly. Unfortunately and sadly for her and for us, she had no written philosophical correspondence with any of these philosophers. When they would not critically correspond with her in print, she engaged their views critically in the form of a correspondence between herself and a fictional third person.[1]

Cavendish lived and wrote in the thick of the mechanistic revolution of the Seventeenth Century, though many of her views—about thinking matter, the nature of scientific explanation, and the intelligibility of the divine—seem almost contemporary. In her own age, she was regarded alternately as mad, pretentious, a curiosity, and a genius. She finally received some much-wanted recognition from her male peers in 1667, when she was offered an extremely rare invitation to participate in a meeting of the Royal Society, though to be sure she was regarded as a spectacle by many in attendance (Whitaker 2002, 291–306). She died in December 1673 and was buried at Westminster Abbey. Over the course of her short life she produced a number of important works in philosophy. These include Philosophical and Physical Opinions (1656), Philosophical Letters (1664), Observations Upon Experimental Philosophy (1666), Grounds of Natural Philosophy (1668), and The Description of a New World, Called the Blazing World (1668).

The central tenet of Cavendish's philosophy is that everything in the universe—including human beings and their minds—is completely material. Her commitment to this tenet is reflected throughout her corpus:

Nature is material, or corporeal, and so are all her Creatures, and whatsoever is not material is no part of Nature, neither doth it belong any ways to Nature….[2]

According to Cavendish, none of the achievements of bodies are to be traced to immaterial agents like God or immaterial finite minds or substantial forms, because bodies have the resources to bring about everything that they do on their own. Bodies are ubiquitous, because there is no vacuum, as extensions of space cannot be extensions of nothing but must be extensions of matter.[3] Every body is infinitely divisible (Cavendish 1666, 125, 263; Cavendish 1668, 239), and some of a body's highly integrated parts are always intelligent and perceptive (Cavendish 1666, 16, 156; Cavendish 1668, 7). As we will see, one of Cavendish's motivations for accepting the latter view is that it makes sense of the order that we encounter in the natural world.

Cavendish is aware that she is writing in a tradition in which the prospect of thinking matter is not going to be taken seriously. In the eyes of many of her contemporaries and predecessors, matter is not only unintelligent, but also inert and utterly worthless. She writes,

I perceive man has a great spleen against self-moving corporeal nature, although himself is part of her, and the reason is his ambition; for he would fain be supreme, and above all other creatures, as more towards a divine nature: he would be a God, if arguments could make him such….[4]

Cavendish does not accept a conception of matter according to which matter is low-grade being. Her view that minds are corporeal is not the view that minds are

composed of raggs and shreds, but it is the purest, simplest and subtillest [sic] matter in Nature. (Cavendish 1664, 180)

Cavendish will argue that the processes that are traditionally identified as material are wondrous and impressive and that the processes that she would identify as material but that others would identify as immaterial are even more so.

2. Intelligent Matter in the History of Philosophy

Cavendish is working within a philosophical tradition in which the doctrine that matter is self-moving and intelligent is almost completely unintelligible. To those of her opponents who allow that the doctrine can be entertained, it is unlikely at best, and if true it is a terrible disappointment.

For example, in Plato we find the view that “the philosopher frees the soul from association with the body as much as possible” (Plato, 64e-65a). For Plato, souls are invisible and intangible and hence indivisible and divine, and bodies are their complete opposite (78b-80b). We know from an analysis of our concept of body, and from our presumably related observation of the sudden inactivity of things that die, that animated bodies have a soul and that bodies on their own are inert (105c-e). A soul is obviously what activates and enlivens a body, and the opposite of a soul, its body, is “death” (105e). Our embodiment and our resulting physical needs incline us to pursue sensible objects, but these are not worthy of our attention, and they interfere with our ability to attend to things that are.

We find a similar contempt for the body in prominent philosophers of later ancient philosophy and in medieval and early modern philosophers as well. In “On Beauty,” Plotinus speaks to “the darkness inherent in matter” (Plotinus, I.6, 37). He praises the sensible, but only to the extent that it imitates immaterial ideas and minds:

This is why fire glows with a beauty beyond all other bodies, for fire holds the rank of idea in their regard. Always struggling aloft, this subtlest of elements is at the last limits of the bodily. …It sparkles and glows like an idea. (Ibid.)

Fire is still material, of course, and material things are no substitute for things that are immaterial and (hence) divine (40). Plotinus continues,

[A]n ugly soul… is friend to filthy pleasures, it lives a life abandoned to bodily sensation and enjoys its depravity. …If someone is immersed in mire or daubed with mud, his native comeliness disappears; all one sees is the mire and mud with which he is covered. Ugliness is due to the alien matter that encrusts him. If he would be attractive once more, he has to wash himself, get clean again, make himself what he was before. Thus we would be right in saying that ugliness of soul comes from its mingling with, fusion with, collapse into the bodily and material…. (39)

In a word, Plotinus thinks that we should do all that we can to mitigate the unfortunate fact of our embodiment and instead engage in philosophical reflection. A hundred years later Augustine repeats the same view exactly:

How highly do you value th[e] will? You surely do not think it should be compared with wealth or honours or physical pleasures, or even all of these together. …Then should we not rejoice a little that we have something in our souls—this very thing that I call a good will—in comparison with which those things we mentioned are utterly worthless…? (Augustine, 19)

For Augustine, body is so bad that sin consists in turning our attention away from eternal things to things that are temporal and corporeal (27).

