Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Feb 22, 2007

The term ‘naturalism’ has no very precise meaning in contemporary philosophy. Its current usage derives from debates in America in the first half of the last century. The self-proclaimed ‘naturalists’ from that period included John Dewey, Ernest Nagel, Sidney Hook and Roy Wood Sellars. These philosophers aimed to ally philosophy more closely with science. They urged that reality is exhausted by nature, containing nothing ‘supernatural’, and that the scientific method should be used to investigate all areas of reality, including the ‘human spirit’ (Krikorian 1944, Kim 2003).

So understood, ‘naturalism’ is not a particularly informative term as applied to contemporary philosophers. The great majority of contemporary philosophers would happily accept naturalism as just characterized—that is, they would both reject ‘supernatural’ entities, and allow that science is a possible route (if not necessarily the only one) to important truths about the ‘human spirit’.

Even so, this entry will not aim to pin down any more informative definition of ‘naturalism’. It would be fruitless to try to adjudicate some official way of understanding the term. Different contemporary philosophers interpret ‘naturalism’ differently. This disagreement about usage is no accident. For better or worse, ‘naturalism’ is widely viewed as a positive term in philosophical circles—few active philosophers nowadays are happy to announce themselves as ‘non-naturalists’.[1] This inevitably leads to a divergence in understanding the requirements of ‘naturalism’. Those philosophers with relatively weak naturalist commitments are inclined to understand ‘naturalism’ in a unrestrictive way, in order not to disqualify themselves as ‘naturalists’, while those who uphold stronger naturalist doctrines are happy to set the bar for ‘naturalism’ higher.[2]

Rather than getting bogged down in an essentially definitional issue, this entry will adopt a different strategy. It will outline a range of philosophical commitments of a generally naturalist stamp, and comment on their philosophical cogency. The primary focus will be on whether these commitments should be upheld, rather than on whether they are definitive of ‘naturalism’. The important thing is to articulate and assess the reasoning that has led philosophers in a generally naturalist direction, not to stipulate how far you need to travel along this path before you can count yourself as a paid-up ‘naturalist’.

As indicated by the above characterization of the mid-twentieth-century American movement, naturalism can intuitively be separated into an ontological and a methodological component. The ontological component is concerned with the contents of reality, asserting that reality has no place for ‘supernatural’ or other ‘spooky’ kinds of entity. By contrast, the methodological component is concerned with the ways of investigating reality, and claims some kind of general authority for the scientific method. Correspondingly, this entry will have two main sections, the first devoted to ontological naturalism, the second to methodological naturalism.

Of course, naturalist commitments of both ontological and methodological kinds can be significant in areas other than philosophy. The modern history of psychology, biology, social science and even physics itself can usefully be seen as hinging on the acceptance or rejection of naturalist ontological principles and methodological precepts. This entry, however, will be concerned solely with naturalist doctrines that are specific to philosophy. So the first part of this entry, on ontological naturalism, will be concerned specifically with views about the general contents of reality that are motivated by philosophical argument and analysis. And the second part, on methodological naturalism, will focus specifically on methodological debates that bear on philosophical practice, and in particular on the question of whether philosophy can manage with scientific methods alone.

1. Ontological Naturalism

1.1 Making a Causal Difference

The driving motivation for ontological naturalism is the need to explain how different kinds of things can make a causal difference to the spatiotemporal world. Thus many contemporary thinkers adopt a naturalist view of the mental realm because they think that otherwise we will be unable to explain how mental processes can causally influence non-mental processes. Similar considerations motivate naturalist views of the biological realm, the social realm, and so on.

It may not be immediately obvious why this need to account for causal influence should impose any substantial ‘naturalist’ constraints on some category. After all, there seems nothing a priori incoherent in the idea of radically ‘supernatural’ events exerting a causal influence on ordinary spatiotemporal processes, as is testified by the conceptual cogency of traditional stories about the worldly interventions of immaterial deities and other outlandish beings.

However, there may be a posteriori objections to such non-natural spatiotemporal interventions, even if there are no a priori objections. We shall see below how modern scientific theory places strong restrictions on the kinds of entities that can have physical effects. Given that mental, biological and social phenomena do have such effects, it follows that they must satisfy the relevant restrictions.

Note how this kind of argument bites directly only on those categories that do have physical effects. It places no immediate constraints on categories that lack any such effects, which arguably include the mathematical and modal realms, and perhaps the normative realm. We shall return to the question of whether there are any further reasons for ontologically naturalist views about such non-efficacious categories in sections 1.7 and 1.8 below.

1.2 Modern Science and Causal Influence

There is an interesting history to modern science's views about the kinds of things that can produce physical effects. The mechanistic physics of the seventeenth century allowed only a very narrow range of such causes. Early Newtonian physics was more liberal, and indeed did not impose any real restrictions on possible causes of physical effects. However, the discovery of the conservation of energy in the middle of the nineteenth century limited the range of possible causes once more. Moreover, twentieth-century physiological research has arguably provided evidence for yet further restrictions.

It will be worth briefly rehearsing this history, if only to forestall a common reaction to ontological naturalism. It is sometimes suggested that ontological naturalism rests, not on reasoned argument, but on some kind of unargued commitment, some ultimate decision to nail one's philosophical colours to the naturalist mast.[3] And this diagnosis seems to be supported by the historical contingency of naturalist doctrines, and in particular by the fact that they have become widely popular only in the past few decades. However, familiarity with the relevant scientific history casts the matter in a different light. It turns out that naturalist doctrines, far from varying with ephemeral fashion, are closely responsive to received scientific opinion about the range of causes that can have physical effects.

The ‘mechanical philosophers’ of the early seventeenth century held that any material body maintains a constant velocity unless acted on, and moreover held that all action is due to impact between one material particle and another. So stated, the mechanical philosophy immediately precludes anything except impacting material particles from producing physical effects. Leibniz saw this clearly, and concluded that it discredited Descartes' interactive dualism, which had a non-material mind influencing the physical world (Woodhouse, 1985). (Of course, Leibniz did not therewith reject dualism, but instead opted for ‘pre-established harmony’. Views which avoid ontological naturalistic views of the mind by denying its causal efficacy will be discussed further in section 1.6 below.)

At the end of the seventeenth century Newtonian physics replaced the mechanical philosophy of Descartes and Leibniz. This reinstated the possibility of interactive dualism, since it allowed disembodied forces as well as impacts to cause physical effects. Newtonian physics was quite open-ended about the kinds of forces that exist. Early Newtonians posited distinctive mental and vital forces alongside magnetic, chemical, cohesive, gravitational and impact forces. Accordingly, they took sui generis mental action in the material world to be perfectly consistent with the principle of physics. Moreover, there is nothing in the original principles of Newtonian mechanics to stop mental forces arising unpredictably and spontaneously, in line with common assumptions about the operation of the mind (Papineau 2002, Appendix Section 3).

In the middle of the nineteenth century the conservation of kinetic plus potential energy came to be accepted as a basic principle of physics (Elkana 1974). In itself this does not rule out distinct mental or vital forces, for there is no reason why such forces should not be ‘conservative’, operating in such a way as to compensate losses of kinetic energy by gains in potential energy and vice versa. (The term ‘nervous energy’ is a relic of the widespread late nineteenth-century assumption that mental processes store up a species of potential energy that is then released in action.) However, the conservation of energy does imply that any such special forces must be governed by strict deterministic laws: if mental or vital forces arose spontaneously, then there would be nothing to ensure that they never led to energy increases.

During the course of the twentieth century received scientific opinion became even more restrictive about possible causes of physical effects, and came to reject sui generis mental or vital causes, even of a law-governed and predictable kind. Detailed physiological research, especially into nerve cells, gave no indication of any physical effects that cannot be explained in terms of basic physical forces that also occur outside living bodies. By the middle of the twentieth century, belief in sui generis mental or vital forces had become a minority view. This led to the widespread acceptance of the doctrine now known as the ‘causal closure’ or the ‘causal completeness’ of the physical realm, according to which all physical effects can be accounted for by basic physical causes (where ‘physical’ can be understood as referring to some list of fundamental forces).[4]

1.3 Naturalism and Physicalism

This historical sketch casts light on the evolution of ontologically naturalist doctrines. During the eighteenth-century heyday of Newtonian physics, science raised no objections to non-physical causes of physical effects. As a result, the default philosophical view was a non-naturalist interactive pluralism which recognized a wide range of such non-physical influences, including spontaneous mental influences (or ‘determinations of the soul’ as they would then have been called).

The nineteenth-century discovery of the conservation of energy continued to allow that sui generis non-physical forces can interact with the physical world, but required that they be governed by strict force laws. This gave rise to an initial wave of naturalist doctrines around the beginning of the twentieth century. Sui generis mental forces were still widely accepted, but an extensive philosophical debate about the significance of the conservation of energy led to a widespread recognition that any such mental forces would need to be law-governed and thus amenable to scientific investigation along with more familiar physical forces.[5]

By the middle of the twentieth century, the acceptance of the casual closure of the physical realm led to even stronger naturalist views. The causal closure thesis implies that any mental and biological causes must themselves be physically constituted, if they are to produce physical effects. It thus gives rise to a particularly strong form of ontological naturalism, namely the physicalist doctrine that any state that has physical effects must itself be physical.

