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Indispensability Arguments in the Philosophy of Mathematics

First published Mon Dec 21, 1998; substantive revision Tue Jan 15, 2008

One of the most intriguing features of mathematics is its applicability to empirical science. Every branch of science draws upon large and often diverse portions of mathematics, from the use of Hilbert spaces in quantum mechanics to the use of differential geometry in general relativity. It's not just the physical sciences that avail themselves of the services of mathematics either. Biology, for instance, makes extensive use of difference equations and statistics. The roles mathematics plays in these theories is also varied. Not only does mathematics help with empirical predictions, it allows elegant and economical statement of many theories. Indeed, so important is the language of mathematics to science, that it is hard to imagine how theories such as quantum mechanics and general relativity could even be stated without employing a substantial amount of mathematics.

From the rather remarkable but seemingly uncontroversial fact that mathematics is indispensable to science, some philosophers have drawn serious metaphysical conclusions. In particular, Quine (1976; 1980a; 1980b; 1981a; 1981c) and Putnam (1979a; 1979b) have argued that the indispensability of mathematics to empirical science gives us good reason to believe in the existence of mathematical entities. According to this line of argument, reference to (or quantification over) mathematical entities such as sets, numbers, functions and such is indispensable to our best scientific theories, and so we ought to be committed to the existence of these mathematical entities. To do otherwise is to be guilty of what Putnam has called "intellectual dishonesty" (Putnam 1979b, p. 347). Moreover, mathematical entities are seen to be on an epistemic par with the other theoretical entities of science, since belief in the existence of the former is justified by the same evidence that confirms the theory as a whole (and hence belief in the latter). This argument is known as the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument for mathematical realism. There are other indispensability arguments,[1] but this one is by far the most influential, and so in what follows I'll concentrate on it.

1. Spelling Out the Quine-Putnam Indispensability Argument

The Quine-Putnam indispensability argument has attracted a great deal of attention, in part because many see it as the best argument for mathematical realism (or platonism). Thus anti-realists about mathematical entities (or nominalists) need to identify where the Quine-Putnam argument goes wrong. Many platonists, on the other hand, rely very heavily on this argument to justify their belief in mathematical entities. The argument places nominalists who wish to be realist about other theoretical entities of science (quarks, electrons, black holes and such) in a particularly difficult position. For typically they accept something quite like the Quine-Putnam argument[2]) as justification for realism about quarks and black holes. (This is what Quine (1980b, p. 45) calls holding a "double standard" with regard to ontology.)

For future reference I'll state the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument in the following explicit form:

(P1) We ought to have ontological commitment to all and only the entities that are indispensable to our best scientific theories.

(P2) Mathematical entities are indispensable to our best scientific theories.

(C) We ought to have ontological commitment to mathematical entities.

Thus formulated, the argument is valid. This forces the focus onto the two premises. In particular, a couple of important questions naturally arise. The first concerns how we are to understand the claim that mathematics is indispensable. I address this in the next section. The second question concerns the first premise. It is nowhere near as self-evident as the second and it clearly needs some defense. I'll discuss its defense in the following section. I'll then present some of the more important objections to the argument, before considering the Quine-Putnam argument's role in the larger scheme of things - where it stands in relation to other influential arguments for and against mathematical realism.

2. What is it to be Indispensable?

The question of how we should understand ‘indispensability’ in the present context is crucial to the Quine-Putnam argument, and yet it has received surprisingly little attention. Quine actually speaks in terms of the entities quantified over in the canonical form of our best scientific theories rather than indispensability. Still, the debate continues in terms of indispensability, so we would be well served to clarify this term.

The first thing to note is that ‘dispensability’ is not the same as ‘eliminability’. If this were not so, every entity would be dispensable (due to a theorem of Craig).[3] What we require for an entity to be ‘dispensable’ is for it to be eliminable and that the theory resulting from the entity's elimination be an attractive theory. (Perhaps, even stronger, we require that the resulting theory be more attractive than the original.) We will need to spell out what counts as an attractive theory but for this we can appeal to the standard desiderata for good scientific theories: empirical success; unificatory power; simplicity; explanatory power; fertility and so on. Of course there will be debate over what desiderata are appropriate and over their relative weightings, but such issues need to be addressed and resolved independently of issues of indispensability. (See Burgess (1983) and Colyvan (1999b) for more on these issues.)

