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Medieval Theories of Future Contingents

First published Thu Jun 15, 2006

The philosophical debate concerning the truth-value of singular statements about future contingents derives from Chapter 9 of Aristotle's treatise De interpretatione (Peri hermeneias). In Chapters 7–8, Aristotle argues that an assertoric statement has a denial which denies exactly what the statement asserts and that these contradictory pairs usually divide truth and falsity so that one is true and the other is false. In Chapter 9 he raises the question of whether this holds of statements about singular future events or states of affairs which are neither necessary nor impossible and hence may come to pass but may not. Aristotle's famous example is tomorrow's sea battle. Is the prediction ‘There will be a sea battle tomorrow’ necessarily true, if it is true, and does its truth entail that the sea battle is inevitable? After a discussion of deterministic arguments and the absurdity of fatalism (18a34–19a22), Aristotle gives his reply in 19a23–39. Boethius's Latin translation of De interpretatione had a long commentary tradition through the Middle Ages, and Chapter 9 was also dealt with in theological commentaries on Peter Lombard's Sentences (I.38) and in separate treatises (Isaac 1953, Lohr 1967–74, Marenbon 1993, Braakhuis and Kneepkens 2003).

1. From Aristotle to Boethius

The debate about future contingents in modern philosophical logic was revived by J. Łukasiewicz's works on three-valued logic (1957, 1967). He thought that in order to avoid fatalistic consequences, one should admit that the principle of bivalence (for any proposition p, either p is true or p is false) does not hold good for future contingent propositions. Arguing that this was realized by Aristotle in Chapter 9 of De interpretatione, Łukasiewicz attempted to formalize Aristotle's position by introducing a third truth-value (neither true nor false) for future contingents and giving three-valued truth-tables for truth-functional basic connectives. Many authors have followed Łukasiewicz in taking Aristotle to restrict the principle of bivalence, though they have not ascribed to him the details of Łukasiewicz's system, which is problematic in many respects. In arguing for the deterministic consequences of unrestricted bivalence, Łukasiewicz himself assumed, and took Aristotle to assume, that the truth of a proposition entails the necessity of its truth. Logical determinism, therefore, is to be avoided by qualifying the truth-values of future contingent propositions. The critics of this view do not see any entailment relation between truth and necessity, some of them maintaining that the illusion of logical determinism has its roots in a tacit oscillation between a temporal and atemporal predication of truth. The temporalized reading may be associated with diachronic determination, certainty, necessity and other time-dependent qualifications. Mixing these with non-deterministic atemporal predications yields the wrong idea of fatalism (von Wright 1984, 52–67). It is also argued that even the temporalized predication of truth carries no deterministic implications. (Sorabji 1980, 96–103; Sorabji's example is that ‘even if it has already been true that I am going to swim, I still retain the power to make it to have been false’.)

The majority of Aristotelian scholars believe that the confusing argument in De interpretatione 9 aims at avoiding fatalism by restricting bivalence with respect to future contingent predictions (Frede 1970, 1985, Sorabji 1980, Craig 1988, Weidemann 1994, Gaskin 1995). The second interpretation insists that Aristotle's point is not to deny the truth of these statements, but their being true in the same way as other statements are true. The difference is that while the truth of other statements is necessary, the truth of future contingent statements is not yet similarly determined. This interpretation is associated with Aristotle's remark that not everything which is actual and therefore necessary is necessary without qualification (19a23). This is taken to mean that the necessity of an event at a certain time does not imply that it was inevitable. Aristotle speaks about singular future possibilities which may be realized or remain unrealized and which may or may not cease to be antecedent possibilities. (See De int. 19a13–17, EN III.5, 1114a17–19, Met. VI.3). In the same way predictions may begin to be necessarily true or necessarily false. (For various versions of this approach, see Anscombe 1956, Rescher 1963, Hintikka 1973, Fine 1984, Judson 1988).