From the 1950s onwards, philosophers began to formulate arguments for ontological physicalism. Some of these arguments appealed explicitly to the causal closure of the physical realm (Feigl 1958, Oppenheim and Putnam 1958). In other cases, the reliance on causal closure lay below the surface. However, it is not hard to see that even in these latter cases the causal closure thesis played a crucial role.

Thus, for example, consider J.J.C. Smart's (1958) thought that we should identify mental states with brain states, for otherwise those mental states would be "nomological danglers" which play no role in the explanation of behaviour. Or take David Lewis's (1966) and David Armstrong's (1968) argument that, since mental states are picked out by their causal roles, and since we know that physical states play these roles, mental states must be identical with those physical states. Again, consider Donald Davidson's (1970) argument that, since the only laws governing behaviour are those connecting behaviour with physical antecedents, mental events can only be causes of behaviour if they are identical with those physical antecedents. At first sight, it may not be obvious that these arguments require the causal closure thesis. But a moment's thought will show that none of these arguments would remain cogent if the closure thesis were not true, and that some physical effects (the movement of matter in arms, perhaps, or the firings of the motor neurones which instigate those movements) were not determined by prior physical causes at all, but by sui generis mental causes.

Sometimes it is suggested that the indeterminism of modern quantum mechanics creates room for sui generis non-physical causes to influence the physical world. However, even if quantum mechanics implies that some physical effects are themselves undetermined, it provides no reason to doubt a quantum version of the causal closure thesis, to the effect that the chances of those effects are fully fixed by prior physical circumstances. And this alone is enough to rule out sui generis non-physical causes. For such sui generis causes, if they are to be genuinely efficiacious, must presumably make an independent difference to the chances of physical effects, and this in itself would be inconsistent with the quantum causal closure claim that such chances are already fixed by prior physical circumstances. Once more, it seems that anything that makes a difference to the physical realm must itself be physical.

1.4 Varieties of Physicalism

Even if it is agreed that anything with physical effects must in some sense be physical, there is plenty of room to debate exactly what ontologically naturalist doctrines follow. The causal closure thesis says that (the chance of) every physical effect is fixed by a fully physical prior history. So, to avoid an unacceptable proliferation of causes, any prima facie non-physical cause of a physical effect will need to be included in that physical history. But what exactly does this require? The contemporary literature offers a wide range of answers to this question.

In part the issue hinges on the ontological status of causes. Some philosophers think of causes as particular events, considered in abstraction from any properties they may possess (Davidson 1980). Given this view of causation, a mental or other apparently non-physical cause will be the same as some physical cause as long as it is constituted by the same particular (or ‘token’) event. For example, a given feeling and a given brain event will count as the same cause as long as they are constituted by the same token event.

However, it is widely agreed that this kind of ‘token identity’ on its own fails to ensure that prima facie non-physical causes can make any real difference to physical effects. To see why, note that token identity is a very weak doctrine: it does not imply any relationship at all between the properties involved in the physical and non-physical cause; it is enough that the same particular entity should possess both these properties. Compare the way in which an apple's shape and colour are both possessed by the same particular thing, namely that apple. It seems wrong to conclude on this account that the apple's colour causes what its shape causes. Similarly, it seems unwarranted to conclude that someone's feelings cause what that person's neuronal discharges cause, simply on the grounds that these are both aspects of the same particular event. This could be true, and yet the mental property of the event could be entirely irrelevant to any subsequent physical effects. Token identity on its own thus seems to leave it open that the mental and other prima facie non-physical properties are ‘epiphenomenal’, exerting no real influence on effects that are already fixed by physical processes (Honderich 1982, Yalowitz 2006 Section 6, Robb and Heil 2005 Section 5).

These considerations argue that causation depends on properties as well as particulars. There are various accounts of causation that respect this requirement, the differences between which do not matter for present purposes. The important point is that, if mental and other prima facie non-physical causes are to be equated with physical causes, non-physical properties must somehow be constituted by physical properties. If your anger is to cause what your brain state causes, the property of being angry cannot be ontologically independent of the relevant brain properties.

So much is agreed by nearly all contemporary naturalists. At this point, however, consensus ends. One school holds that epiphenomenalism can only be avoided by type-identity, the strict identity of the relevant prima facie non-physical properties with physical properties. On the other side stand ‘non-reductive’ physicalists, who hold that the causal efficacy of non-physical properties will be respected as long as they are ‘realized by’ physical properties, even if they are not reductively identified with them.

Type-identity is the most obvious way to ensure that non-physical and physical causes coincide: if exactly the same particulars and properties comprise a non-physical and a physical cause, the two causes will certainly themselves be fully identical. Still, type-identity is a very strong doctrine. Type identity about thoughts, for example, would imply that the property of thinking about the square root of two is identical with some physical property. And this seems highly implausible. Even if all human beings with this thought must be distinguished by some common physical property of their brains—which itself seems highly unlikely—there remains the argument that other life-forms, or intelligent androids, will also be able to think about the square root of two, even though their brains may share no significant physical properties with ours (cf. Bickle 2006).

This ‘variable realization’ argument has led many philosophers to seek an alternative way of reconciling the efficacy of non-physical causes with the causal closure thesis, one which does not require the strict identity of non-physical and physical properties. The general idea of this ‘non-reductive physicalism’ is to allow that a given non-physical property can be ‘realized’ by different physical properties in different cases. There are various ways of filling out this idea. A common feature is the requirement that non-physical properties should metaphysically supervene on physical properties, in the sense that any two beings who share all physical properties will necessarily share the same non-physical properties, even though the physical properties which so realize the non-physical ones can be different in different beings. This arguably ensures that nothing more is required for any specific instantiation of a non-physical property than its physical realization—even God could not have created your brain states without thereby creating your feelings—yet avoids any reductive identification of non-physical properties with physical ones. (This is a rough sketch of the supervenience formulation of physicalism. For more see Stoljar 2001 Sections 2 and 3.)

Some philosophers object that non-reductive physicalism does not in fact satisfy the original motivation for physicalism, since it fails to reconcile the efficacy of non-physical causes with the causal closure thesis (Kim 1993. Robb and Heil 2005 Section 6). According to non-reductive physicalism, prima facie non-physical properties are not type-identical with any strictly physical properties, even though they supervene on them. However, if causes are in some way property-involving, this then seems to imply that any prima facie non-physical cause will be distinct from any physical cause. Opponents of non-reductive physicalism object that this gives us an unacceptable proliferation of causes for the physical effects of non-physical causes—both the physical cause implied by the causal closure thesis and the distinct non-physical cause. In response, advocates of non-reductive physicalism respond that there is nothing wrong with such an apparent duplication of causes if it is also specified that the latter metaphysically supervene on the former.

The issue here hinges on the acceptability of different kinds of overdetermination (Bennett 2003). All can agree that it would be absurd if the physical effects of non-physical causes always had two completely independent causes. This much was assumed by the original causal argument for physicalism, which reasoned that no sui generis non-physical state of affairs can cause some effect that already has a full physical cause. However, even if ‘strong overdetermination’ by two ontologically independent causes is so ruled out, this does not necessarily preclude ‘weak overdetermination’ by both a physical cause and a metaphysically supervenient non-physical cause. Advocates of non-reductive physicalism argue that this kind of overdetermination is benign, on the grounds that the two causes are not ontologically distinct—the non-physical cause isn't genuinely additional to the physical cause (nothing more is needed for your feelings than your brain states).

1.5 Limitations of Supervenience

There is room to query whether non-reductive physicalism amounts to a substantial form of naturalism. After all, the requirement that some category of properties metaphysically supervenes on physical properties is not a strong one. A very wide range of properties would seem intuitively to satisfy this requirement, including moral and aesthetic properties, along with any mental, biological, and social properties. (Can two physically identical things be different with respect to wickedness or beauty?) Supervenience on the physical realm is thus a far weaker requirement than that some property should enter into natural laws, say, or be analysable by the methods of the natural sciences. Indeed some philosophers are explicitly anti-naturalist about categories that they allow to supervene on the physical—we need only think of G.E. Moore on moral properties, or Donald Davidson and his followers on mental properties (Moore 1903, Davidson 1980).

In response, those of naturalist sympathies are likely to point out that any viable response to the argument from causal closure will require more than metaphysical supervenience alone (Horgan 1993, Wilson 1999). Supervenience is at least necessary, if non-reductive physicalists are to avoid the absurdity of strong overdetermination. But something more than mere supervenience is arguably needed if non-reductive physicalists are to make good their claim that non-physical states cause the physical effects that their realizers cause. Metaphysical supervenience alone does not ensure this. (Suppose ricketiness, in a car, is defined as the property of having some loose part. Then ricketiness will supervene on physical properties. In a given car, it may be realized by a disconnected wire between ignition and starter motor. This disconnected wire will cause this car not to start. But it doesn't follow that this car's then not starting will be caused by its property of ricketiness. Most rickety cars start perfectly well.)