This kind of thinking finds its way into the 17th Century as well. In the Cartesian (and very Augustinian and Platonic) philosopher Nicholas Malebranche, we find the view that bodies are “inferior things” that are essentially passive and inert (Malebranche 1674–5, VI.ii.3, 447, 448). He brings together the whole spectrum of themes that are advanced by his body-hating predecessors. In Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion, his spokesperson Theodore says to his opponent Aristes that our embodiment is a burden and that we should neutralize it to whatever extent we can:

You are now ready to make thousands and thousands of discoveries in the land of truth. Distinguish ideas from sensations, but distinguish them well…. Your modalities are only darkness, remember that. Silence your senses, your imagination and your passions, and you will hear the pure voice of inner truth, the clear and evident responses of our common master. Never confound evidence, which results from the comparison of ideas, with the vivacity of the sensations which affect and disturb you. The more vivid our sensations, the more they spread darkness. …In a word, avoid all that affect you and quickly embrace all that enlightens you. We must follow Reason despite the seductions, the threats, the insults of the body to which we are united, despite the action of the objects surrounding us. (Malebranche 1688, III.viii, 36)

For Malebranche, the search for truth is very literally a matter of retreating to the study, where the possibility is minimized that we will be distracted by the lures of the sensible world. In Malebranche's (and Cavendish's) contemporary Ralph Cudworth we find a similar disgust for the body. Cudworth argues that there is a hierarchy of being that applies to creatures and that minds are at the top. Bodies are dead and lowly, and are squarely at the bottom:

There is unquestionably, a Scale or Ladder of Nature, and Degrees of Perfection and Entity, one above another, as of Life, Sense, and Cogitation, above Dead, Sensless and Unthinking Matter; or Reason and Understanding above Sense, &c.[5]

Cudworth is certainly aware that the bodies that surround us are active and engage in behaviors that are orderly and (at least apparently) teleological, but none of this is evidence that matter is not dead. Cudworth concludes that because matter is dead, its orderly and purposive behavior can only be explained on the assumption that it is accompanied by a (necessarily immaterial) guide (Cunning 2010).

There are other philosophers in the Seventeenth Century who agree that matter is a detestable sort of being, but conclude that it does not exist. In Anne Conway we find the view that matter is so terrible that God would not, and did not, create it:

how can any dead thing proceed from him or be created by him, such as mere body or matter…? It has truly been said that God does not make death. It is equally true that he did not make any dead thing, for how can a dead thing come from him who is infinite life and love? Or, how can any creature receive so vile and diminished an essence from him (who is so infinitely generous and good)…? (Conway 1690, 45)

For Conway, God only creates souls, and so the everyday objects that surround us are something other than what we thought. Cavendish certainly agrees that nothing answers to the traditional conception of matter, but she does not want to draw the (potentially misleading) conclusion that matter does not exist. Instead, she rejects the traditional conception of matter as inadequate and argues that the things that our concept of matter has always picked out—the things that our language has designated as 'material'—are something more. Unlike many of her philosophical opponents, she is not disappointed by the result that minds are material. She thinks on the contrary that it is a source of hope. For example, if we appreciate that minds are corporeal, we will be able to come up with better and more systematic and less groping treatments of mental illness.[6] As evidence for her view, Cavendish points to the obvious facts that a person's mood and energy are affected by nutrition (Cavendish 1663, 431–2), and that old age and injury to the brain can neutralize some of our cognitive functions (Cavendish 1668 85–6, 113; Cavendish 1663, 334–5). Cavendish is breaking with her tradition and arguing that the fulfillment of a person is not a matter of turning away from the body but understanding all of its dynamics and embracing it.[7]

3. Arguments for Materialism

An important strand in Cavendish's argument for materialism is her defense of the view that matter thinks. If she can successfully defend this view, then the fact of the existence of thinking will not be evidence against the view that everything is material. Her smoking gun argument for the doctrine of thinking matter begins with the premise that only material things move. She writes,

Though Matter might be without Motion, yet Motion cannot be without matter; for it is impossible (in my opinion) that there should be an Immaterial Motion in Nature.[8]

Cavendish then assumes as a datum that when a person travels from one place to another, the person's mind accompanies his body. Here she is anticipating a line of argumentation that we later find in Locke:

No Body can imagine, that his Soul can think, or move a Body at Oxford, whilst he is at London; and cannot but know, that being united to his Body, it constantly changes place all the whole Journey, between Oxford and London, as the Coach, or Horse does, that carries him; and, I think, may be said to be truly all that while in motion…. (Locke 1689, 307)

Here Locke only hints at the conclusion that minds are material, but Cavendish by contrast is not concerned to pull any punches.[9] She takes as axiomatic that a thing can move only if it is material. Mental items like ideas and volitions are the ideas and volitions of a mind, and because a person's mind is sometimes in motion, its ideas and volitions are the modifications of a material thing.

Cavendish also generates an argument for the materiality of thinking from the datum that our minds are housed in our bodies. She assumes that we are being serious when we say that our thinking takes place in our head, and concludes that to the extent to which we are speaking literally our thoughts have a location:

I would ask those, that say the Brain has neither sense, reason, nor self-motion, and therefore no Perception; but that all proceeds from an Immaterial Principle, and an Incorporeal Spirit, distinct from the body, which moveth and actuates corporeal matter; I would fain ask them, I say, where their Immaterial Ideas reside, in what part or place of the Body? …[I]f it [the spirit] have no dimension, how can it be confined in a material body?[10]

Since “[p]lace [is] an attribute that belongs onely to a Body” (Cavendish 1664, 8), our minds are material. Pulling the two arguments together, modifications like motion and location pertain only to bodies, and because our minds travel with our bodies and are housed in them, they are material. Cavendish is in effect trying to corner her opponent into explaining what the sense is in which minds move or have a location if they are not material. A figure like Leibniz is comfortable elucidating the nature of (immaterial) minds in terms of the language of windows, dizziness, ponds and spatial perspective (Monadology, sections 7, 21, 67, 57). Cavendish is insisting that the language of location and dimension applies to bodies alone.