The former interpretation, which restricts bivalence with respect to future contingent statements, is called the ‘traditional’ interpretation. It is traditional because some Stoics read Aristotle in this way, as Boethius reports in his second commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione:

Now some people – the Stoics among them – thought that Aristotle says that future contingents are neither true nor false. For they interpreted his saying that nothing [of that sort] is disposed more to being than to not being as meaning that it makes no difference whether they are thought false or true; for they considered them to be neither true nor false [in Aristotle's view], but falsely. (In Periherm. II, 208.1–4, trans. by N. Kretzmann)

On the basis of a note in Simplicius's commentary on Aristotle's Categories (407.6–13), it is argued that some Aristotelians also qualified the principle of bivalence. (For this and other ancient deviations from the principle, see Sorabji 1980, 92–3.) On the other hand, future contingent propositions were regarded as true or false in Stoic logic. The Stoics took the universally valid principle of bivalence to imply the predetermination of all future events. (See Cicero, De fato, 20–1, and Bobzien1998, 59–86).  

Boethius (c. 480–524) regarded the Stoic interpretation of Aristotle's view as mistaken, his interpretation being based on the terms ‘definitely’ true or false and ‘indefinitely’ true or false, which did not occur in Aristotle. These same terms were also used in Ammonius's commentary (435/445–517/526). Since this work was not known to Boethius, both authors seem to have known some earlier Greek discussions in which these qualifications were introduced. (Ammonius's Greek commentary on De interpretatione 9 is translated by D. Blank and Boethius's Latin commentaries by N. Kretzmann in the same volume, with interpretative essays by R. Sorabji, N. Kretzmann and M. Mignucci in 1998.) The contemporary reconstructions of what Ammonius and Boethius meant can be divided into two groups. According to one interpretation, Ammonius and Boethius ascribe to Aristotle the view that the predictions of future contingent events and their denials differ from other contradictory pairs, because truth and falsity are not definitely distributed between them and the propositions are consequently neither definitely true nor definitely false. In answering the Stoic criticism, Boethius might have thought that future contingent propositions have the disjunctive property of being true-or-false, which would mean something other than simply lacking a truth value. (For various interpretations of how Boethius restricted bivalence, see Frede 1985, Craig 1988, Gaskin 1995, Kretzmann 1998). Another interpretation holds that future contingents are not definitely true or false, because their truth-makers are not yet determined, but are true or false in an indeterminate way. No qualification of the principle of bivalence is involved. True statements are either determinately true or simply (indeterminately) true (Mignucci 1988, 1998 and Beets 2003 for Boethius's first commentary). Ammonius and Boethius assumed that the definite truth of predictions directly implies determinism. They also believed that Aristotle denied the definite truth of predictions, but it is less clear how they understood the indefinite truth of these (Sorabji 1998).

In his longer commentary on De interpretatione, Boethius says of God that ‘he knows future events as happening contingently and not necessarily so that he does not ignore the possibility that something else might take place’ (In Periherm. II, 226.9–12). Boethius also stresses that since the truth of future contingents is not accessible to humans, the predictions of the form ‘A sea battle will take place tomorrow’ are false even when evaluated as past predictions of what has taken place. What is false is the assertoric mode rather than what is asserted (In Periherm. II, 211.26–213.18). In his later treatise Consolatio philosophiae Boethius states that ‘I do not think that anybody would say that those things which are happening now were not going to happen before they happened’ (V. 4.19) In this treatise, Boethius argues that God is atemporal and has timeless knowledge of everything. God's timelessness involves his having the infinity of changing time present to him. God's knowledge is not foreknowledge, since it is not temporally located, but the predictions of future contingents are true or false from the point of view of God's eternal knowledge of the things referred to (V.6, 25–32; see also Augustine, City of God 11.21). It is necessary that if God knows that p, then p. This ‘conditional necessity’ does not imply the ‘simple necessity’ of p (Consolatio philosophiae V, 6.27–30). Some medieval authors read Boethius's distinction as a modal placement solution to the problem of foreknowledge and free will. Thomas Aquinas, for example, refers to Boethius's distinction using the terms necessitas consequentiae and necessitas consequentis (Summa contra gentiles I.67, De veritate I.23, ad 13). 