So it looks as if the causal closure argument requires not only that non-physical properties metaphysically supervene on physical properties, but that they be natural in some stronger sense, so as to qualify as causes of those properties' effects. It is a much-discussed issue how this demand can be satisfied. Some philosophers seek to meet it by offering a further account of the nature of the relevant non-physical properties, for example, that they are second-order role properties whose presence is constituted by some first-order property with a specified causal role (Levin 2004). Others suggest that the crucial feature is how these properties feature in certain laws (Fodor 1974) or alternatively the degree of their explanatory relevance to physical effects (Yablo 1992). And reductive physicalists will insist that the demand can only be met by type-identifying prima-facie non-physical properties with physical properties after all.[6]

There is no agreed view on the requirements for prima facie non-physical properties to have physical effects. This difficult issue hinges, inter alia, on the nature of the causal relation itself, and it would take us too far afield to pursue it further here. For the purpose of this entry, we need only note that the causal closure argument seems to require that properties with physical effects must be ‘natural’ in some sense that is stronger than metaphysical supervenience on physical properties. Beyond that, we can leave it open exactly what this extra strength requires.

1.6 Mental Properties and the Causal Closure Arguments

Some philosophers hold that mental states escape the causal argument, on the grounds that mental states cause actions rather than any physical effects. Actions are not part of the subject matter of the physical sciences, and so a fortiori not the kinds of effects guaranteed to have physical causes by any casual closure thesis. So there is no reason, according to this line of thought, to suppose that the status of mental states as causes of actions is threatened by physics, nor therefore any reason to think that mental states must in some sense be realized by physical states (Hornsby 1997, Sturgeon 1998).

The obvious problem with this line of argument is that actions aren't the only effects of mental states. On occasion mental states also cause unequivocally physical effects. Fast Eddie Felsen's desire to move a pool ball in a certain direction will characteristically have just that effect. And now the causal closure argument bites once more. The snooker ball's motion has a purely physical cause, by the causal closure thesis. This will pre-empt Fast Eddie's desire as a cause of that motion, unless that desire is in some sense physically realized (Balog 1999, Witmer 2000).

Other philosophers have a different reason for saying that mental states, or more particularly conscious mental states, don't have physical effects. They think that there are strong independent arguments to show that conscious states can't possibly supervene metaphysically on physical states. Putting this together with the closure claim that physical effects always have physical causes, and abjuring the idea that the physical effects of conscious causes are strongly overdetermined by both a physical cause and an ontologically independent conscious cause, they conclude that conscious states must be ‘epiphenomenal’, lacking any power to causally influence the physical realm (Jackson 1981; 1985. See also Chalmers 1995).[7]

The rejection of physicalism about conscious properties certainly has the backing of intuition. (Don't zombies—beings who are physically exactly like humans but have no conscious life—seem intuitively possible?) However, whether this intuition can be parlayed into a sound argument is a highly controversial issue, and one that lies beyond the scope of this entry. A majority of contemporary philosophers probably hold that physicalism can resist these arguments. But a significant minority take the other side.[8]

If the majority are right, and physicalism about conscious states is not ruled out by independent arguments, then physicalism seems clearly preferable to epiphenomenalism. In itself, epiphenomenalism is not an attractive position. It requires us to suppose that conscious states, even though they are caused by processes in the physical world, have no effects on that world. This is a very odd kind of causal structure. Nature displays no other examples of such one-way causal intercourse between realms. By contrast, a physicalist naturalism about conscious states will integrate the mental realm with the causal unfolding of the spatiotemporal world in an entirely familiar way. Given this, general principles of theory choice would seem to argue strongly for physicalism over epiphenomenalism.[9]

If we focus on this last point, we may start wondering why the causal closure thesis is so important. If general principles of theory choice can justify physicalism, why bring in all the complications associated with causal closure? The answer is that causal closure is needed to rule out interactionist dualism. General principles of theory choice may dismiss epiphenomenalism in favour of physicalism, but they do not similarly discredit interactionist dualism. As the brief historical sketch earlier will have made clear, interactionist dualism offers a perfectly straightforward theoretical option requiring no commitment to any bizarre causal structures. Certainly the historical norm has been to regard it as the default account of the causal role of the mental realm.[10] Given this, arguments from theoretical simplicity cut no ice against interactionist dualism. Rather, the case against interactionist dualism hinges crucially on the empirical thesis that all physical effects already have physical causes. It is specifically this claim that makes it difficult to see how dualist states can make a causal difference to the physical world.

It is sometimes suggested that physicalism about the mind can be vindicated by an ‘inference to the best explanation’. The thought here is that there are many well-established synchronic correlations between mental states and brain states, and that physicalism is a ‘better explanation’ of these correlations than epiphenomenalism (Hill 1991, Hill and McLaughlin 1999). From the perspective outlined here, this starts the argument in the middle rather than the beginning, by simply assuming the relevant mind-brain correlations. This assumption of pervasive synchronic mind-brain correlations is only plausible if interactionist dualism has already been ruled out. After all, if we believed interactionist dualism, then we wouldn't think dualist mental states needed any help from synchronic neural correlates to produce physical effects. And it is implausible to suppose that we have direct empirical evidence, prior to the rejection of interactive dualism, for pervasive mind-brain correlations, given the paucity of any explicit examples of well-established neural correlates for specific mental states. Rather our rationale for believing in such correlations must be that the causal closure of the physical realm eliminates interactive dualism, whence we infer that mental states can only systematically precede physical effects if they are correlated with the physical causes of those effects.

1.7 Normative Facts

G.E. Moore's famous ‘open question’ argument is designed to show that moral facts cannot possibly be identical to natural facts. Suppose the natural properties of some situation are completely specified. It will always remain an open question, argued Moore, whether that situation is morally good or bad. (Moore 1903.)

Moore took this argument to show that moral facts comprise a distinct species of non-natural fact. However, any such non-naturalist view of morality faces immediate difficulties, deriving ultimately from the kind of causal closure thesis discussed above. If all physical effects are due to a limited range of natural causes, and if moral facts lie outside this range, then it follow that moral facts can never make any difference to what happens in the physical world (Harman, 1986). At first sight this may seem tolerable (perhaps moral facts indeed don't have any physical effects). But it has very awkward epistemological consequences. For beings like us, knowledge of the spatiotemporal world is mediated by physical processes involving our sense organs and cognitive systems. If moral facts cannot influence the physical world, then it is hard to see how we can have any knowledge of them.

The traditional non-naturalist answer to this problem is to posit a non-natural faculty of ‘moral intuition’ that gives us some kind of direct access to the moral realm (Ridge 2006, Section 3). However, causal closure once more makes it difficult to make good sense of this suggestion Presumably at some point the posited intuitive faculty will need to make a causal difference in the physical world (by affecting what people say and do, for example). And at this point the causal closure argument will bite once more, to show that a non-natural intuitive faculty would inevitably commit us to the absurdity of strong overdetermination.[11]

In the face of this kind of difficulty, most contemporary moral philosophers have turned away from moral non-naturalism and opted for some species of naturalist view. There are two quite different ways to go here. One genus of moral naturalism is irrealist about moral facts. This strategy includes non-cognitivist views like emotivism and prescriptivism which deny that moral judgements express beliefs (Hare 1952, Blackburn 1993, Gibbard 2003), and also error-theoretic and fictionalist views that accept that moral judgements do express beliefs about moral properties, but deny that any such properties exist (Mackie 1977, Kalderon 2005). These irrealist views are naturalist in the sense that they do not posit any moral facts in accounting for moral practice, and a fortiori do not posit any non-natural moral facts. Rather they aim to account for the significance of moral practice by offering naturalist accounts of the psychological and social processes that underpin it.[12]

The other genus of moral naturalism is realist. This position agrees with moral non-naturalism against irrealism that moral properties really exist, but seeks to locate them in the natural realm rather than in some sui generis non-natural realm. Moral naturalists of this stripe must thus reject Moore's open question argument. They have various options here. One is to insist that Moore's posited openness is relatively superficial, and that there is no principled barrier to inferring moral facts a priori from the non-moral natural facts, even if such inferences will sometimes require a great deal of information and reflection. Another is to argue that the connections between moral facts and non-moral natural facts is a posteriori, akin to the connection between water and H2O, and that therefore Moore's openness only points to a conceptual gap, not a metaphysical one (Ridge 2006, Section 2).

Either way, realist moral naturalism will avoid the immediate epistemological difficulties faced by their non-naturalist realist counterparts. If moral facts are themselves natural facts, then there will be no barrier to their having a causal influence on the perceptual systems of human beings.