These issues naturally prompt the question of how much mathematics is indispensable (and hence how much mathematics carries ontological commitment). It seems that the indispensability argument only justifies belief in enough mathematics to serve the needs of science. Thus we find Putnam speaking of "the set theoretic ‘needs’ of physics" (Putnam 1979b, p. 346) and Quine claiming that the higher reaches of set theory are "mathematical recreation ... without ontological rights" (Quine 1986, p. 400) since they do not find physical applications. One could take a less restrictive line and claim that the higher reaches of set theory, although without physical applications, do carry ontological commitment by virtue of the fact that they have applications in other parts of mathematics. So long as the chain of applications eventually "bottoms out" in physical science, we could rightfully claim that the whole chain carries ontological commitment. Quine himself justifies some transfinite set theory along these lines (Quine 1984, p. 788), but he sees no reason to go beyond the constructible sets (Quine 1986, p. 400). His reasons for this restriction, however, have little to do with the indispensability argument and so supporters of this argument need not side with Quine on this issue.

3. Naturalism and Holism

Although both premises of the Quine-Putnam indispensability argument have been questioned, it's the first premise that is most obviously in need of support. This support comes from the doctrines of naturalism and holism.

Following Quine, naturalism is usually taken to be the philosophical doctrine that there is no first philosophy and that the philosophical enterprise is continuous with the scientific enterprise (Quine 1981b). By this Quine means that philosophy is neither prior to nor privileged over science. What is more, science, thus construed (i.e. with philosophy as a continuous part) is taken to be the complete story of the world. This doctrine arises out of a deep respect for scientific methodology and an acknowledgment of the undeniable success of this methodology as a way of answering fundamental questions about all nature of things. As Quine suggests, its source lies in "unregenerate realism, the robust state of mind of the natural scientist who has never felt any qualms beyond the negotiable uncertainties internal to science" (Quine 1981b, p.72). For the metaphysician this means looking to our best scientific theories to determine what exists, or, perhaps more accurately, what we ought to believe to exist. In short, naturalism rules out unscientific ways of determining what exists. For example, naturalism rules out believing in the transmigration of souls for mystical reasons. Naturalism would not, however, rule out the transmigration of souls if our best scientific theories were to require the truth of this doctrine.[4]

Naturalism, then, gives us a reason for believing in the entities in our best scientific theories and no other entities. Depending on exactly how you conceive of naturalism, it may or may not tell you whether to believe in all the entities of your best scientific theories. I take it that naturalism does give us some reason to believe in all such entities, but that this is defeasible. This is where holism comes to the fore: in particular, confirmational holism.

Confirmational holism is the view that theories are confirmed or disconfirmed as wholes (Quine 1980b, p. 41). So, if a theory is confirmed by empirical findings, the whole theory is confirmed. In particular, whatever mathematics is made use of in the theory is also confirmed (Quine 1976, pp. 120-122). Furthermore, it is the same evidence that is appealed to in justifying belief in the mathematical components of the theory that is appealed to in justifying the empirical portion of the theory (if indeed the empirical can be separated from the mathematical at all). Naturalism and holism taken together then justify P1. Roughly, naturalism gives us the "only" and holism gives us the "all" in P1.

It is worth noting that in Quine's writings there are at least two holist themes. The first is the confirmational holism discussed above (often called the Quine-Duhem thesis). The other is semantic holism which is the view that the unit of meaning is not the single sentence, but systems of sentences (and in some extreme cases the whole of language). This latter holism is closely related to Quine's well-known denial of the analytic-synthetic distinction (Quine 1980b) and his equally famous indeterminacy of translation thesis (Quine 1960). Although for Quine, semantic holism and confirmational holism are closely related, there is good reason to distinguish them, since the former is generally thought to be highly controversial while the latter is considered relatively uncontroversial.

Why this is important to the present debate is that Quine explicitly invokes the controversial semantic holism in support of the indispensability argument (Quine 1980b, pp. 45-46). Most commentators, however, are of the view that only confirmational holism is required to make the indispensability argument fly (see, for example, Colyvan (1998); Field (1989, pp. 14-20); Hellman (199?); Resnik (1995a; 1997); Maddy (1992)) and my presentation here follows that accepted wisdom. It should be kept in mind, however, that while the argument, thus construed, is Quinean in flavor it is not, strictly speaking, Quine's argument.

4. Objections

There have been many objections to the indispensability argument, including Charles Parsons' (1980) concern that the obviousness of basic mathematical statements is left unaccounted for by the Quinean picture and Philip Kitcher's (1984, pp. 104-105) worry that the indispensability argument doesn't explain why mathematics is indispensable to science. The objections that have received the most attention, however, are those due to Hartry Field, Penelope Maddy and Elliott Sober. In particular, Field's nominalisation program has dominated recent discussions of the ontology of mathematics.