Thus far we have considered the arguments that Cavendish offers for the view that matter thinks. That view is consistent with the view that there exists some thinking that is not material, and it is also consistent with the view that not everything in the universe is material. To generate her more sweeping conclusion, Cavendish needs to supply some additional argumentation.

One premise that she accepts and that would clearly do the job is that the immaterial is unreal and therefore not substantial.[11] A question, of course is how we know this premise to be true. One possibility is that Cavendish is deriving it from a yet more fundamental premise—that everything that is real has to be somewhere and thus have a location and be material. For example, she might be assuming this premise when she asks her opponents “where their Immaterial Ideas reside, in what part or place of the Body….” She clearly thinks that one of the reasons why we are committed to the view that matter thinks is that we hold that thinking occurs in the brain, but she might also be thinking that one of the reasons why we hold that thinking occurs in the brain is that we accept the premise that everything has to occur somewhere, and in the case of thinking the brain is the most obvious candidate. The premise is certainly available in the 17th Century:

The World, (I mean no the Earth onely, that denominates the Lovers of it Worldly men, but the Universe, that is, the whole masse of all things that are) is Corporeall, that is to say, Body; and hath the dimensions of Magnitude, namely, Length, Breadth, and Depth: also every part of Body, is likewise Body, and hath the like dimensions; and consequently every part of the Universe, is Body; and that which is not Body, is no part of the Universe: And because the Universe is All, that which is no part of it, is Nothing; and consequently no where. Nor does it follow from hence, that Spirits are nothing: for they have dimensions, and are therefore really Bodies…. (Hobbes 1651, xlvi.15, 463)

There is no question that Cavendish subscribes to the view that the only things that are real have a location (Hutton 1997a, 426–7). An interpretive problem, though, is that because there are no uncontroversial instances in which she appeals to it as a premise in her argumentation for the view that only matter is real, she may simply subscribe to it as a corollary of that view (as established on other grounds). The most explicit argument that Cavendish offers for the view that only matter is real is from intuitions about the kinds of interactions that bodies are capable of having.

First, she presupposes a standard materialist argument from mind-body interaction: that nothing can interact or come into contact with a body but a body. She writes,

In fine, I cannot conceive, how a Spirit … can have the effects of a body, being none it self; for the effects flow from the cause; and as the cause is, so are its effects…. (Cavendish 1664, 197)

it is, in my opinion, more probable, that one material should act upon another material, or one immaterial should act upon another immaterial, then that an immaterial should act upon a material or corporeal. (Cavendish 1664, 207)

This is a standard kind of argument that we find in philosophers ranging from Lucretius to Gassendi to Spinoza to Searle.[12] But Cavendish is extending the argument. Our bodies interact with our minds, and so our minds must be material; but anything that our minds detect must be material as well. Anything that we know, anything that we try to explain, anything that we theorize about, anything that we encounter, anything of which we can become aware—these are all material. Cavendish writes,

there may be supernatural spiritual beings or substances in Nature, without any hinderance to Matter or corporeal Nature. The same I may say of the natural material, and the divine and supernatural Soul; for though the divine Soul is in a natural body, and both their powers and actions be different, yet they cause no ruine or disturbance to each other….[13]

[Immaterial things are] Non-beings, for they are the weakest of all, and can do her [Nature] the least hurt, as not being able to obstruct real and corporeal actions of Nature…. (Cavendish 1664, 242)

Instead of trying to circumscribe every single existent and then offer an account of each in turn, Cavendish assumes the existence of the material objects in our local surroundings and argues that because our minds detect them, our minds are material, as is everything else that we come to encounter. She writes that

Nature is a corporeal substance, and without a substance Motion cannot be, and without Motion opposition cannot be made, nor any action in Nature…. (Cavendish 1664, 242)

Immaterial things might exist, Cavendish is certainly conceding, but if so they are nothing to us, and are not included in the domain of inquiry when we do metaphysics or science. We cannot speak or even conceive of such things, as our language cannot pick them out:

Wherefore no part of nature (her parts being corporeal) can perceive an immaterial; because it is impossible to have a perception of that which is not perceptible, as not being an object fit or proper for corporeal perception.[14]

all that is called Immaterial, is a Natural Nothing, and an Immaterial Natural Substance, in my opinion, is non-sense…. (Cavendish 1664, 321)

Presumably Cavendish is assuming that the same applies to our term ‘real’, in a way that allows her to say that only material things are real, even if there is some unstateable sense in which other things might exist as well.

For Cavendish, philosophical inquiry is not a matter of attempting to converge on an understanding of all that there is. It is instead a matter of satisfying our curiosity as to the details of those things that have already gotten (or that are capable of getting) our attention. It is a matter of attempting to converge on what our language has designated as the 'universe'. There may be things that are not material, but we cannot speak or think or theorize about them. Strictly speaking we cannot even make the assertion that these things might exist, as we do not have any conception of them. Cavendish makes this assertion (and others like it), but presumably she is borrowing the expression ‘immaterial’ so as to be able to express opposition to the views of her detractors.