Realist moral naturalism also seems better off than non-naturalist realism in two further respects. The first relates to the motivating force of moral facts. It is hard to see how non-natural moral facts could have any motivating force: after all, if such facts are incapable of having effects of any kind, they will a fortiori be incapable of motivating human beings. True, moral motivation is not a straightforward matter for naturalist moral realists either: if moral facts are natural, then won't it be possible for someone to recognize their existence, yet not be correspondingly moved to action in any way? However, there are various responses naturalist realists can make to this challenge. (Ridge 2006 Section 5, Lenman 2006 Section 2.) The other point on which naturalist moral realists seem better placed than non-naturalists has to do with explaining the supervenience of moral facts on other facts. As noted earlier, intuition seems to demand that two situations that are identical with respect to physical properties will also be morally identical. For naturalists, this will follow from general naturalist principles. Non-naturalists, by contrast, would seem to lack any obvious explanation of why moral facts should so supervene on physical facts (Ridge 2006 Section 6).

Of course, it is one thing to argue that naturalist realism about morality is preferable to non-naturalist realism. This does not necessarily show that it is preferable to irrealist versions of naturalism. Irrealist theories also offer plausible accounts of the content of moral judgements, moral motivation, and the apparent supervenience of moral claims. There is more to say about the relative merits of naturalist realism and naturalist irrealism, but we cannot pursue the topic further here.

So far this sub-section has focused on morality. But there are other kinds of putative normative facts, including aesthetic norms, prudential norms, norms of rationality, and (possibly) norms of manners. The constraints placed on theories of morality by naturalist considerations will apply, mutatis mutandis, to these cases too, militating against theories that posit non-natural normative facts and in favour of naturalist alternatives, of either a realist or irrealist stripe.

A further issue concerns the relations between these different types of norms. Are they independent, or do some reduce to others? (For example, do aesthetic norms reduce to moral norms?) This topic is orthogonal to the issue of realism versus irrealism, and there is no question of pursuing it in any detail here, but one particular aspect is worth remarking on. The term ‘naturalized epistemology’ covers a number of different ideas, some of which relate to methodological issues rather than ontological ones, but one central strand in naturalized epistemology is the thought that there are no sui generis norms of theoretical rationality. (Feldman 2006.) Rather, ways of arriving at beliefs are to be assessed in terms of their consequences, including most centrally their reliability at producing true beliefs. These consequentialist assessments will give rise to evaluations of ways of arriving at beliefs, but these evaluations will be derivative, depending on the non-epistemological value of the consequences, of moral or other kinds, and not on any independent norms governing the formation of beliefs.

1.8 Mathematical and Modal Facts

Normative facts are not the only category of putative facts that arguably have no causal impact on the physical world. Mathematical facts also seem similarly causally inefficacious, as do modal facts concerning what is necessary and possible. However, the philosophical geography in these cases does not fully mirror the normative case. This is because few philosophers want to argue that mathematical and modal facts can be identified with natural facts, in a manner parallel to the naturalist realist treatment of moral facts. Still, this does not mean that irrealist views of mathematics and modality are the only remaining option. The peculiar features of mathematics and modality means that there is rather more room for non-naturalist versions of realism that there is in the normative case.

The barrier to identifying mathematical and modal facts with physically efficacious natural facts, along the lines of naturalist moral realism, is that mathematical and moral judgements lay claim to abstract matters outside space and time. Thus mathematical claims typically involve a commitment to abstract objects like numbers and sets, eternal entities without spatial or temporal location (but see Maddy 1990). Again, modal claims need either to be read as implicitly referring to possible worlds, or alternatively as prefaced by modal operators which transform ordinary non-modal claims into claims of necessity or possibility. Either way, modal claims will report on matters that transcend spatiotemporal facts: that something is necessary or possible is not a claim solely about arrangements within the spatiotemporal world. Given that mathematical and modal facts are abstract in the sense of lying outside space and time, it follows that there is no possibility of identifying them with the kind of natural facts that have physical effects.

If naturalist realism about mathematics is thus ruled out, the remaining options are irrealism and non-naturalist realism. Let us consider these in turn.

The currently most popular irrealist views of mathematics and modality are fictionalist. Thus Hartry Field has argued that we do not have to regard mathematics as literally true in order to understand its use in science and other applications. Rather it can be viewed as a ‘useful fiction’ which facilitates inferences between scientific claims, but is not itself implicated in our most serious beliefs about the world (Field 1980, 1989). Similarly, a number of authors have recently explored the suggestion that modal claims are best understood as claims made within the fiction of possible worlds (Rosen 1990, Nolan 2002).

Fictionalist views do not come cheap. Since most of our scientific and other claims about the world are full of mathematical and modal elements, fictionalists need to show how these claims can be rephrased so as to eliminate the fictional elements, and moreover they need to show that the rephrased versions constitute a cogent world view. In the mathematical case, Field has suggested ways of constructing ‘nominalist’ versions of scientific theories that avoid commitments to abstract mathematical objects, but by no means all philosophers of mathematics are convinced that these substitutes are adequate. The same issue arises in the modal case. On the surface, any number of everyday claims are modal. (‘I coulda been a contender’.) Someone who wants to relegate modal claims to the status of useful fictions would thus seem to be under an obligation to find non-modal substitutes for these claims. (This question will press especially hard on modal fictionalists who are also ontological naturalists, given the extent to which the initial motivation for their ontological naturalism hinges on modally implicated claims about causal relationships.)

As explained above, the alternative to fictionalist views of mathematics and modality is non-naturalist realism. The obvious challenge facing non-naturalist realism is to explain how we can have genuine knowledge of mathematical and modal facts, if these facts lie outside space and time and so are incapable of entering into causal relations.[13]

One species of non-naturalist realism aims to vindicate mathematical and modal claims as essential parts of our best overall theories of the world. According to this line of thought, our empirically best-supported scientific theories commit us to mathematical and modal facts; ergo, we are entitled to believe in such facts. (Putnam, 1971.)[14]

There are a number of objections that can be put to this style of argument. For a start, it will be in danger of begging the question against any well-worked out fictionalist alternative: since fictionalists aim precisely to show that we can construct superior theories by eliminating commitment to abstract entities, they will deny that mathematical and modal claims are essential parts of our best theories.

In addition, it can be objected that it is one thing for our empirically best-supported theories to commit us to certain abstract entities, but another for this to justify our commitment to those entities—showing that we are committed does not automatically explain why we should be. Perhaps this inference would follow if we adopted a strong Quinean conformational holism according to which all parts of a theory are equally empirically confirmed if any are. But this Quinean view is highly contentious (Glymour 1980). Given this, it is not enough simply to point out that our theories commit us to mathematical and modal facts. It further needs to be shown what role those facts play in our theories, and why this should justify our believing in them. In the absence of such a demonstration, the possibility that we are not so justified has scarcely been eliminated. (If abstract entities played an essential part in the causal mechanisms posited by our theories, then perhaps belief in their existence could be justified as part of an inference to ‘the most plausible causal explanation’. But the abstractness of mathematical and modal facts once more seems to preclude any such causal role.)

An alternative style of realist argument aims to show that mathematical and modal beliefs can be justified as analytic truths that follow directly from logic and certain meaning stipulations. This idea has been best worked out in the connection with arithmetic. Crispin Wright's ‘neo-Fregean’ programme shows how Peano's postulates can be derived within the framework of second-order logic from nothing except the Humean principle that the same number attaches to equinumerous concepts. According to Wright, this principle can be viewed as an implicit definition of our concept of number. If this is right, then it has indeed been shown that arithmetic, and therewith the existence of numbers as abstract objects, follows from logic and definition alone. (Wright 1983, Hale and Wright 2003.) Similar approaches have been explored for other areas of mathematics (Shapiro 2000, Wright 2000) and for knowledge of logical modalities (Boghossian 1996 2000). Whether this strategy can really show that mathematics and modality are exceptions to ontological naturalism hinges on the delicate issue of whether ontological commitment—even to such diaphanous entities as abstract objects—can be forced on us by logic and definitions alone. (MacBride 2003).

2 Methodological Naturalism

2.1 Philosophy and Science

In what follows, ‘methodological naturalism’ will be understood as a view about philosophical practice. Methodological naturalists see philosophy and science as engaged in essentially the same enterprise, pursuing similar ends and using similar methods. Methodological anti-naturalists see philosophy as disjoint from science, with distinct ends and methods.

In some philosophy of religion circles, ‘methodological naturalism’ is understood differently, as a thesis about natural scientific method itself, not about philosophical method. In this sense, ‘methodological naturalism’ asserts that religious commitments have no relevance within science: natural science itself requires no specific attitude to religion, and can be practised just as well by adherents of religious faiths as by atheists or agnostics (cf. Draper 2005). This thesis is of interest to philosophers of religion because many of them want to deny that methodological naturalism in this sense entails ‘philosophical naturalism’, understood as atheism or agnosticism. You can practice natural science in just the same way as non-believers, so this line of thought goes, yet remain a believer when it comes to religious questions.

Not all defenders of religious belief endorse this kind of ‘methodological naturalism’. Some think that religious doctrines do make a difference to scientific practice, yet are defensible for all that (Plantinga 1996). In any case, this kind of ‘methodological naturalism’ will not be discussed further here. Our focus will be on the relation between philosophy and science, not between religion and science.