2. Medieval Developments from Abelard to Aquinas

In discussing statements such as ‘What is known by God necessarily takes place’, Anselm of Canterbury (1033–1109) distinguished between the antecedent and consequent necessity of things which are known. The latter is the necessity of a thing's actuality which is caused by the actuality of the thing itself. The former is the necessity by which a thing exists because of an external cause (Cur Deus homo 2.17, 125.6–126.2). Neither antecedent knowledge nor antecedent truth has a compelling effect on things. In explaining Mary's believing the truth of a prophetic statement concerning the death of Christ, Anselm writes:

Therefore, since her faith was true faith it was necessary that things would be as she believed. But if you are once again disturbed by my saying “It was necessary…”, then remember that the truth of the virgin's faith was not the cause of his dying freely but that her faith was true faith because this was going to happen. (Cur Deus homo 2.17, 124.27–125.3)

William of Champeaux (c. 1070–1122) dealt with an argument against the compatibility between contingency and divine omniscience which was discussed in Augustine's City of God (V.9). In response to Cicero's De fato and De divinatione, Augustine refuted the claim that the possibility of events having happened otherwise implies the possibility of error in God. William stated that the antecedent of the argument is true but the consequent is false and therefore the consequence is not valid (Lottin 1959, 195, Marenbon 1997, 226–7). Peter Abelard (1079–1142/4) , in discussing the same example, applied the systematic division between modal statements de sensu or in the compound sense and modal statements de re or in the divided sense. (For Abelard's modal terminology, see Super Perihermenias 3–47. Later authors used the expression de dicto instead of de sensu.) Abelard's analysis of Cicero's argument was often repeated in medieval theology, since it was put forward in slightly modified form in Peter Lombard's Sententiae (c. 1157–8), which became the standard medieval introduction to theology. Abelard states that when the proposition ‘A thing can be otherwise than it is’ is read as a modal proposition de sensu, the antecedent is false and the possibility of God's error as a consequent would not follow even if the consequence were valid. When the antecedent is read de re, it is true, but the consequent is false, since if things were otherwise, then God would possess different knowledge of them. This shows that the consequence is not valid. Following Peter Abelard, Peter Lombard formulated the same view in stating that ‘Things cannot be other than as God foreknows them’ is true in the compound sense and false in the divided sense. The truth of the compound sense saves God's infallibility and the falsity of the divided sense expresses God's freedom and the metaphysical contingency of the future. It is assumed that when something is, it is possible that it is not at that very instant of time at which it is actual. (Peter Lombard, Sententiae I.38.2; Peter Abelard, Logica ‘Ingredientibus’, 429.26–430.36; Dialectica, 217.27–219.24).

Future contingent statements could be dealt with as time-dependent future tense statement types with truth-values changing in accordance with the time of assertion, as in Aristotle and Hellenistic philosophy. (For the prevalence of temporally indefinite sentences in ancient philosophy, see Hintikka 1973, Ch. 4, Bobzien 1998, 66–7, 100–1, 109–111.) In the theological context of timeless divine omniscience, it was more natural to regard these statements or their asserted content as atemporal. Abelard calls statements propositions (propositio) and what is asserted by a statement its dictum. He considered that when a statement is true or false this is because its dictum is true or false. In dealing with prophesy, Abelard suggested that the dictum of a singular event is first expressed by a future tense statement and then by present and past tense statements. (For the nature of the dictum, contrasted with the ‘facts’ and ‘propositions’ of twentieth-century philosophical jargon, see Marenbon 1997, 202–9). The view of the atemporal propositional content was developed further by twelfth-century authors who were later called nominales. One of the theses of this group was “What is once true is always true.” (See Iwakuma and Ebbesen 1992, 196, 199–201, 205, 206 for the relevant texts. For the history of the principle, see also Marenbon 1992, 58–61 and Ebbesen 1992, 73–4, and Courtenay 1991, 11–48 for the history of twelfth-century nominales.) This thesis was often employed in the discussions of the question of how the beliefs of Abraham and others who lived before the coming of Christ and believed various things about him were the same as the beliefs of those who live after His coming. The reason for asking this was that the previous beliefs were formulated in future tense statements and the latter in present or past tense statements. According to the nominales, one could deal with these problems by regarding as basic a temporally definite propositional content the meaning of which is expressed by various tensed expressions depending on when they are uttered. While tensed statements about temporally definite singular events have a changing truth-value, the corresponding non-tensed dicta are unchangingly true or false (Nuchelmans 1973, 177–189; for some later examples, see also Nuchelmans 1980, Lewis 1995 and Goris 2001). Peter of Poitiers (c. 1130–1205), one of the authors taking this approach, argued that while a great number of the propositional contents known by God as true can be false, these cannot begin to be false. This is in accordance with the immutability of God's knowledge. God does not know contingent things through tensed statements, since their truth-value is changeable. If God's knowledge is described by using tensed statements, analogously to the articles of faith before and after the coming of Christ, one should read them so that they signify the same (Peter of Poitiers, Sententiae I.12.199–223; I.13.192–220). This became a well-known position, since it was also employed in Peter Lombard's Sententiae (I.39.1; 41.3.)