There are some other potential problems with Cavendish's argumentation for the view that matter thinks. For example, her argument that it is inconceivable that minds should move and not be material might seem to contradict another argument that features prominently in her system (and that is considered more fully in section 4). The latter argument (in brief) is that most of the things that occur in the natural corporeal world are incomprehensible to us in the sense that we do not understand why bodies have the brute capacities by which they do all that they do. Cavendish considers the example of magnetic attraction, and familiar Humean examples like the ability of certain foods to nourish, and argues that although we do not understand how or why bodies have the capacities that they do, bodies have them nonetheless. She offers all of these examples in defense of her view that matter thinks: we do not understand how it thinks, but that is just a fact about us and what we are in a position to find intelligible. To return to the issue of potential objections to Cavendish's argumentation for materialism, she appears to leave herself open to the objection that although we may not understand how minds could be immaterial and also move, minds might in fact be immaterial movers. Cavendish might reply to this objection by making a distinction between things that are inconceivable in the sense that there is a contradiction in our conception of them, and things that are inconceivable in the weaker sense that we lack the cognitive resources to understand them. If she can argue that as a matter of conceptual fact motion is a matter of changing locations, and that only bodies have location, then there would be a contradiction in saying that a thing moves but is not material. A similar objection applies to Cavendish's argument that we do not understand how immaterial minds and bodies could interact with each other, and presumably she would respond along the same lines. She might insist that interaction is just a matter of making contact, but contact is the kind of thing that can only occur between bodies.

A different objection that Cavendish faces is that there is something odd in saying that minds move or that they are spatial. There are plenty of figures in the history of philosophy who have posited the existence of entities that are not in space, even though these entities still in some way apply to, or are a part of, everyday objects. Most famously, perhaps, is Plato's positing of the existence of numbers, perfect geometrical figures, and other universal entities. Here Cavendish and her opponents are presumably at loggerheads. There may be something odd about saying that minds move, she would insist, but there is something even more odd about saying that the entirety of person can move from one location to another without being accompanied by their mind. Perhaps our minds exist in a non-spatial Platonic realm, or are otherwise non-spatial, but Cavendish is asking that we take seriously the possibility that the language of moving minds might only be unusual against the background of an impoverished conception of matter.

4. The Intelligibility of the Capacities of Matter

One of the objections that Cavendish has to address, courtesy of her 17th-Century opponents, is that the prospect of thinking matter is unintelligible and thus that it is false that all of reality is material. For example, Descartes insists that something is not a property of a body unless there is a conceptual tie between it and the essence of body:

[E]xtension in length, breadth and depth constitutes the nature of corporeal substance; and thought constitutes the nature of thinking substance. Everything else which can be attributed to body presupposes extension, and is merely a mode of an extended thing; and similarly, whatever we find in the mind is simply one of the various modes of thinking. For example, shape is unintelligible except in an extended thing; and motion is unintelligible except as motion in an extended space; while imagination, sensation and will are intelligible only in a thinking thing. (Descartes 1644, I.53, 210–1)

For Descartes, shape is a property of bodies because something cannot be a shape unless it is the shape of an extended thing. Motion is a property of bodies because something cannot have motion unless it has a location and so cannot have motion unless it is extended (Descartes 1644, II.25–27). Our thoughts and volitions, however, cannot be conceived as having length, breadth, or depth. We find a similar argument in the work of Malebranche:

Can a thing extended in length, width, and depth reason, desire, sense? Undoubtedly not, for all the ways of being of such an extended thing consist only in relations of distance; and it is evident that these relations are not perceptions, reasonings, pleasures, desires, sensations—in a word, thoughts. Therefore this I that thinks, my own substance, is not a body, since my perceptions, which surely belong to me, are something entirely different from relations of distance. (Malebranche 1688, 6)

For Malebranche, “the ways of being” of a body are restricted to what can be understood as bearing relations of distance to other things. It is impossible to conceive of a thought as having a size, or as being a certain distance from another thought or from a body, so a thought is not a body or the property of a body (Cunning 2006).

Cavendish could not disagree more. In tackling the question of the nature of mind, her first order of business is to establish that matter thinks. Only then does she consider the question of whether or not we can understand how it thinks. She argues that we do not and that it is not surprising that we do not, given that we do not know the answer to hardly any of the how and why questions about the things that we encounter in nature. For example,

we have only found that Effect of the Load-stone, as to draw Iron to it, but the Attracting motion is in obscurity, being Invisible to the Sense of Man, so that his reason can only Discourse, and bring Probabilities to Strengthen his Arguments, having no Perfect Knowledge in that, nor in any thing else; besides, that Knowledge we have of several things, comes as it were by Chance, or by Experience, for certainly, all the Reason man hath, would never have found out that one Effect of the Load-stone, as to draw Iron, had not Experience or chance presented it to us, nor the Effect of the Needle…. (Cavendish 1663, 191)

For Cavendish, the fact that we do not understand how matter thinks is not evidence that matter does not think. If it was, then we would have evidence against the occurrence of many of the phenomena that we encounter on a daily basis. Anticipating Hume, Cavendish is arguing that particular causal relations are not known a priori, and that if we did not have the relevant experience, every causal connection would seem just as arbitrary as any other (Hume 1748, 112). There is “Natural Magick” (Cavendish 1664, 299), according to Cavendish, even in the case of things that we take to be wholly unmysterious:

the Load-stone may work as various effects upon several Subjects as Fire, but by reason we have not so much Experience of one as the other, the Strangeness creates a Wonder, for the Old saying is, that Ignorance is the Mother of Admiration, but Fire, which produces greater Effects by Invisible motions, yet we stand not at such Amaze, as at the Load-stone, because these Effects are Familiar unto us.[15]