It is uncontentious that philosophers differ widely in their initial attitudes to natural science. Some philosophers celebrate science, and seek out ways in which philosophy can be illuminated by it. Other philosophers view science with suspicion, and feel that any dependence on science somehow infringes the autonomy of philosophy. However, these initial reactions do not necessarily betoken any substantial disagreement about the practice of philosophy. After all, even those philosophers who are suspicious of science must allow that philosophical analyses can sometimes hinge on scientific findings—we need only think of the role that the causal closure of physics was shown above to play in the contemporary mind-body debate. And, on the other side, even the philosophical friends of science must admit that there are some differences at least between philosophy and natural science—for one thing, philosophers characteristically do not gather empirical data in the way that scientists do.

If we want to isolate a serious debate about philosophical method, we will need to go beyond initial reactions to science and look at more specific methodological commitments. For the sake of the argument, let us thus understand methodological naturalism as asserting that at bottom philosophy and science have just the same aims and methods, namely, to establish synthetic knowledge about the natural world, in particular knowledge of laws and causal mechanisms, and to achieve this by comparing synthetic theories with the empirical data. (So understood, methodological naturalism is committed to equating ‘science’ with ‘natural science’. This equation will be considered further in section 2.5.)

Methodological naturalists will of course allow that there are some differences between philosophy and science. But they will say that these are relatively superficial. In particular, they will argue that they are not differences in aims or methods, but simply a matter of philosophy and science focusing on different questions. For one thing, philosophical questions are often distinguished by their great generality. Where scientists think about viruses, electrons or stars, philosophers think about spatiotemporal continuants, universals and identity. Categories like these structure all our thinking about the natural world. A corollary is that alternative theories at this level are unlikely ever to be decided between by some simple experiment, which is no doubt one reason that philosophers do not normally seek out new empirical data. Even so, the naturalist will insist, such theories are still synthetic theories about the natural world, answerable in the last instance to the tribunal of empirical data.

Not all philosophical questions are of great generality. Think of topics like weakness of will, the importance of originality in art, or the semantics of fiction. What seems to identify these as philosophical issues is that our thinking is in some kind of theoretical tangle, supporting different lines of thought that lead to conflicting conclusions. Progress requires an unravelling of premises, including perhaps an unearthing of implicit assumptions that we didn't realise we had, and a search for alternative positions that don't generate further contradictions. Here too empirical data are clearly not going to be crucial in deciding theoretical questions—often we have all the data we could want, but can't find a good way of accommodating them. Still, methodological naturalists will urge, this doesn't mean that cogent empirical theories are not the aim of philosophy. An empirical theory unravelled from a tangle is still an empirical theory, even if no new data went into its construction.

The rest of this entry will evaluate methodological naturalism as now understood by seeing whether there are aspects of philosophical practice that it cannot account for.

2.2 Concepts and Theoretical Commitments

Perhaps the most familiar contemporary alternative to methodological naturalism is the view that philosophy is primarily concerned with the analysis of concepts, rather than the construction of synthetic theories. However, there are different ways of understanding the nature of conceptual analysis.

For some philosophers, a community's concepts are bound up with the synthetic theories that the community accepts. According to this view, accepted theories determine which inferences govern the use of concepts, and hence the nature of those concepts. Analyzing concepts will thus be a matter of articulating the relevant theories. On this account, moreover, concepts can be criticized, by showing that the theories that constitute them are defective. (For a particularly clear version of this picture of conceptual analysis, see Brandom 2001.)

If we understand conceptual analysis in this way, the view that philosophy is engaged in conceptual analysis seems perfectly consistent with methodological naturalism. On this view, the job of philosophy is to articulate synthetic theories and criticise those that fail to pass muster. Methodological naturalists can agree whole-heartedly.

At the same time, methodological naturalists are likely to point out that this view also presupposes an odd and ultimately verificationist account of concepts. It is uncontentious that which theories you accept dictates how you apply your concepts (at least your non-observational concepts) in response to sensory evidence. But unacceptably verificationist assumptions are needed to move from this to the conclusion that your concepts themselves depend on which theories you accept.

Apart from anything else, this move carries the implication that people who accept different theories will automatically have different concepts, since their disposition to apply the concepts will be different. In particular, it implies that thinkers will not share concepts with adherents of theories they reject. So those who reject the phlogiston theory of combustion, or the psychoanalytic theory of the self, will not possess the same concepts of phlogiston or superego as adherents of those theories, and as a result will be unable to deny what those theories assert by saying there is no phlogiston or there is no superego.

This seems a strange view of concepts. Still, as was pointed out above, methodological naturalists need not object to the positive conception of philosophy that goes with this view of concepts, as opposed to the view of concepts itself. They can concur that the main business of philosophy is to articulate and assess substantial theories, and simply demur from the idea that this amounts to analysing concepts.

2.3 Conceptual Analysis Canberra-Style

Other philosophers think of the view that philosophy is engaged in conceptual analysis differently. According to these philosophers, the first task of philosophy is not to engage with synthetic theories, but to produce an a priori analysis of the categories employed by everyday thought. This a priori analysis will tell us what is required for something to satisfy the everyday concept of free will, say, or knowledge, or moral value, or conscious experience. This may set the stage for further synthetic theorizing about the way these requirements are in fact realized, but it does not itself tell us anything substantial about the non-conceptual world

This picture of a priori conceptual analysis is central to an influential contemporary school of thought, led by David Lewis and Frank Jackson, and widely known as the ‘Canberra Plan’. As Jackson (1998) sees it, ‘serious metaphysics’ aims to demonstrate how a limited number of ingredients (for example, physical ingredients) might satisfy the concepts of everyday thought. Jackson takes it that such a demonstration will proceed in two stages. First, the relevant ‘folk’ concepts will be subject to a priori analysis: this will show what common sense thinking requires for something to qualify as free will, knowledge, moral value and so on. Once this has been clarified, we can then look to our preferred account of reality to ascertain which fundamental ingredients, if any, actually play the required folk-theoretical role. This second stage is likely to appeal to a posteriori scientific knowledge about the fundamental nature of reality. But the purely conceptual first stage, argues Jackson, also plays an essential part in reaching the overall metaphysical conclusion.

There are a number of things to say about this programme. An initial question relates to its scope. It is by no means clear that all philosophically interesting concepts can be subject to the relevant kind of a priori analysis. Jackson himself assumes that pretty much all concepts can be analysed as equivalent to ‘the kind which satisfies such-and-such folk assumptions’.[15] But it is arguable that many concepts are not so constituted, but rather have their identities fixed by observational, causal or historical relations to their referents.

Still, we can let this point pass. It would still contradict methodological naturalism if Jackson's programme applied to some philosophical categories, even if not all. This would suffice to show that a priori conceptual analysis plays a significant role in philosophy.

Some extreme naturalists deny that a priori conceptual knowledge is so much as possible (Devitt 2005). They take Quine's case against an analytic-synthetic distinction to show that all claims are answerable to empirical data and so not purely analytic. This is not the place to assess Quine's arguments, but it seems unlikely that they can establish so strong a conclusion. (Suppose that a certain group agrees, say, that they are going to use ‘Eve’ to refer to the most recent common matrilineal ancestor of all extant humans. Then surely that know a priori that, given general evolutionary assumptions, all contemporary humans are descended from Eve.)

In the face of examples like these, the obvious move for methodological naturalists is to allow that a priori knowledge of this kind is possible, but to insist that is always trivial and plays no significant role in philosophy.

What about the Canberra claim that conceptual analysis plays a crucial role in setting the agenda for serious metaphysical investigation?[16] There remains plenty of room for methodological naturalists to deny this thesis, even in connection with philosophically significant concepts that can be analysed in terms of folk roles.

Defenders of the Canberra plan characteristically explain their strategy in terms of ‘Ramsey sentences’. Suppose T(F) is the set of relevant everyday assumptions involving some philosophically interesting concept. For example, F may be the concept belief, and the assumptions in T may include ‘characteristically caused by perceptions’, ‘combines with desires to generate actions’, and ‘has causally significant internal structure’. Then the Ramsey sentence corresponding to T(F) is ‘∃!Φ(T(Φ))’[17]. For the concept belief, this would say ‘There is some unique kind that is characteristically caused by perceptions, combines with desires to generate actions, and has causally significant internal structure.’ The Canberra suggestion is then that, once we have articulated the relevant Ramsey sentence, we will then be in a position to turn to serious metaphysics to identify the underlying nature of the F that plays the relevant role.

Methodological naturalists can simply respond that they see nothing to object to in this story, since the relevant agenda-setting Ramsey sentences will manifestly be synthetic claims, and so can't possibly derive from conceptual analysis. A Ramsey-sentence of the kind at issue will say that there is some entity satisfying certain requirements (there is a kind of state that is caused by perceptions …) Far from being guaranteed by concepts, such claims will say something substantial about the world, something that could well be overturned by empirical evidence. The Canberra strategy thus seems no different from the prescription that philosophy should start with the synthetic theories endorsed by everyday thought, and then look to our more fundamental theories of reality to see what, if anything, makes these everyday theories true. This seems entirely in accord with methodological naturalism—philosophy is in the business of assessing and developing empirical theories of the world.

