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Marsilius of Inghen

First published Thu Aug 16, 2001; substantive revision Tue Oct 23, 2007

Marsilius of Inghen, master at the Universities of Paris (1362-1378) and Heidelberg (1386-1396), wrote a number of treatises on logic, natural philosophy and theology popular at many late medieval and early modern universities. He adopted the logico-semantic approach of William of Ockham and John Buridan while at the same time defending the traditional views of Thomas Aquinas and Bonaventure. His thinking sheds light on the discussion between nominalists and realists and allows insight into the changing interests of philosophy and theology, from the critical attitude of many fourteenth-century authors to the search for tradition which was characteristic of the fifteenth century.

1. Life and Works

Marsilius of Inghen was born around 1340 in Nijmegen, a city in the eastern part of the Low Countries (Netherlands). In the older literature it is often said that he came from one of the villages in the vicinity of Nijmegen (Inghen), but this view is mistaken. It was based on a confused reading of the Oratio Funebris held in 1396 by Nicholas Prowin at the funeral of Marsilius and published in 1499 at Mainz. From 1362 on, Marsilius was master at the Faculty of Arts at the University of Paris, where he was also rector (1367 and 1371), and a student of theology. As a teacher at Paris, Marsilius was much esteemed and his lectures drew large audiences. Among his students were many compatriots, some of whom came from Nijmegen and surrounding villages. In 1378, Marsilius found himself the University's delegate at the court of Pope Urban VI in Tivoli. In 1379, he instructed one of his colleagues, Hugh of Hervort, to look after his interests in Paris. After 1379, Marsilius's name is no longer mentioned in the acts of the University of Paris. He probably turned away from Paris because of the imbroglio surrounding the Great Schism of 1378. Meanwhile, he kept in touch with his native city. In 1382 the town council of Nijmegen treated him to a banquet. From 1386 on, Marsilius was master at the University of Heidelberg. There, as in Paris, he held a number of administrative offices. He was one of the founders of the University of Heidelberg, of which he was rector no fewer than nine times, from 1386-1392 and also in 1396. In 1389-1390, as the University's nuncio together with Conrad of Soltau, he was responsible for transferring the University register to Rome (Boniface IX). At the beginning of the 1390s, Marsilius again took up the study of theology. The masters who taught theology were by then Conrad of Soltau (since 1387) and Matthew of Krakow (since 1394), both from the University of Prague. In 1395/1396 Marsilius finished his lectures on the Sentences and so became the first theologian to obtain the doctorate at Heidelberg. He died a short time later, on August 20, 1396.

Marsilius was a prolific writer. His work was the fruit of his teachings in Paris and Heidelberg. Many of his writings have been preserved in manuscripts or early printed editions, although recently some have appeared in modern critical editions. His most important writings include:

Works on Logic and Epistemology
  1. Exposition of the Old Logic
  2. Various Questions on the Old and New Logic
  3. Summary [Abbreviationes] of the Old and New Logic
  4. Treatises on the Properties of Terms: On Supposition, Ampliation, Appellation, Restriction, Obligation, Insolubles, and Consequences.
Works on Natural Philosophy and Metaphysics
  1. Summary [Abbreviationes] of Aristotle's ‘Physics’
  2. Questions on Aristotle's ‘On Generation and Corruption’
  3. Questions on Aristotle's ‘De anima’
  4. Questions on Aristotle's ‘Metaphysics’
Works on Ethics
  • Questions on Aristotle's ‘Nicomachean Ethics’
Works on Theology
  • Questions on the ‘Sentences’ of Peter Lombard

2. Teachings

2.1 Logic and Epistemology

In his logic and epistemology, Marsilius followed the nominalist tradition of the fourteenth century as exemplified by William of Ockham and John Buridan. Yet Marsilius never qualified himself as a nominalist or follower of Ockham. He was an independent thinker who sometimes went back to the older tradition of the thirteenth century (e.g., in Peter of Spain), or advocated theories which were more in line with ordinary speech, as against the highly specialized views of his contemporaries. Marsilius employed logical methods and discussed logical and epistemological issues in almost all of his writings, including his Questions on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, which, in addition to his works specifically dedicated to logic, were also used as a source for late medieval and early modern treatises on logic.

Marsilius's nominalism comes to the fore in his views on the object of scientific knowledge, the nature of universals, and the logical doctrine of supposition. His basic assumption is that there are only individuals and no universals outside the human mind.