Cavendish is again pre-figuring Hume. The attraction of a magnet is mysterious, she insists, but so is the power of fire, and the “Knowledge we have of several things” is on a par. This is a sustained theme throughout her corpus.[16]

For example, we do not understand why the bodies that are involved in digestion would work together to digest, rather than to do something else (Cavendish 1664, 358–9). Nor do we know why the bodies that compose water and ice are transparent, when the bodies that come together to form other beings are not (Cavendish 1664, 472). We can speculate on these, but in the end

Natures actions are not onely curious, but very various; and not onely various, but very obscure….[17]

Thinking matter is no exception:

you might as well enquire how the world, or any part of it was created, or how the variety of creatures came to be, as ask how Reason and sensitive corporeal Knowledg [sic] was produced.[18]

Bodies in the natural world clearly have capacities, Cavendish is maintaining, and it is by such capacities that they do what they do. We do not understand why a particular body or configuration of bodies would have the particular capacities that it does, and there is no special problem posed by the fact that we cannot understand how matter thinks (Cunning 2006).

As we saw in section III, Cavendish's metaphysics is circumscribed insofar as it does not aim to constitute a complete account of all that there is. In addition, it will provide only limited accounts of the things whose existence it does capture. Cavendish is fully aware of the limits of her project, and indeed part of that project is to motivate the view that we do not understand nearly as much as we ordinarily presume (Clucas 2003, 202–4; Broad 2007, 496–7). Anticipating Hume yet again, and also Locke, she is supposing that once we identify the line beyond which philosophical inquiry is no longer productive, we will devote our energies elsewhere, and to better effect. She writes,

there are none more intemperate than Philosophers; first, in their vain Imaginations of nature; next, in the difficult and nice Rules of Morality: So that this kind of Study kils [sic] all the Industrious Inventions that are beneficial and Easy for the Life of Man, and makes one fit onely to dye, and not to live. But this kind of Study is not wholly to be neglected, but used so much, as to ballance [sic] a Man, though not to fix him; for Natural Philosophy is to be used as a Delight and Recreation in Mens Studies, as Poetry is, since they are both but Fictions, and not a Labour in Mans Life. But many men make their Study their Graves, and bury themselves before they are dead.[19]

Many of the sharpest minds are engaged in the pursuit of goals that are in fact a dead end. These individuals could be working on down-to-earth projects that benefit mankind generally; and by expressing their nature in a more sustainable way, they would be happier themselves.

5. Occasionalism and the Orderly Behavior of Bodies

One of the longstanding puzzles of Seventeenth-Century philosophy and science was how to explain the orderly behavior of bodies. Cudworth lays out the puzzle very neatly. First, he offers a trilemma:

since neither all things are produced Fortuitously, or by the Unguided Mechanism of Matter, nor God himself may reasonably be thought to do all things Immediately and Miraculously; it may well be concluded, that there is a Plastick Nature under him, which as an Inferior and Subordinate Instrument, doth Drudgingly Execute that Part of his Providence, which consists in the Regular and Orderly Motion of Matter. (Cudworth 1678, 150)

Cudworth settles on the third horn of the trilemma after ruling out the other two. Bodies are dumb and dead, and so are not the source of their own order, and it would be beneath God to attend to bodily affairs Himself (Cunning 2003, 348–50). Cudworth also considers a fourth option—that the orderly behavior of bodies is secured by the existence of laws of nature.[20] He concludes that it is not an additional option after all but is subsumed by the other three:

These men (I say) seem not very well to understand themselves in this. Forasmuch as they must of necessity, either suppose these their Laws of Motion to execute themselves, or else be forced perpetually to concern the Deity in the Immediate Motion of every Atom of Matter throughout the Universe, in Order to the Execution and Observation of them… we cannot make any other Conclusion than this, That they do but unskillfully and unawares establish that very Thing which in words they oppose; and that their Laws of Nature concerning Motion, are Really nothing else, but a Plastick Nature… (Cudworth 1678, 151)

Here Cudworth is pointing out, and Cavendish will agree, that we do not account for the orderly behavior of bodies by positing laws of nature if we do not know what a law of nature is or how it operates. On Cudworth's view, the orderly behavior of bodies is secured by immaterial minds (or plastic natures) that attach to bodies and work to keep them on the rails. In something like the way that our (immaterial) minds intelligently guide our bodies, plastic natures intelligently guide the bodies that compose the plant and animal and mineral world. Cavendish agrees with a version of this last statement. She will raise the objection, though, that minds that move and come into contact with and attach to bodies must be material themselves.