The crucial point is that Ramsey sentences don't define concepts like belief, but eliminate them. They give us a way of saying what our everyday theories say without using the relevant concept (there is a kind of state that is caused by perceptions …) If we want definitions, then we need ‘Carnap sentences’, not Ramsey sentences (Lewis 1970). The Carnap sentence corresponding to ‘∃!Φ(T(Φ))’ is ‘If ∃!Φ(T(Φ), then T(F)’. (If there is a kind of state that is caused by perceptions …, then it's belief.) Carnap sentences can plausibly be viewed as akin to stipulations that fix the reference of the relevant concepts, and to that extent as analytic claims that can be known a priori. But this certainly does not mean that Ramsey sentences, which make substantial claims about the actual world, are also knowable via a priori analysis. (Note how you can accept a conditional Carnap sentence even if you reject the corresponding unconditional Ramsey sentence. You can grasp the folk concept of belief even if you reject the substantial folk theory of belief.)

Can't defenders of the Canberra programme argue that it is the analytic Carnap sentences that are crucial in setting philosophical agendas, not the synthetic Ramsey sentences? But this seems wrong. We will want to know about the fundamental nature of belief if we suppose that there is a kind of state that is characteristically caused by perceptions, and so on. That is certainly a good motivation for figuring out whether and how the fundamental components of reality might constitute this state. But the mere fact that everyday thought contains a concept of such a state in itself provides no motivation for further investigation. (In effect, the function of a Carnap sentence is to provide a shorthand for talking about the putative state posited by the corresponding Ramsey sentence. It is hard to see how any important philosophical issues could hang on the availability of such a shorthand.)

To emphasize the point, consider the everyday concept of a soul, understood something that is present in conscious beings and survives death. This concept of a soul can be captured by the analytic Carnap sentence: ‘If certain entities inhabit conscious beings and survive death, then they are souls’. Accordingly, this Carnap sentence will be agreed by everybody who has the concept of soul, whether or not they believe in souls. Yet this Carnap sentence will not per se raise any interesting metaphysical questions for those who deny the existence of souls. These deniers won't start wondering how the fundamental constituents of reality realize souls—after all, they don't believe in souls. It is only those who accept the corresponding Ramsey sentence (‘There are parts of conscious beings that survive death’) who will see a metaphysical issue here. Moreover, the Ramsey sentence will pose this metaphysical issue whether or not it is accompanied by some analytic Carnap sentence to provide some shorthand alternative terminology. In short, the methodological naturalist can insist that anybody interested in ‘serious metaphysics’ should start by articulating the substantial existential commitments of our folk theories, as articulated in their synthetic Ramsey sentences. Any further analytic conceptual commitments, of the kind that might be articulated a priori, add nothing of philosophical significance.

2.4 Intuitions and Philosophy

The view that conceptual analysis plays no important role in philosophy might seem to belied by the importance that philosophers attach to intuitions. Philosophical debate often proceeds by testing general claims against intuitions about possible scenarios. Consider, for example, the descriptive theory of names, or the tripartite analysis of knowledge. These views have been refuted by appeal to intuitions about counter-examples. Thus Kripke (1980) constructed imaginary cases where intuition clearly distinguishes the bearer of some name from the individual that satisfies the descriptions associated with it. And Gettier (1963) has similarly produced imaginary cases of people who have true justified beliefs but intuitively lack knowledge.

Such examples are standardly taken to support the view that conceptual analysis is central to philosophy (cf. Jackson 1998). To see whether this view is justified, it will help to schematize the structure of such philosophical appeals to intuition. Let us assume that the relevant examples involve some modal philosophical claim that □∀x(AxBx) (for example, necessarily, if x has a true justified belief, then x knows). We then imagine some specific possible case of A (someone with a justified but accidentally true belief) and intuitively judge that it would not be B (such a person will not know). To the extent that intuition here shows us that this case is possible—◊∃x(Ax & ¬Bx)—then the original thesis is disproved.

Whether this kind of procedure requires a view of philosophy as conceptual analysis depends on the status of the relevant intuitions. Suppose first that the intuitions merely show what is conceptually possible: our though-experiments serve only to show that certain kinds of cases are not ruled out by our concepts. If this is the import of the intuitions, then they will only refute the relevant philosophical theses if these theses are themselves conceptual necessities—after all, the mere conceptual possibility of A without B doesn't rule it out that that A naturally or metaphysically[18] necessitates B. The assumption that philosophical intuitions deliver conceptual possibilities thus goes hand in hand with the view that philosophy is in the business of articulating conceptual theses.

Some methodological naturalists accept this account of intuitions, and in consequence reject the method of intuitive counter-examples (cf. DePaul and Ramsey 1999). Since philosophical theses are substantial synthetic claims, so this line of thought goes, merely conceptual possibilities cannot discredit them. Rather philosophical theories need to be tested against real empirical evidence derived from active observation and experiment. They can't be decided merely on the basis of armchair reflection.

However, it is important that this is not the only response to the method of intuitive counter-examples open to methodological naturalists. Instead they can allow that the method is often sound, but say that this is because philosophical intuitions normally embody more that conceptual information alone. In many cases, the relevant intuitions convey substantial information about the world, not just analytic consequences of concepts alone. Accordingly, they are capable of discrediting the kind of synthetic theses that naturalists take philosophy to involve.

In support of this alternative, note that intuition arguably plays a role in science as well as philosophy, in the form of scientific thought-experiments, like Galileo's analysis of free fall, or Newton's bucket experiment. Here too the scientist imagines some possible situation, and then makes an intuitive judgement about what would happen. But here the theory at issue is not some conceptual claim, but rather a thesis of natural necessity (say, that heavier bodies fall faster). If intuition is to falsify this, it needs to tell us that there is a naturally and not just conceptually possible situation that violates this thesis (for example, if a big and small body are tied together, they will be heavier than the big one, but will not fall faster). This thought is clearly not guaranteed by concepts alone, but by empirical assumptions about the way the world works. When Galileo moves from his initial description of the imaginary scenario to his judgement about what will happen next, his inference isn't underpinned by the structure of concepts alone, but by some substantial assumption about the empirical world (tying a small body to a big one doesn't speed them up).

Naturalists can allow a corresponding use for thought-experiments in philosophy. Intuitions play an important role, but only because they embody substantial information about the world (cf. Williamson 2005). Recall a point made earlier. Even if philosophical claims are substantial synthetic theories, a common cause of philosophical uncertainty isn't that we are short of empirical evidence, but rather that we are in some kind of theoretical tangle. Unravelling this tangle requires that we lay out different theoretical commitments and see what might be rejected or modified. A useful heuristic for this purpose may well be to use intuitions about imaginary cases to uncover the implicit assumptions that are shaping our thinking. The assumptions so uncovered can well be straightforwardly substantial theses about the working of the empirical world. These assumptions may not derive from new empirical evidence—as was observed earlier, philosophical problems don't normally call for new empirical evidence—but they can be substantial synthetic claims for all that. From this naturalist perspective, then, armchair appeals to intuitions about imagined cases can play a central role in philosophy after all. But these intuitions will not manifest conceptual information, but rather empirical information about the way the world works, albeit empirical information that is part of pre-existing thought, as opposed to information prompted by novel evidence. (From this perspective, then, Kripke and Gettier were appealing to familiar empirical information about names and knowledge respectively, rather than to purely conceptual intuitions.)

Note that intuitions understood in this way are by no means guaranteed to be authoritative. Maybe conceptually-based intuitions cannot be mistaken. But the same is clearly not true for every synthetic assumption that is embedded in accepted thought. This is why scientific thought experiments sometimes misfire. For example, consider the widely accepted sixteenth-century ‘tower argument’ against the Copernican claim that the earth moves: the earth can't be moving, because a stone released from a tower will fall ‘straight down’ to the foot of the tower, and not land some distance to the west as apparently required by Copernicus. However, the operative intuition here is flawed, since the stone, which shares the motion of the earth, will not fall ‘straight down’ in the relevant reference frame. The contrary intuition is an implicit product of the geocentrism that Copernicus was disputing, and so no good basis for rejecting Copernicus's theory.

The same point applies in philosophy. To the extent that intuitions hinge on synthetic prior commitments, they aren't automatically authoritative in philosophical argument. True, many intuitions will reflect some well-established theoretical principle, and to that extent should be respected. But other intuitions can be misbegotten, resting on unsubstantiated assumptions, or some natural but fallible mode of thought, and in such cases it will be legitimate to reject them. For example, materialists about the mind will allow that it is highly counterintuitive to identify the conscious mind with the brain, but respond that it is intuition rather than their theory that is here at fault. In general, then, naturalists will view conflicts between philosophical proposals and intuitive counterexamples as simply special cases of conflicting empirical theses, to be decided, as with all such conflicts, on the basis of overall fit with the evidence (cf. Weatherson 2003).