2.1.1 The Object of Scientific Knowledge

According to the Aristotelian standard accepted by Marsilius, the object of scientific knowledge must be universal and necessarily true. This is not the case with individual things in the external world, since they are subject to change. Only the conclusion of a true and necessary syllogism can meet the standard. Hence, for Marsilius, the object of scientific knowledge is not anything outside the mind, but the mental proposition which refers to individual things and their qualities. More specifically, the proper object of scientific knowledge is a proposition in the form of a conclusion that has been deduced from necessary premises.

2.1.2 Universals

Marsilius argued that universal concepts such as ‘humanity’ do not refer to real universals outside the human mind. Accordingly, there is no universal essence in singular individuals. Individuals of one genus or species do resemble each other, however, and this resemblance is the foundation of universal concepts in the human mind. The generation of universal concepts is a natural process, which Marsilius described as follows: suppose individual A of species S evokes concept X in the human mind. This concept is similar to concept Y which has been evoked by B of the same species S. By abstracting from all the differences between X and Y, the human mind is able to produce another concept, Z, which stands for both A and B. Universality is then taken to be a quality of concept Z, the product of the epistemological operation of abstraction on concepts X and Y by the human mind.

2.1.3 Supposition

In line with his account of the nature of universals, Marsilius rejected simple supposition. Logicians such as Peter of Spain had used the notion to indicate that a term stood not for an individual but for a universal or common nature in the external world, like the term ‘man’ in the proposition, ‘Man is a species’. Since Marsilius rejected the idea of universals existing outside the mind, he eliminated simple supposition from the list of different types of supposition. He was critical of some of his contemporaries (e.g., Albert of Saxony) who likewise dismissed the concept of real universals, yet kept on using the notion of simple supposition. They had changed the meaning of the term, he said, by claiming that a written or spoken term had simple supposition if it was used to refer to a concept in the human mind. Marsilius wondered whether young students would be able to understand this new meaning of simple supposition, since they would hardly know what concepts are. To avoid confusion, Marsilius decided not to deal with simple supposition at all in his logic.

2.1.4 Some Specific Views

Marsilius was his own person when it came to assessing the views of others. In his analysis of the proposition ‘Socrates is not a chimera’ he followed what he called ‘the Parisian method’, according to which the proposition is false because the term ‘chimera’ supposits for nothing, there being no real chimeras to which it can refer. Others, however, considered the proposition to be true.

Elsewhere, he departed from the opinions of the Parisian School (scola Parisiensis) and opted for the perspective of ordinary language or common way of speaking (communis modus loquendi). This was the case with his analysis of the proposition ‘The Antichrist is not, but he will be’. According to the Parisian School, the term ‘he’ refers to the thing referred to by the term ‘Antichrist’. Since there is no Antichrist, neither term has reference. But in ordinary language it is different, for there the term ‘he’ is meant to refer to the future Antichrist. Marsilius accepted the latter analysis as sound, despite the authority of the former.

Finally, in the definition of ampliation, Marsilius went back to logicians of the thirteenth century such as Peter of Spain, who had defined ampliation as an extension of supposition, whereas fourteenth-century logicians such as Albert of Saxony did not consider ampliation to be a kind of supposition. Marsilius reinterpreted their definition so that it fit better with the older tradition. Such efforts to harmonize older and newer positions were typical of the late fourteenth century.

2.2 Natural Philosophy and Metaphysics

In natural philosophy and metaphysics Marsilius was an empiricist, meaning that he thought all scientific knowledge must be based on either sense data or self-evident propositions, i.e., propositions in which the meaning of the predicate is included in the subject. Everyone who knows the meaning of the terms of such propositions judges them to be evidently true. This has far-reaching consequences for the relationship between philosophy and theology. Since the philosopher uses only sense data and self-evident propositions, his inquiry may come to different conclusion than that of the theologian, who has additional knowledge from Scripture. The philosopher makes judgments about the world from a limited human perspective, whereas the theologian is helped by divine revelation. Yet Marsilius took the task of the philosopher seriously because he thought the human mind has a natural tendency to search for truth, which is satisfied (although not ultimately satisfied) in natural philosophy and metaphysics.

2.2.1 Creation

According to the principles of natural philosophy, creation from nothing is impossible. The senses show that things always come from other things. Because there is no serious reason to doubt the information given by the senses, the human mind legitimately jumps to the universal principle that nothing can come from nothing, driven by the natural tendency to search for truth. Consequently, for the human mind creation from nothing is impossible. It contradicts the universal principle that nothing comes from nothing. That God has created the world from nothing is therefore only a matter of faith (sola fide est creditum). Revelation shows that human knowledge of creation is limited, but it cannot be aided by natural philosophy at this point.