Like Cudworth, Cavendish generates her view on the orderly behavior of bodies from a rejection of the Epicurean doctrine that the order that we encounter in nature arises by chance. She writes,

[T]hough the Opinion of Atoms is as Old as from the Time of Epicurus, yet my Conceptions of their Figures, Creating and Disposing, are New, and my Own. ...It is not probable that the Substance of Infinite matter is only Infinite, Small, Senseless Fibres, Moving and Composing all Creatures by Chance, and that Chance should produce all things in such order and Method, unless every Single Atome were Animated Matter, having Animated Motion, which is Sense and Reason, Life and Knowledge.[21]

Something is keeping bodies in line, according to Cavendish, and to do its job it must be active and knowledgeable and perceptive. It cannot be immaterial, however, and so

If nature were not Self-knowing, Self-living, and also Perceptive, she would run into Confusion: for there could be neither Order, nor Method, in Ignorant motion….[22]

Cavendish rejects the view that matter is not capable of engaging in orderly behavior on its own. It does not require the assistance of a plastic nature, for example, and it is not clear how such a thing could be of any help anyway. Cavendish is indeed shocked at the temerity of those who think that we can speak intelligibly of an immaterial divine being but then allow that some of its creatures would be dead and barren. She writes,

I cannot imagine why God should make an Immaterial Spirit to be the Proxy or Vice-gerent of his Power, or the Quarter-master General of his Divine Providence, as your Author is pleased to style it, when he is able to effect it without any Under-Officers, and in a more easie and compendious way, as to impart immediately such self-moving power to Natural Matter, which man attributes to an Incorporeal Spirit. (Cavendish 1664, 215)

Cavendish herself does not think that we can speak intelligibly of God, and so she is presumably making the point that if we could, we would conclude that whatever He would pack into such a proxy He would have packed into bodies in the first place.[23] They would be knowledgeable of the order that they are supposed to realize, and they would know the details of the bodies in their vicinity.[24]

An interesting wrinkle in Cavendish's view of the orderly behavior of bodies is her insistence that when bodies interact they do not transfer motion to each other.[25] Instead, the bodies communicate with each other about how to coordinate their behavior, and each is then the source of its own motion. On the assumption that properties cannot literally slide or hop from one body to another, cases in which one body does take on the motion of another body would be cases in which the second body also takes on the matter that has that motion. But we do not observe a body to become more massive when it is moved as a result of its contact with another body. As Cavendish explains in her description of a hand that moves a bowl,

I cannot think it probable, that any of the animate or self-moving matter in the hand, quits the hand, and enters into the bowl; nor that the animate matter, which is in the bowl, leaves the bowl and enters into the hand. (Cavendish 1664, 445)

Cavendish adds that “if it did, the hand would in a short time become weak and useless, by losing so much substance….”[26] She instead proposes that when one body appears to move another, it is simply an occasion or prompt for the second body to move on its own. The second body moves in the right way in response to the first body (and the other bodies in its vicinity), but only because all bodies are intelligent and perceptive and (for the most part) agreeable, and they communicate with each other about how to proceed.[27]

Bodies are not only the source of their own motion, according to Cavendish. They have enough packed into them that there is a sense in which they are even the cause of their own perceptions. A potentially counter-intuitive view, Cavendish would argue that the available alternative accounts of perception make no sense at all and that her own view is a close and more coherent cousin of the prevailing (mechanist) view of her time. First, she rejects the scholastic doctrine that perception of an object is a matter of receiving from that object an immaterial image or species or form of itself.[28] Such a thing would have to travel from one object to another, and so it would have to be material. Cavendish also rejects the mechanist view according to which perception is a matter of light or other microscopic media travelling from one body to another and then producing an image of the first body in the mind of the second. She worries that

this opinion is like Epicurus' of atoms; but how absurd it is to make senseless corpuscles, the cause of sense and reason, and consequently of perception, is obvious to everyone's apprehension, and needs no demonstration. (Cavendish 1666, 147)

The absurdity of the opinion needs no demonstration, but fortunately Cavendish elaborates. The opinion is absurd because, at the point of interaction or contact with the perceiver, the material media are completely severed from the perceived object, and if they are not themselves copies of that object, and if they do not carry within themselves any image of it, they do not bring along the resources to produce a perception of it specifically, or to produce any perception at all. In her own words, Cavendish says that it is unlikely that

a substanceless and senseless motion, should make a progressive journey from the object to the sentient, and there print, figure, and colour upon the optic sense, by a bare agitation or concussion, so that the perception or apparition (as they call it) of an object, should only be according to the stroke the agitation makes…. (ibid.)

Cavendish instead argues that when one body perceives another, the second body by its own power generates an image or “pattern” of the first body. She writes,

By prints I understand the figures of the objects which are patterned or copied out by the sensitive and rational corporeal figurative motions; as for example, when the sensitive corporeal motions pattern out the figure of an exterior object, and the rational motions again pattern out a figure made by the sensitive motions, those figures of the objects that are patterned out, I name prints … Thus by prints I understand patterns, and by printing patterning. … [It is] not that the exterior object prints its figure upon the exterior sensitive organs, but that the sensitive motions in the organs pattern out the figure of the object. (Cavendish 1664, 539–40)

For Cavendish, perception is an almost entirely active process. Although the objects that we sense put constraints on the images that we produce of them, we produce those images in their entirety.[29] Her mechanist opponents might raise the objection, and we might object as well, that the power by which we produce such images is mysterious and occult, and not at all explanatory. Cavendish has a ready reply. According to the view of her opponents, the microscopic bodies that affect our senses do not have qualities like color or taste or smell, but they somehow are able to make us have sensations of these. On this view, the color- and taste- and odor-less microscopic bodies might serve as a kind of trigger, but the production of the relevant sensations is due in large part to dispositions and capacities that are found on the side of the perceiver.