Sometimes it is said that the job of philosophy is to uncover necessities, rather than merely contingent matters of fact. This might seem in tension with the naturalist view that philosophy is concerned to articulate and assess synthetic theories. However, there is no real inconsistency here. Not all necessities are a priori. Claims about identity and constitution are often established with the help of empirical information, but are necessary for all that. Plenty of philosophical claims are of this form, and so will lay claim to necessity, even if they are based on empirical information. There is no shortage of examples. Beliefs are brain states; Queen Elizabeth could not have had different parents; the direction of causation is due to probabilistic asymmetry; personal identity is psychological continuity; mental representation involves biological function; and so on. These claims are all arguably informed by empirical information. Still, they are necessary, if they are true. (There might be other possible worlds in which our belief concept, say, would have picked different non-physical states. Even so, our beliefs—the actual realizers of the belief role—are necessarily physical, if physicalism about the mind true.)

2.5 Knowledge of Mental States

Traditionally, much modern philosophy began with our introspective knowledge of our own mental states. From Descartes onwards, such knowledge was widely viewed as providing a uniquely incorrigible foundation for philosophical investigation. This might seem to be a substantial difference between philosophy and science, given that science does not seem to be founded on introspection in the way that philosophy arguably is.

However, recent philosophy has been much less sympathetic to incorrigible introspective knowledge than were the founding fathers of modern philosophy. There is an obvious tension between the requirement of incorrigibility and the ability of introspection to yield substantial information about reality, even about internal mental reality. During the twentieth century, a number of major figures argued that this tension discredited the whole idea of incorrigible introspection (Wittgenstein 1953, Sellars 1956). More recently, some philosophers have countered that incorrigible self-knowledge is available in certain special cases (cf. Gertler 2002, 2003). But even these philosophers only aim to uphold incorrigible self-knowledge for a limited range of claims. In line with this, they do not present it as playing a central methodological role in philosophy.

Of course, there remains the possibility of corrigible self-knowledge. Even if introspection of the kind posited by Descartes is ruled out, there remains the possibility of ordinary cognitive mechanisms by which mental states reliably, but not infallibly, give rise to subjects' knowledge of those states. These mechanisms could be introspective, in the sense that they inform subjects directly of their own mental states without appeal to third-person behavioural evidence, even if they do not promise the kind of incorrigible foundations sought by Descartes. There are a number of plausible current theories of such mechanisms of self-knowledge on offer (cf. Nicholls and Stich 2003).

However, there is nothing in this kind of corrigible introspection to worry methodological naturalists. In particular, there seems no reason why it should drive a wedge between science and philosophy, since both are likely to make evidential use of it. Thus we can expect such introspective knowledge to play a significant part in philosophy: it may not be suited for the kind of ultimate foundational role envisaged by the founding fathers of modern philosophy, but this does not mean it cannot still inform work in the philosophy of mind, in particular in connection with theories of perception and other mental states. By the same coin, methodological naturalists will point out, this kind of information will also be important in the relevant branches of natural science as well as in philosophy. Indeed it is uncontroversial that much psychological research hinges crucially on subjects' reports about what they experience in various experimental paradigms. So reliance on introspection does not show that philosophical theories of mind are importantly different from scientific ones. Theories in both disciplines will answer to introspectively derived data, along with any other sources of information about the mind.

There is a rather different way in which some philosophers hold that knowledge of the mind plays a distinctive role in philosophy. Consider the philosophical ‘hermeneutic’ tradition that distinguishes understanding (verstehen) from explanation (erklären) (Dilthey 1894, Ramberg & Gjestal 2005). According to this tradition, the natural sciences explain phenomena by showing how they conform to empirical generalizations. But there is another kind of understanding, applicable to human thought and action, which owes nothing to empirical generalization. Rather it hinges on our ability to see things from the subjects' point of view, and appreciate how it made sense for them to think in the way they did.

A first point to make about this conception of understanding as verstehen is that there is a back-handed sense in which it agrees with methodological naturalism in allying philosophy with science. For those who uphold this distinctive kind of subjective understanding characteristically maintain that it plays a central role in the social and human sciences as well as in philosophy. So an appeal to verstehen does not support an ‘exceptionalist’ view of philosophy as having some distinctive method which differentiates it from all other disciplines. Verstehen may draw a line between philosophy and such natural sciences as chemistry and physics, but it will leave the social and human sciences on philosophy's side of the line.

Still, this scarcely vindicates a methodological naturalist view of philosophy, understood as the thesis that there is no substantial difference between philosophical and natural scientific method. Defenders of methodological naturalism in this sense are likely to argue that verstehen does not yield any special source of knowledge, either within philosophy or without.

There are a number of issues here. The method of verstehen can be viewed both as a source of normative information about the way people should reason and as a source of descriptive information about the way they do reason. Taken solely in the former way, it is not obvious that it is in any more in tension with naturalism than other types of normative judgement. It is a familiar enough thought that normative judgements are grounded in natural human responses. The hermeneutic idea that our evaluation of some piece of human reasoning derives from our subjective assessment of whether it ‘makes sense’ can be seen a special case of this. We shall return to the general issue of whether methodological naturalism can accommodate this kind of normative knowledge in the section after next.

The status of verstehen as a source of descriptive knowledge raises different issues. Even if the method of versehen can tell us how people should reason, it does not follow that it can tell us how they do reason. We can only move from the former to the latter if people generally do reason in the way they ought. To the extent that people's actual reasoning diverges from rational norms—and there is plenty of evidence that it often does (cf. Stein 1998)—then we will need knowledge of actual patterns of reasoning to explain human thought. It is not obvious, to say the least, how this is supposed to derive from introspective judgements about whether certain patterns of thought or action ‘make sense’. People often do things that don't make sense, and often fail to do those things that do make sense.

Having said this, there is no reason why naturalists should not allow that the method of verstehen is a useful heuristic for gaining factual knowledge. It is widely supposed that humans have some relatively innate capacity for thinking about other's mental states, and one account of this kind of ‘understanding of mind’ is that it rests on our ability to simulate the mental processes of differently situated individuals, in effect using our own mental processes as models for the general case (Davies and Stone 1995, Gordon 2004). This looks very similar to the method of verstehen (Heal 1996). Of course, it is not to be taken for granted that such simulations will always deliver accurate factual information, especially given the points made in the last paragraph. But, to the extent that mental simulations are predictively accurate, there seems no reason for methodological naturalists to object to their epistemological use. So construed, the method of verstehen will simply be one useful if fallible source of factual information about psychological processes. As such, we can expect it to function similarly both within and without philosophy, as a provider of empirical information that can be used to assess synthetic theories about human psychology.

2.6 Synthetic A Prioris

So far the dispute between methodological naturalists and non-naturalists has been presented as hinging on whether or not philosophy deals in synthetic claims. However, there are philosophers who will agree that philosophy deals in synthetic claims, yet reject the methodological naturalist thesis that philosophy uses the same methods as the natural sciences. This is because they hold that philosophical knowledge is synthetic but a priori. On their view, philosophy may share science's aim of substantial synthetic knowledge, but it seeks to gain this by a priori methods, in place of science's use of observational and experimental findings.

Methodological naturalists will object that is hard to see how synthetic a priori knowledge is possible. How can we possibly discover substantial facts about our world without experience of that world?

The traditional answer would have been that God made this possible, by constructing our minds so as to make certain substantial truths accessible to us without the help of experience. Contemporary methodological naturalists are likely to reject any such God-given route to the synthetic a priori. Indeed, few philosophers since Hume have been prepared to appeal to God-given powers in accounting for the epistemological powers of the human mind.

In any case, note that God-given synthetic knowledge is unlikely to drive any non-naturalist wedge between science and philosophy. If God had given us a priori insight into the structure of space, say, or the basic principles of mechanics, then this will be a route to knowledge for natural sciences like physics as much as for philosophy.

Contemporary thought offers a biological alternative to God as a source of synthetic a priori knowledge. Perhaps natural selection has structured our minds to make certain substantial truths accessible without experience, even if God hasn't. For example, the last section suggested that we may have such innate knowledge of certain aspects of human psychology, and there are other plausible examples of biologically innate knowledge. Of course, ‘innate ideas’ of these kinds do not have the same truth-guaranteeing imprimatur as God-given ones, given that natural selection is rather more likely to be a deceiver than a benevolent god, instilling in us beliefs that are biologically advantageous though false. But this possibility of error need not disqualify all biologically innate beliefs as knowledge—the truth of some such beliefs may be sufficiently non-accidental for them to count as knowledge.

Still, as was observed in connection with innate ‘understanding of mind’, there seems no reason for methodological naturalists to object to biologically-based synthetic a priori knowledge. Such knowledge is perfectly understandable by naturalist lights. And it gives no obvious reason to think that philosophical theorizing is fundamentally different from scientific theorizing. If anything, far from providing a distinctive kind of resource for philosophy, biological innate ideas would seem more relevant to ordinary scientific theories than philosophical ones.