2.2.2 Theory of the Human Soul

In the later Middle Ages the study of the soul was part of natural philosophy. Marsilius treated the human soul in his commentary on Aristotle's De anima, in which he followed the Parisian tradition of Buridan and Oresme concerning the particular questions addressed. Following Buridan, he argued that there is no natural proof of the immortality of the human soul. For the human natural mind, unaided by revelation, the theory of Alexander of Aphrodisias that the human soul is corruptible is the most probable. That Alexander of Aphrodisias is mistaken and that the soul continues to exist after the death of the body is known through revelation alone. Faith has more authority than human reason and must be accepted in all cases where the two conflict since the things we believe on faith come from God, who cannot err.

2.3 Metaphysics

Although metaphysics cannot surpass the limits of human knowledge, Marsilius considered it to be the entry point to theology. Natural reason is capable of forming some adequate and true concepts of God, and also of forming true propositions about God. It is able to prove that God exists and possesses knowledge and will. But it cannot demonstrate that God has free will or infinite power. This, Marsilius claimed, was also true for philosophers such as Aristotle, whose teachings equal those of natural reason itself.

From Buridan, Marsilius took the idea that God according to Aristotle and Averroes is not only the final cause of the heavens and separate substances, but also their efficient cause. On this point Buridan and Marsilius were following the view of Scotus and Ockham against that of John of Jandun, Johannes Baconis, and Gregory of Rimini. It is worth noting in this connection that in the Puncta super libros Metaphysicae (i.e., brief abstracts of Aristotle's Metaphysics for teaching purposes) attributed to Johannes de Slupcza and written in Krakow in 1433, some of the views that Marsilius adopted from Buridan, including the one just mentioned, are attributed to Marsilius instead of Buridan -- notwithstanding the fact that the author was familiar with both Marsilius's and Buridan's commentaries. This illustrates the strong influence Marsilius's work exerted on fifteenth-century students and commentators.

On other points, however, Marsilius was critical of Buridan. For example, Marsilius considered Buridan's solution to the problem of the possible separation of accidents from their substance as not in accordance with the teachings of Aristotle, and therefore not truly metaphysical (metaphysicaliter), but rather in line with theological concerns. Only miraculously could God take over the supporting power of the substance, thus separating the accident from its natural bearer. According to Marsilius, however, such possible divine intervention should not be taken into account in metaphysics, where the philosopher must use natural reason alone.

2.4 Theology

Marsilius expressed his theological views in a voluminous commentary on the Sentences. He quoted and often adopted views that were put forward by fourteenth-century theologians such as Adam Wodeham and Gregory of Rimini, but was also influenced by earlier thinkers such as Thomas Aquinas and Bonaventure. He has serious reservations about the use of logic in theology.

2.4.1 Attributes and ideas

In his discussion of the divine attributes he followed mainly the teachings of Adam Wodeham. God is perfectly one. Divine wisdom and all other perfections attributed to God are in reality as identical to the divine essence as the divine essence is identical to itself. In the divine essence itself there is no distinction or non-identity whatsoever between the attributes of God. Any distinctions between divine attributes are necessarily of a rational (rather than real) nature and are made by us.

A similarly radical stance on the unity of God was assumed in his treatment of divine ideas. Ideas are not formally distinct in God, as some Scotists would argue, but only extrinsically and objectively distinct. Their distinction is a consequence of the differences between the creatures produced by God (which is why Marsilius spoke of extrinsic distinction), and of the fact that they are known by God as different (which accounts for their objective distinction). God knows that he is the cause of infinitely many differences between creatures. That is why his mind contains infinitely many different ideas.

Marsilius criticized Ockham's view that God's idea coincides with creation. If this were true, Marsilius argued, the idea of producing a stone must be identical with either the stone itself, or the stone insofar as it is known by God. If the former, then God must look outside of himself in his idea, which contradicts the position of Augustine, who is quoted by Ockham. If the latter, then the idea of its production is not the stone itself, but rather God's foreknowledge of the stone.