The theological formulations by Peter Abelard, Peter Lombard and Peter of Poitiers discussed above exemplify twelfth-century deviations from the Aristotelian thesis ‘What is necessarily is when it is.’ This was traditionally understood as implying the principle of the necessity of the present, which was not questioned in ancient modal theories (Knuuttila 1993, Ch. 1). Since God's knowledge about contingent things was regarded as unchangeable, the contingency of this knowledge also implied the denial of the Aristotelian equation of immutability with necessity, a denial regarded as an explicit doctrine of the nominales (Ebbesen and Iwakuma 1992, 194). The new modal paradigm which is more or less consciously applied in these discussions of God's will, power and knowledge could be characterized as the model of simultaneous alternatives. There are three main examples of it in early medieval philosophy. 

Abelard assumes that at a given instant of time, what is actual is necessary in the sense that it can no longer be avoided, but he argues that unrealized alternatives are possible at the same time in the sense that they could have happened at that time. Some of the alternatives of a singular being are real counterfactual alternatives. These are unrealizable because of some previous change in the conditions of the subject, and some are merely imaginable alternatives, such as Socrates's being a bishop, which never had a real basis in things. While often employing traditional ideas about necessity and possibility, Abelard also developed ideas pertaining to the new theory of simultaneous alternatives. (See Martin 2003).

Gilbert of Poitiers (1085/90–1154) stressed the idea that natural regularities which are called natural necessities are not absolute, since they are chosen by God and can be overridden by divine power. This had become a widespread theological view in Gilbert's time. Gilbert explained it in the light of the Augustinian view of God's acting by divine will, which chooses between alternative providential plans, and divine omnipotence as an executive power. There is an interesting formulation of Plato's ‘Platonitas’ in Gilbert. This is said to include all of what Plato was, is and will be as well as what he could be but never is. Even though Gilbert does not explain why there is a modal element in the individual concept, it was probably needed in order to speak about Plato in alternative possible histories or, as in Abelard, about Socrates as a bishop. Gilbert seems to have been the first to formulate an individual concept in this way (Knuuttila 1993, 75–82).

A third context of the systematic interest in simultaneous alternatives was the new twelfth-century theory that declarative singular statements or their contents should be primarily treated as temporally definite and as having an unchanging truth-value. All propositional contents pertaining to contingent things have a truth-value on the basis of God's eternal choice. These truth-values would be otherwise if the providential design of the world were different in relevant respects. Robert Grosseteste (1168/75–1253) taught that the opposites of actualized contingent things are no longer realizable possibilities, though they are possible alternatives in the sense that they could have been included in God's eternal providential choice. Actual history is an explication of one of the divine alternatives with respect to which things are primarily called necessary, possible or impossible. Necessities and possibilities at this basic level are called modalities ‘from eternity and without beginning’. Mathematical truths exemplify these ‘simple’ necessities. In addition there are necessities and impossibilities which have a beginning and which are eternal contingencies in the sense that they depend on God's free choice (De libero arbitrio 168.26–170.33, 178.28–9). The contingency of the divine acts of knowledge and will is based on an atemporal causal priority between the powers of knowledge and the will and their acts (178.24–6).