Of course, apart from God and biology, there is also the Kantian explanation of synthetic a priori knowledge. This does promise to drive a wedge between philosophy and science. The Kantian idea is that synthetic a priori knowledge can be derived by transcendental deduction from the possibility of experience. On this conception, we can know that the world must display certain synthetic features (events must be causally related, must be located in some objective space, and so on) because there would be no possibility of experience without these features.

In response, methodological naturalists can argue that, insofar as such deductions do yield significant results, they hinge on nothing but a species of reasoning that is familiar in the natural sciences, namely, drawing conclusions from specific facts with the help of general empirical truths.

Suppose the schematic form of a transcendental deduction is:

  1. Experience has feature F.
  2. Feature F requires a world of kind G.
  3. Therefore, the world is G.

Consider first premise (1). Presumably this derives from introspection. In the previous section we saw that introspective knowledge of mental states can be a resource for science as well as for philosophy. So there is nothing in this aspect of a transcendental deduction to show that it involves some special philosophical technique alien to science. (Nor is this point altered if we deem such introspective knowledge ‘a priori’, as some philosophers do, on the grounds it doesn't derive from normal sense perception (cf. Boghossian 1998). All that will follow from this usage is that in this sense science also sometimes invokes ‘a priori’ knowledge.)

Now take premise (2). If the overall deduction is to move us beyond (1), this presumably needs itself to be a synthetic claim. (For example, if (2) is the analytic claim ‘If experience represents objects as causally related, then the world-as-experienced will appear to contain causally related objects’, then the conclusion of the transcendental deduction will merely restate premise (1).) However, if (2) is a substantial synthetic generalization that in informs us about independent requirements for certain kinds of experiences to occur, then presumably it will need to be supported by empirical evidence. There seems no reason why methodological naturalists should deny that such generalizations can be established, and enter into deductions of the above form. But they will insist that this involves nothing apart from normal scientific practice.

2.7 Normative Knowledge

Perhaps the most obvious objection to methodological naturalism is that philosophy has a normative dimension. Some parts of philosophy—ethics, political philosophy, aesthetics—deal centrally with normative matters. By contrast, the first task of empirical science is always to establish descriptive findings (even if those findings will themselves sometimes have normative implications). Given this, it seems unlikely that the normative areas of philosophy will use the same methods of investigation as the empirical sciences.

In response, methodological naturalists can make the initial point that meta-ethics (and meta-normativity more generally) is in effect a branch of metaphysics, and to that extent raises no new objection to naturalism. When philosophers consider the nature of moral or aesthetic value, and analyse the structure of moral or aesthetic discourse, they aim to figure out what kinds of facts the world contains and how humans interact with those facts. If metaphysical investigation in general can be understood in terms of methodologically naturalist techniques, there seems no reason why meta-normative philosophy cannot be similarly understood.

Still, this response only takes the methodological naturalist so far. Meta-normative investigations form part of the normative areas of philosophy, but it is implausible to argue that they exhaust these areas. Philosophers also engage in first-order normative theorising. Moral philosophers debate the permissibility of abortion, the acceptability of the death penalty, and so on. Political philosophers ask when outside powers can invade sovereign states and whether liberal values are universal. Aesthetician debate the significance of originality and the worth of conceptual art. If normative philosophy were restricted to meta-normative issues, it would be far less interesting and important than it is.

There is no question of here entering into any serious discussion of the sources of normative judgement. But it seems hard to deny that such judgements are formed in ways that have no parallel in scientific investigation. It seems likely that, at some level, normative judgements must grounded in characteristic human responses of an emotional or motivating kind. Reactions of this kind play no obvious role in science. This then looks like one place where methodological naturalism breaks down, and must admit that philosophy uses different techniques from science.

It might seem as if this argument presumes some non-cognitivist account of normative judgement. But in fact the point applies more generally. The idea that normative judgements must be grounded in characteristic human responses is not peculiar to non-cognitivist theories.

True, non-cognitivism builds such reactive grounding directly into the content of normative judgements, whereas realist and other cognitivist theories present normative judgements as answering to contents that are metaphysically independent of subjective human responses. Still, at an epistemological level, even cognitivist theories of normativity are likely to appeal to something like natural human responses—no doubt refined by education and reason—to explain how we identify moral facts and evaluate moral claims.

It the face of this point, philosophers of naturalist inclinations may wish to observe that, even so, no viable theory of normativity will posit any naturalistically inexplicable realm of reality or mysterious cognitive powers. This was in effect the thrust of section 1.7 above. There we saw reasons for dismissing ‘normative non-naturalism’ in favour of naturalist views of either an irrealist or realist stripe. (In effect, non-naturalism made normative facts humanly inaccessible.) However, the arguments of section 1.7 only sufficed to establish ontological naturalism about the normative realm. Methodological naturalism raises a further issue: does first-order normative investigation use the same methods as are employed in the empirical sciences? And to this the answer seems to be negative.

Philosophers of naturalist inclinations may also wish to make the point that first-order normative investigation goes on outside philosophy as well as within, and so does not support the ‘exceptionalist’ claim that there is some distinctive method of investigation that is peculiar to philosophy. This is no doubt true—first-order normative discourse is essential to everyday life, political debate, literary criticism, and to many other practices. But this does not vindicate methodological naturalism. The methodological naturalist does not just make the non-exceptionalist claim that philosophy shares its methods with other ways of thought, but the stronger claim that it shares its methods exclusively with the natural sciences. So it scarcely supports methodological naturalism to observe that it shares its practice of first-order normative reasoning with such non-scientific enterprises as literary criticism and political debate.

2.8 Mathematics and Logic

A final question about methodological naturalism relates to the importance of logic and mathematics in philosophy. It is undeniable that some areas of philosophy involve mathematical and logical knowledge. Most obviously, this holds for specialist areas like philosophy of mathematics and philosophical logic themselves. In addition, any number of mathematical and logical results are of great interest even outside these specialisms—we need only think of the independence of Euclid's fifth postulate, or the inconsistency of naïve set theory, or the incompleteness of arithmetic.

This arguably constitutes another exception to methodological naturalism. So far methodological naturalism has been understood as asserting that philosophy pursues synthetic theories of the world by comparing them with the empirical data. But mathematical and logical results don't look like the kind of synthetic theories that are evaluated against the empirical data.

Note that this difficulty relates specifically to philosophically interesting judgements about mathematical and logical facts, not just to the use of mathematical and logical reasoning within philosophy. This is because it is uncontroversial that mathematical and logical reasoning are also used in the construction and evaluation of synthetic scientific theories. Exactly how this works will come out rather differently on different philosophical accounts of mathematics and logic, but any such account must recognize that ordinary scientists often reason in mathematical and logical ways. So the fact that philosophy uses mathematics and logic doesn't in itself show that it is doing anything other than developing synthetic theories of the world. Still, the difficulty remains. For philosophy doesn't only use mathematics and logic, but also theorises about mathematics and logic. And such mathematical and logical theories don't themselves look like synthetic theories. So, if methodological naturalism is defined as requiring an exclusive concern with synthetic theories, it seems to follow that methodological naturalism is false.

A strongly naturalist response to this point would be to insist that mathematical and logical theories are synthetic scientific theories after all. This is the Putnam-Quine line, mentioned in section 1.8 above, according to which mathematical and logical claims are interwoven with the rest of our synthetic theories of the world, and receive what support they have from the overall sensory evidence for those theories. Still, as was observed earlier, this view is open to various objections, not least that it assumes an implausible holism about confirmation.

The other two accounts of mathematical and logical claims discussed in section 1.8 were (a) fictionalism and (b) the neo-Fregean view that such claims can be established a priori with the help of implicit definitions. On both these accounts, mathematical and logical claims are explicitly different from synthetic scientific theories. Fictionalists regard these claims as moves made within fictional discourse. Neo-Fregeans regard them as consequences drawn from definitions. True, on both these accounts, mathematical and moral claims are in different ways important to the scientific construction of theories. But the point remains that they are not themselves synthetic scientific theories.

At this point, methodological naturalists are likely to respond that this whole line of objection only threatens the letter rather than the spirit of their position. After all, it is not as if mathematics and logic are alien to science. Maybe mathematical and logical theories are not themselves synthetic theories. But if an interest in such theories is the only way in which philosophy goes beyond empirical science, the problem arguably lies in the way we have been understanding methodological naturalism, rather than in the spirit of the position itself. After all, instead of taking methodological naturalism to say that philosophy deals exclusively with synthetic theories, we could have instead have required only that it makes the kinds of claims that are important in scientific theorizing. Methodological naturalism in this sense would be weaker than our original definition. But those with naturalist sympathies are unlikely to feel that this is a significant concession.


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Related Entries

anomalous monism | epistemology: naturalized | fictionalism: modal | folk psychology: as mental simulation | functionalism | hermeneutics | materialism: eliminative | mental causation | multiple realizability | naturalism: moral | non-naturalism, moral | self-knowledge


The editors would like to thank Greg Stokley for reading this entry carefully and identifying various typographic errors.