2.4.2 Theology and logic

Marsilius advanced his criticism of the use of logic in theology in his discussion of the position of Robert Holcot. Holcot had argued that logically, God can be called the cause of evil. If God is the cause of every thing (entitas) and moral evil (malum culpae) is a thing, then God is the cause of evil. Marsilius acknowledged that the argument is based on true premises, yet the conclusion should not be defended as true because it contradicts faith and therefore might cause confusion among believers. Theologians should not flaunt their personal skills in logic, but always write out of reverence for the divine. Their writings should not erode the beliefs of ordinary people, who are not skilled in logic, but rather aim to strengthen them spiritually.

Marsilius was anxious, however, to avoid the implication that God's foreknowledge is somehow dependent upon human beings. In his discussion of Adam Wodeham on the causality of the human will, he complained that Adam had not been emphatic enough on this point, since he allowed the following argument: if an event E will happen in the future, then God knows E from eternity; but if not-E will happen, then God knows not-E form eternity; since man is free, he can choose between E and not-E; therefore, he can change God's foreknowledge. This argument is logically sound, Marsilius argued, but it easily leads to the false conclusion that God's knowledge depends on the free will of man, which is absurd. The eternal cannot fall under the power of that which is created by it. Therefore, this argument should not be used. It is better to remain on the safe side by maintaining what has always been maintained, namely that God through his absolute omniscience knows the future activities of human beings, but without being dependent on them.

2.4.3 The sacraments

In his treatment of the sacraments at the end of his commentary on the Sentences, Marsilius drew heavily on the writings of Thomas Aquinas and Bonaventure. He defended Thomas's view that the word ‘this’ pronounced by Christ at the Last Supper in uttering ‘This is my body’ (Mk. 14:22) refers to what the bread and body have in common. Thomas of Strasbourg had attacked this view, but Marsilius showed that the earlier Thomas was right and the later wrong.

In his discussion of the causality of the sacraments, Marsilius followed the exposition of Bonaventure, according to whom the sacraments have no causality of their own. It is God who acts whenever the sacraments are administered correctly. Only in a broad sense is it true to say that the sacraments have the power to act.

3. Influence

The influence of Marsilius has been considerable, particularly through his logical works and commentaries on Aristotle. This may be gathered not only from the large number of manuscripts that have been preserved, but also from several other considerations. Marsilius's commentary on Aristotle's Prior analytics was used in Prague in the 1380s. His logical works, including the Obligationes and the Consequentiae, were used as textbooks in Vienna in the 1390s. His commentaries on Aristotle's Metaphysics and Physics were read in Krakow during the first sixty years of the fifteenth century. At the universities of Heidelberg, Erfurt, Basle, and Freiburg, his works were studied throughout the fifteenth century, in particular as part of the university curriculum. In 1499, the doctors and masters of the Via Moderna at the University of Heidelberg published a volume that included epigrams on Marsilius by well-known humanists such as Jacob Wimpfeling, as well as a defense of Nominalism in the style of Marsilius (Via Marsiliana). Praise in the form of epigrams can also be found in the 1501 Strasbourg edition of Marsilius's commentary on the Sentences. The Obligationes, printed in 1489 under the name of Peter of Ailly, were used by Thomas Bricot, John Major, and Domingo de Soto. The commentary on the Prior Analytics was quoted by Agostino Nifo. Jodocus Trutvetter and Bartholomew of Usingen, who consolidated nominalism in Erfurt, repeatedly mentioned Marsilius in their works. Both Leonardo da Vinci and Galileo Galilei referred to Marsilius's commentary on De Generatione et Corruptione.

The theological views of Marsilius appear to have had some circulation as well. His commentary on the Sentences was known in Krakow in the first half of the fifteenth century, and was used by Thomas de Strampino in his Principia (1441-1442). The University of Salamanca had a theological chair (Cátedra de Nominales) for commentary on the works of Marsilius of Inghen and Gabriel Biel. His commentary on the Sentences was quoted by Spanish theologians such as Francisco de Vitoria, Domingo de Soto, Luis de Molina, and Francisco Suárez, usually in connection with questions about divine foreknowledge and grace.

There are nine extant manuscripts of Marsilius's commentary on the Sentences. Among the former owners of these manuscripts were two libraries for preachers (Ansbach and Isny), and two libraries of faculties of arts (Erfurt and Leipzig). The education in Erfurt and Leipzig included the reading of nominalist authors. In all probability, the artists became interested in Marsilius's theological work after studying his writings on logic and physics. The presence of Marsilius's commentary on the Sentences in preachers' libraries bears witness to the fact that the impact of his work was felt beyond university circles.


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Related Entries

Buridan, John [Jean] | Gregory of Rimini | Ockham [Occam], William