Field (1980) presents a case for denying the second premise of the Quine-Putnam argument. That is, he suggests that despite appearances mathematics is not indispensable to science. There are two parts to Field's project. The first is to argue that mathematical theories don't have to be true to be useful in applications, they need merely to be conservative. (This is, roughly, that if a mathematical theory is added to a nominalist scientific theory, no nominalist consequences follow that wouldn't follow from the nominalist scientific theory alone.) This explains why mathematics can be used in science but it does not explain why it is used. The latter is due to the fact that mathematics makes calculation and statement of various theories much simpler. Thus, for Field, the utility of mathematics is merely pragmatic - mathematics is not indispensable after all.

The second part of Field's program is to demonstrate that our best scientific theories can be suitably nominalised. That is, he attempts to show that we could do without quantification over mathematical entities and that what we would be left with would be reasonably attractive theories. To this end he is content to nominalise a large fragment of Newtonian gravitational theory. Although this is a far cry from showing that all our current best scientific theories can be nominalised, it is certainly not trivial. The hope is that once one sees how the elimination of reference to mathematical entities can be achieved for a typical physical theory, it will seem plausible that the project could be completed for the rest of science.[5]

There has been a great deal of debate over the likelihood of the success of Field's program but few have doubted its significance. Recently, however, Penelope Maddy, has pointed out that if P1 is false, Field's project may turn out to be irrelevant to the realism/anti-realism debate in mathematics.

Maddy presents some serious objections to the first premise of the indispensability argument (Maddy 1992; 1995; 1997). In particular, she suggests that we ought not have ontological commitment to all the entities indispensable to our best scientific theories. Her objections draw attention to problems of reconciling naturalism with confirmational holism. In particular, she points out how a holistic view of scientific theories has problems explaining the legitimacy of certain aspects of scientific and mathematical practices. Practices which, presumably, ought to be legitimate given the high regard for scientific practice that naturalism recommends. It is important to appreciate that her objections, for the most part, are concerned with methodological consequences of accepting the Quinean doctrines of naturalism and holism - the doctrines used to support the first premise. The first premise is thus called into question by undermining its support.

Maddy's first objection to the indispensability argument is that the actual attitudes of working scientists towards the components of well-confirmed theories vary from belief, through tolerance, to outright rejection (Maddy 1992, p. 280). The point is that naturalism counsels us to respect the methods of working scientists, and yet holism is apparently telling us that working scientists ought not have such differential support to the entities in their theories. Maddy suggests that we should side with naturalism and not holism here. Thus we should endorse the attitudes of working scientists who apparently do not believe in all the entities posited by our best theories. We should thus reject P1.

The next problem follows from the first. Once one rejects the picture of scientific theories as homogeneous units, the question arises whether the mathematical portions of theories fall within the true elements of the confirmed theories or within the idealized elements. Maddy suggests the latter. Her reason for this is that scientists themselves do not seem to take the indispensable application of a mathematical theory to be an indication of the truth of the mathematics in question. For example, the false assumption that water is infinitely deep is often invoked in the analysis of water waves, or the assumption that matter is continuous is commonly made in fluid dynamics (Maddy 1992, pp. 281-282). Such cases indicate that scientists will invoke whatever mathematics is required to get the job done, without regard to the truth of the mathematical theory in question (Maddy 1995, p. 255). Again it seems that confirmational holism is in conflict with actual scientific practice, and hence with naturalism. And again Maddy sides with naturalism. (See also Parsons (1983) for some related worries about Quinean holism.) The point here is that if naturalism counsels us to side with the attitudes of working scientists on such matters, then it seems that we ought not take the indispensability of some mathematical theory in a physical application as an indication of the truth of the mathematical theory. Furthermore, since we have no reason to believe that the mathematical theory in question is true, we have no reason to believe that the entities posited by the (mathematical) theory are real. So once again we ought to reject P1.

Maddy's third objection is that it is hard to make sense of what working mathematicians are doing when they try to settle independent questions. These are questions, that are independent of the standard axioms of set theory - the ZFC axioms.[6] In order to settle some of these questions, new axiom candidates have been proposed to supplement ZFC, and arguments have been advanced in support of these candidates. The problem is that the arguments advanced seem to have nothing to do with applications in physical science: they are typically intra-mathematical arguments. According to indispensability theory, however, the new axioms should be assessed on how well they cohere with our current best scientific theories. That is, set theorists should be assessing the new axiom candidates with one eye on the latest developments in physics. Given that set theorists do not do this, confirmational holism again seems to be advocating a revision of standard mathematical practice, and this too, claims Maddy, is at odds with naturalism (Maddy 1992, pp. 286-289).

Although Maddy does not formulate this objection in a way that directly conflicts with P1 it certainly illustrates a tension between naturalism and confirmational holism.[7] And since both these are required to support P1, the objection indirectly casts doubt on P1. Maddy, however, endorses naturalism and so takes the objection to demonstrate that confirmational holism is false. I'll leave the discussion of the impact the rejection of confirmational holism would have on the indispensability argument until after I outline Sober's objection, because Sober arrives at much the same conclusion.