This was the innovative early medieval theory for dealing with future contingent statements which signified omnitemporally true or omnitemporally false propositional contents or, if these were tensed, antecedently true or antecedently false contents. These truths or falsehoods, though temporally immutable from the beginning of the world and also immutably known by God, were metaphysically contingent. The consequence from knowledge or truth to necessity, whether causal or semantic, was denied. Metaphysical contingency was taken to depend on God's eternal and free choice, which involved acts of the created will being free. Anselm formulated this traditional view, following Augustine, as follows: ‘It is both necessary that God foreknows what will come to be and that God foreknows that something will freely come to be’ (De concordia praescientiae et praedestinationis et gratiae Dei cum libero arbitrio, 1.1; cf. Augustine, On Free Choice of the Will, 3.3.8). Anselm argued that that predictions are true or false and their truth as correspondence can be understood as the correspondence to what will happen, although what will contingently happen is not known to human beings without supernatural help. This was the standard view of the possibility of prophesy. (See the above quotation from Anselm's Cur Deus homo, Peter Abelard, Logica ‘Ingredientibus’, 426–9, Summa Duacensis, 129–30).

Early medieval authors were well acquainted with the conception of God's eternal and timeless knowledge in Augustine and Boethius. This aspect of the question of the divine knowledge and future contingents was not particularly discussed before it became a central issue in Thomas Aquinas's theory of God's knowledge. According to Aquinas, God is the timeless and eternal ground of temporal beings which are timelessly present to God's eternal vision. God does not know temporal things merely as existing in his cognition, but grasps all combinations of things in particular times by one eternal vision. These are timelessly present to God, who has immediate knowledge of them and their relative temporal order, though none of them is past or future with respect to His cognition (Sent. I.38.1.4–5, Summa contra gentiles I.66, Summa theologiae I.14.9, 14). Things seen as actual are necessary by supposition (i. e., with respect to God's knowledge and providential plan), but many of them are contingent with respect to their proximate causes (Sent. I.38.1.5, Summa contra gentiles I.67, Summa theologiae I, 14.13, De veritate 2.12). The ultimate source of the actuality of the created order is the divine will (In Periherm. I.14, 197). The whole of world history is known by God's eternal and immutable vision, which includes the knowledge of things which are future contingents in the temporal order. This makes future contingent propositions true or false – otherwise there could not be true prophetic predictions (Summa theologiae II-2, 171.6). (For various interpretations of Aquinas's view, see Wippel 1985, Craig 1988, 99–126, Goris 1996.)

Medieval critics found the idea of the non-temporal presence of each instant of time to God's eternal vision problematic. (See John Duns Scotus, Lectura I.39.1–5, 23, 27, 85, 87 and further references in Hoenen 1993, 169–70). While some modern commentators have argued that God's free choice of the world and the contingency of foreknown things are compatible with the thesis of God's simplicity, it is also asked how it is possible to combine the denial of accidental divine attributes with the views that God's eternal choice could be otherwise and the voluntary acts of created beings could be other than what is known by God. (See Stump 2003, 100–127.)

3. Interpreting Aristotle

Mignucci's account of how Ammonius and Boethius understood the distinction between definite and indefinite truth is roughly speaking the same as the explanation of these terms in Peter Abelard's interpretation of De interpretatione 9. Abelard believed that Aristotle assumed that future contingent statements are true or false, though not determinately true or false before the actuality of the things to which they refer. He retained the principle of bivalence for all assertoric statements, but rejected the universal application of the stronger principle that every assertoric statement is determinately true or determinately false. According to Abelard, the notions of ‘determinate’ or ‘definite’ apply primarily to the truth-makers of assertions and secondarily to assertions themselves. Abelard was particularly interested in the question of whether the present truth of statements about future contingent events are themselves determinate; i. e., whether ‘The sentence ‘Socrates will eat tomorrow’ is true’, if true, is determinately true. Denying this, he restricted the principle that all past and present true propositions are determinately true. Abelard also distinguished between determinateness and certainty. Future contingent propositions may be certain if they are revealed by angels, for example, but they are not knowable of themselves and not determinately true. (See Logica ‘Ingredientibus’ 420.12–422.40, Dialectica 212.13–21; Lewis 1987.)    