Cavendish holds that when one body appears to transfer motion to another, the second body moves of its own accord, but does so in the light of its communication with the first body. Part of the story is that the “moved” body forms informational images of the body that “moves” it and of the other bodies in its environment. Commentators have worried that even if we allow Cavendish the view that bodies are active and vital and the source of their own motion, she has no way to account for how it is that bodies communicate so successfully with each other if nothing is transmitted between them. Bodies seem to “suggest” (Detlefsen 2007, 168), or “induc[e]” (O'Neill 2001, xxx), or perhaps they transmit “a sort of signal that triggers the self-motion” of the body that moves (Michaelian 2009, 47), but the question is how they do this. As Detlefsen writes,

Although it is true that there is no transfer of motion between bodies in cases of interaction by occasional causation, there is still some sort of causal interaction [when the first body induces the second body to act]…. How is this possible if nothing is physically transferred? (Detlefsen 2007, 168)

O'Neill points the way to an answer. First, she points out that even though (for Cavendish) a body never transfers its motion to a second body, it still serves as a partial cause of its movement (O'Neill 2001, xxx-xxxi). Cavendish says,

I do not say, that the motion of the hand does not contribute to the motion of the ball; for though the ball has its own natural motion in itself … nevertheless the motion of the ball would not move by such an exterior local motion, did not the motion of the hand, or any other exterior moving body give it occasion to move that way; wherefore the motion of the hand may very well be said to be the cause of that exterior local motion of the ball, but not to be the same motion by which the ball moves. (Cavendish 1664, 447–8)

In line with the results of section III, Cavendish is applying the view that bodies must come into contact with each other in order to interact. She does not think that bodies transfer any motion to each other, but she does think that motion is a precondition for interaction: “and without Motion opposition cannot be made, nor any action in Nature…” (Cavendish 1664, 242). She thus appears to hold that at the point of mutual contact one body triggers the perceptual activity and self-motion of another, but we are still left with the question of how the first body does this. That is, we are left with the question of how the second body comes to acquire all of the information that it needs to act in a coordinated and orderly way. Cavendish does not make clear the process by which this occurs (Detlefsen 2006, 232), but she gives us enough material to allow us to speculate. She says that the second body forms a pattern of the first body; it makes a “copy” of it (Cavendish 1666, 187). If the second body makes a copy of the first, and if it does so at the point of interaction, then one obvious proposal is that the first body presents an image of itself at that point of interaction. The second body then copies it at that location. Cavendish says nothing that rules out this proposal, and in addition she is clear that ideas often move from one location to another. She is also clear that part of what it is for a body to think and be intelligent is for it to have self-knowledge,[30] which other bodies would presumably be able to copy if they were properly situated. Cavendish has to be able to offer an account along these lines if she is going to be able to reject as less plausible the views of her scholastic and mechanist opponents. She herself thinks that qualities like color and smell and taste literally exist in objects and that a perceiving body patterns all of these.[31] If microscopic bodies are not able to literally produce the resulting perception, and if they simply prompt the perceiver to produce the perception on its own, they also make available to the perceiver an image of the perceived body that allows for a comprehensive copy.

6. God

Another recurring theme throughout the work of Cavendish is that we cannot speak meaningfully about God. She offers two different lines of reasoning. One is just an extension of her argument (already discussed in section III) that our terms cannot reach or pick out things that are immaterial. The second is an argument from humility according to which we (finite minds) are presumptuous if we think our cognitive capacities can represent a being that by definition is supposed to be utterly transcendent.

We have already seen Cavendish's argument that the language of immaterial things is nonsensical. She self-consciously applies the argument to language that attempts to refer to God: “when we name God, we name an Unexpressible, and Incomprehensible Being” (Cavendish 1664, 315). The only things of which we can think or speak are the mundane things which surround us, or things that can come into contact with them and us but that are further off. Anything that is spiritual or supernatural is not conceivable, and accordingly “God is a spiritual, supernatural, and incomprehensible infinite…” (Cavendish 1666, 220).

Cavendish also arrives at the view that God is inconceivable by an appeal to epistemic humility. Given the putative nature of the being in question, we would be wise to conclude that any conception that purports to capture that being does not in fact capture it but automatically falls short. Cavendish writes,

Shall or can we bind up Gods actions with our weak opinions and foolish arguments? Truly, if God could not act more then [sic] Man is able to conceive, he were not a God of an infinite Power; but God is Omnipotent, and his actions are infinite, supernatural, and past finding out; wherefore he is rather to be admired, adored and worshipped, then to be ungloriously discoursed of by vain and ambitious men, whose foolish pride and presumption drowns their Natural Judgment and Reason…. (Cavendish 1664, 527)

Cavendish is clear in this passage that if a finite mind is able to subsume a being under its necessarily limited ideas and categories, then whatever that being is, it is not God. Our attempts to investigate the ways and nature of God are hopeless, and accordingly we should respect the firm boundary that separates the province of philosophy and science and the province of faith and religion.[32] Her criticism of the scientist William Harvey is particularly telling:

he doth speak so presumptuously of Gods Actions, Designs, Decrees, Laws, Attributes, Power, and secret Counsels, and describes the manner, how God created all things, and the mixture of the Elements to an hair, as if he had been Gods Counsellor and Assistant in the work of Creation; which whether it be not more impiety, then to say Matter is Infinite, I'le let others judg [sic]. Neither do I think this expression to be against the holy Scripture; for though I speak as a natural Philosopher, and am unwilling to cite the Scripture, which onely treats of things belonging to Faith, and not to Reason; yet I think there is not any passage which plainly denies Matter to be infinite, and Eternal, unless it be drawn by force to that sense…. [A]lso the Scripture says, That Gods ways are unsearchable, and past finding out. (Cavendish 1664, 462)

Cavendish is certainly not the most humble philosopher, but she is assuming that there is a difference between the domains that our minds are capable of investigating and the domains that piety suggests are not accessible to us. Infallibilism with respect to either domain is inappropriate, but it is especially so with respect to the second.[33]

At least three problems arise for Cavendish's view that we cannot speak meaningfully about God. One is that if that view is right, then it is not clear what Cavendish is communicating when she puts forward the view that God's nature is inconceivable and inexpressible. This is a nitpicky objection to Cavendish, of course, as it is not clear how anybody could state a view that is able to express of a particular being that it is not conceivable. Perhaps Cavendish should have limited herself instead to claims about what is conceivable, allowing us to notice what is left out.