Elliott Sober's objection is closely related to Maddy's second and third objections. Sober (1993) takes issue with the claim that mathematical theories share the empirical support accrued by our best scientific theories. In essence, he argues that mathematical theories are not being tested in the same way as the clearly empirical theories of science. He points out that hypotheses are confirmed relative to competing hypotheses. Thus if mathematics is confirmed along with our best empirical hypotheses (as indispensability theory claims), there must be mathematics-free competitors. But Sober points out that all scientific theories employ a common mathematical core. Thus, since there are no competing hypotheses, it is a mistake to think that mathematics receives confirmational support from empirical evidence in the way other scientific hypotheses do.

This in itself does not constitute an objection to P1 of the indispensability argument, as Sober is quick to point out (Sober 1993, p. 53), although it does constitute an objection to Quine's overall view that mathematics is part of empirical science. As with Maddy's third objection, it gives us some cause to reject confirmational holism. The impact of these objections on P1 depends on how crucial you think confirmational holism is to that premise. Certainly much of the intuitive appeal of P1 is eroded if confirmational holism is rejected. In any case, to subscribe to the conclusion of the indispensability argument in the face of Sober's or Maddy's objections is to hold the position that it's permissible at least to have ontological commitment to entities that receive no empirical support. This, if not outright untenable, is certainly not in the spirit of the original Quine-Putnam argument.

5. Conclusion

It is not clear how damaging the above criticisms are to the indispensability argument. Indeed, the debate is very much alive, with many recent articles devoted to the topic. (See bibliography notes below.) Closely related to this debate is the question of whether there are any other decent arguments for platonism. If, as some believe, the indispensability argument is the only argument for platonism worthy of consideration, then if it fails, platonism in the philosophy of mathematics seems bankrupt. Of relevance then is the status of other arguments for and against mathematical realism. In any case, it is worth noting that the indispensability argument is one of a small number of arguments that have dominated discussions of the ontology of mathematics. It is therefore important that this argument not be viewed in isolation.

The two most important arguments against mathematical realism are the epistemological problem for platonism - how do we come by knowledge of causally inert mathematical entities? (Benacerraf 1983b) - and the indeterminacy problem for the reduction of numbers to sets - if numbers are sets, which sets are they (Benacerraf 1983a)? Apart from the indispensability argument, the other major argument for mathematical realism is that it is desirable to provide a uniform semantics for all discourse: mathematical and non-mathematical alike (Benacerraf 1983b). Mathematical realism, of course, meets this challenge easily, since it explains the truth of mathematical statements in exactly the same way as in other domains.[8] It is not so clear, however, how nominalism can provide a uniform semantics.

Finally, it is worth stressing that even if the indispensability argument is the only good argument for platonism, the failure of this argument does not necessarily authorize nominalism, for the latter too may be without support. It does seem fair to say, however, that if the objections to the indispensability argument are sustained then one of the most important arguments for platonism is undermined. This would leave platonism on rather shaky ground.


Although the indispensability argument is to be found in many places in Quine's writings (including 1976; 1980a; 1980b; 1981a; 1981c), the locus classicus is Putnam's short monograph Philosophy of Logic (included as a chapter of the second edition of the third volume of his collected papers (Putnam, 1979b)). See also Putnam (1979a) and the introduction of Field (1989) which has an excellent outline of the argument. Colyvan (2001) is a sustained defence of the argument.

See Chihara (1973), and Field (1980; 1989) for attacks on the second premise and Colyvan (1999b; 2001), Maddy (1990), Malament (1982), Resnik (1985), Shapiro (1983) and Urquhart (1990) for criticisms of Field's program. For a fairly comprehensive look at nominalist strategies in the philosophy of mathematics (including a good discussion of Field's program), see Burgess and Rosen (1997), while Feferman (1993) questions the amount of mathematics required for empirical science. See Azzouni (1997; 2004), Balaguer (1996b; 1998), Leng (2002), Maddy (1992; 1995; 1997), Melia (2000; 2002), Peressini (1997), Pincock (2004), Sober (1993) and Vineberg (1996) for attacks on the first premise. Baker (2001; 2005), Colyvan (1998; 1999a; 2001; 2002; 2007), Hellman (1999) and Resnik (1995a; 1997) reply to some of these objections.

For variants of the Quinean indispensability argument see Maddy (1992) and Resnik (1995a).

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Related Entries

abduction | meaning holism | naturalism | nominalism: in metaphysics | Platonism: in metaphysics | Quine, Willard van Orman | realism


The author would like to thank Hilary Putnam, Helen Regan, Angela Rosier and Edward Zalta for comments on earlier versions of this entry.