While Abelard thought that the universal validity of the principle of bivalence was an Aristotelian view, thirteenth-century commentators were less sure about this. Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas stressed that the truth of the contradictory pairs of future contingents did not imply the determinate truth of their members. While regarding this as the main thesis of Chapter 9 of De interpretatione, they did not say that in Aristotle's view future contingents were true or false, apparently feeling unsure whether he would have counted indeterminately true statements as true (Albert the Great, Liber Perihermeneias, I.5.4–6, Thomas Aquinas, In Aristotelis Peri hermeneias expositio I.13–15). According to Aquinas, Aristotle shows that truth cannot always be attributed to one of the opposites and that truth is not altogether lacking to both of the opposites, for these cannot be simultaneously false (I.13, 7, 11) This was a step towards the traditional interpretation of Aristotle, and there were similar formulations in Arabic commentators Abū Nasr al-Fārābī (c. 870-950) and Averroes (Ibn Rŭsd, 1126–1198). (See Al-Farabi's Commentary and Short Treatise on Aristotle's De interpretatione, trans. F. Zimmermann, lxviii, 75–6, 78–9, 91–2, 244–5, and Averroes's  Middle Commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione, 29–33.) Al-Fārābī's own view was that future contingents are true or false (94–6; Marmura 1985). Among Latin authors the traditional interpretation was explicitly put forward by some later commentators, such as Walter Burley (Commentarius in librum Perihermeneias Aristotelis, ed. S. Brown, 92, 95–6), William Ockham (Expositio in Librum Perihermenias Aristotelis I.6.15), Peter Auriol (Sent. I.38.3, 817–28), Gregory of Rimini (Sent. I.38.1.1. (238–243) and Peter of Ailly (Quaestiones super Sent. I.11.1A). In his Supercommentary on Averroes's Commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione, the Jewish philosopher Levi ben Gerson (Gersonides, 1288–1344) states that positing a truth value for future contingents leads to absurdity (82v; Rudavsky 1985, 166). John Buridan read Aristotle in the same way as Abelard. All assertoric statements are true or false though those about future contingents are not determinately true or false (Questiones longe super librum Perihermeneias I.10). Since theologians usually thought that divine omniscience presupposed bivalence, the discussion of future contingents was divided into historical constructions of Aristotle's view and the systematic discussions in theology which usually followed the Abelardian lines. There was no one medieval interpretation of Aristotle. In late medieval times, many authors followed the view of Ockham. (See the anonymous treatise in Baudry 1950, 206 and Iodocus Trutfetter, Summulae totius logicae  II.1 (LL4v); Veteris artis…Perihermeneiasque expositio (g1r).). (For medieval interpretations, see also Weidemann 1994, Gaskin 1995.)

4. Later Medieval Views

The most influential late medieval approach to future contingents was included in John Duns Scotus's theory of metaphysics as a transcendental science in which the meaning of the univocal notion of being (ens) was defined as ‘that to which to be is not repugnant’. Beings in this metaphysical sense are actual things as well as non-actual possible things, the imagined actuality of which does not include contradiction. Scotus explains that this unusually broad notion of being is justified because possible beings differ from the absolute nothingness of impossible things, the concepts of which are contradictory (Honnefelder 2005.)

In the Augustinian tradition metaphysical possibilities were ultimately based on the divine essence and represented the ways in which it could be imitated by created things. According to Scotus, when God as an omniscient being knows all possibilities, he does not know them by turning first to his essence. Possibilities can be known in themselves; in fact, they would be what they are even if there were no God. Scotus calls the propositional formulations of pure possibilities logical possibilities (possibile logicum). These express things and states of affairs to which it is not repugnant to be. Possibilities as such have no kind of existence of their own, but are real in the sense that they form the precondition for everything that is or can be. (For Scotus's modal theory, see Knuuttila 1996, Normore 2003, Honnefelder 2005.) A great deal of Scotus's discussion of metaphysical themes concentrates on the modal explication of being and the disjunctive transcendental notions of necessity and contingency. Scotus takes it as an obvious fact that there are contingent states of affairs which in his view could have not been at that very moment of time at which they are (Ord. I.2.1.1–2, 86). This idea of simultaneous alternatives differed from the traditional view of the necessity of the present and played and important role in Scotus's proofs of the existence of a necessary first being which acts as the free first cause of the contingent world.