A second problem is that some of the arguments that Cavendish appears to be offering as support for her system make use of premises about God and His nature. For example, she says that it follows from the premise that God is good and just that He would make sure that all of His creatures would be able to worship Him, and so would make sure that all of His creatures had knowledge and perception (Cavendish 1664, 518–9). Cavendish is not entitled to make such claims, of course, and so perhaps she is simply speaking in the language of her opponents to show that their own (putative) commitments entail that her view is to be accepted instead. In some instances, though, Cavendish appears to be going further. For example, she speaks of God's creation of everything, including of course the intellectual and perceptual capacities of matter, as a way of making sense of the teleology that we find (and that, given God's features, we would expect to find) in nature.[34] Cavendish has left us with some unresolved tension here, unless she is again resorting to the language of her opponents, or else just speaking in the language of religious orthodoxy. Either way, given her own stance on the intelligibility of claims about God, the plausibility of her materialism will depend on those of her arguments that are devoid of such claims.

A third problem that arises for Cavendish is that if she is right that God is not conceivable, then she cannot separate the provinces of philosophy and religion in a way that makes room for faith. If we literally have no idea of God, then it is difficult to see how we could have any beliefs about such a being, or have faith that it exists. As Descartes remarks,

…[I]f someone says of himself that he does not have any idea of God,… he is making the most impious confession he could make. He is saying that he does not know God by natural reason, but also that neither faith nor any other means could give him any knowledge of God. For if one has no idea, i.e. no perception which corresponds to the meaning of the word ‘God’, it is no use saying that one believes that God exists. One might as well say that one believes that nothing exists, thus remaining in the abyss of impiety and the depths of ignorance. (Descartes 1641, 273)

God is not to be understood, according to Cavendish, but “is rather to be admired, adored and worshipped.” We do not have any idea of Him, however, and so it is difficult to make sense of how our Intentional states could ever point in His direction.

For all of its problems, one of the reasons that it is important to remark upon Cavendish's view on our inability to conceive of God is to highlight that even though she thinks that the orderly behavior of bodies is due to intelligence, she does not subscribe to any version of a theory of intelligent design. There is a difference, of course, between the thesis that the orderly behavior of bodies is due to the intelligence and perceptual capacities of the bodies themselves and the thesis that it is due to the intelligence of a designer. Cavendish is assuming, though, that either thesis has to posit the existence of intelligent and perceptive matter. If God had created matter that was not equipped with the resources to detect the matter around it and act in ways that are coordinated, chaos would ensue almost immediately. Cavendish is forced to admit that if matter is intelligent and perceptive, there is no further explanation as to why it is intelligent and perceptive. It just is. It is something that has always existed (Cavendish 1664, 14, 462) and that has the resources within itself to bring about all the things that we observe it to bring about on a daily basis. She would side with Hume on the question of whether or not it is more likely that the only beings that exist with such resources are immaterial:

…when it is asked, what cause produces order in the ideas of the supreme Being, can any other reason be assigned by you, anthropomorphites, than that it is a rational faculty, and that such is the nature of the Deity? But why a similar answer will not be equally satisfactory in accounting for the order of the world, without having recourse to any such intelligent Creator as you insist on, may be difficult to determine. It is only to say, that such is the nature of material objects, and that they are all originally possessed of a faculty of order and proportion. (Hume 1779, dialogue 4, p. 65)

For Cavendish, matter has a tremendous number of resources built into it. If it is eternal, then we can offer no account of its origin, but in this respect the competing thesis that God is the source of the order in the universe is on a par. The latter thesis has additional problems, however: if God is wholly immaterial, then it is not clear how He could produce matter, or how He would be able to interact with it once it was made (Cavendish 1666, 199–200; Cavendish 1668, 241; Detlefsen 2009, 430); and if God's supremacy is inversely proportional to our finite ability to conceive of Him, it is difficult to see how our confidence about His nature and operations could be anything more than arrogance. Cavendish thinks that the view that matter has always existed and is the source of its own order is not only a contender, but is really the only option.

7. Conclusion

Cavendish's work was not taken very seriously in the Seventeenth Century, but it is certainly relevant today. She is presumably right to warn about the inconsistency in insisting that God is utterly transcendent while being utterly confident in putting forward claims about His nature. She has also anticipated a contemporary emphasis on the study of the brain and body in addressing mental health. In addition, she has made a contribution to the current debate about whether or not our inability to understand how matter thinks is relevant to the question of whether or not it does think (McGinn 1999, 6–18; Chalmers 1996, 3–6; and Nagel 1974, 435–450). She is also important insofar as she anticipates the arguments and views of early modern thinkers who are firmly in the canon and who already secure a great deal of attention.


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God: concepts of | Hume, David | naturalism | occasionalism | physicalism | scientific explanation