God's omniscience involves all possibilities and, as objects of God's knowledge, they necessarily receive intelligible or objective being. Some of these are included in God's providential plan of creation and will receive actual being. The description of a possible world at a certain moment consists of compossible possibilities. Since finite beings are contingently actual, alternative possibilities are possible with respect to the same time, though they are not compossible with what is actual. According to Scotus, impossibilities are incompossibilities between possible ingredients, such as Socrates's sitting at a certain time and Socrates's not sitting at that same time. God could have chosen a world in which the first happens by Socrates's free will or a world in which the second happens by Socrates's free will. Since these possibilities are real possibilities, though not compossible, they are Socrates's possibilities in alternative histories (Lect. I.39.1–5, 62–3; Ord. I.35, 32, 49–51; Ord. I.36, 60–1; Ord. I.43, 5–7, 14).

Scotus's modal metaphysics incorporates many ideas from the early medieval model which was developed by Abelard and the nominales, such as the denial of the necessity of the present, the distinction between immutability and necessity and the universal validity of bivalence. The systematic account of these themes in Scotus's theory made it the most discussed account of God's knowledge and contingency in late medieval and early modern thought. (See Schwamm 1934, Vos et al. 1994, Söder 1999.)

Some contemporary commentators have followed those medieval authors who wondered how the acts of the will can be free, if the description of any act is included in the providential plan which is based on God's eternal choice. The critics dismiss the notion that the acts of will are included in a traditional way in the divine providential plan as the acts of free causes which choose between alternatives without being determined. (For Scotus's view of the free acts of the will, see Dumont 2001, Normore 2003, 141–5.) In dealing with the free acts of the will, he says that in addition to this logical potency there is also a real potency which is analysed in the same way (Lect. I.39.1–5, n. 50–1). Before a future instant of time, the will as a free cause does not lose the power to choose between mutually exclusive alternatives with respect to that time and still has it at that time, independently of what its volitions then are.

William Ockham criticized this conception, arguing that a power which cannot be actualized is not real. He also rejected Scotus's attempt to explain the contingency of God's choice by distinguishing between the instants of nature in God which represent conceptual succession without separation or interval, for example, the instant of the will encountering opposite alternatives and the instant of choosing one of these. (See Sent. I.38.1 in Opera theologica IV, 578, 581; Adams 1987, 1130–1136. ) Ockham followed Scotus in believing that God's choice could be other than it is. He was dissatisfied with Scotus's explanation without having any of his own. Ockham also criticized the view that God knows future free acts through his own acts of the will as their ultimate cause, which he, like some of his contemporaries and later commentators, treats as Scotus's position (Sent. I.38.1, Opera theologica IV, 582–3). In fact this was Henry of Ghent's view, which was commonly criticized as incompatible with the freedom of the will. It is mentioned but not accepted by Scotus. (See Hoenen  1993. 177–9, Söder 1999, 177–83.)

Ockham believed, as Scotus did, that future contingent propositions are true or false, that created wills are non-determined free causes and that God knows these without their being atemporally present to God. (For Ockham's view and the relevant texts, see Adams and Kretzmann 1983.)  Scotus and Ockham argued that only God and the present things are actual. While Scotus preferred to distinguish God's eternal knowledge and choice from the temporal order sharply (Lect. I.39.1–2, n. 28, 85, Ord. I.40, n. 8), Ockham thought that they can be treated as temporally past. This led him to ask how God's foreknowledge as something past and hence seemingly necessary is compatible with the contingency of the future things. Ockham's answer was that even though God's foreknowledge is past, its content is future, and the past truth of future contingent propositions does not fall under the necessity of the past. (Sent. I.38.1, Opera theologica IV, 587, Tractatus de praedestinatione, Opera philosophica, 515–6). Many influential late thinkers embraced this idea. (See Robert Holkot, Sent. II.2 in Seeing the Future Clearly, 127, 145–6, Gregory of Rimini, Sent. I.38.2.3 (302–2) and Pierre d'Ailly, Quaestiones super Sent. I.11.3S). This is also the hallmark of what is called the Ockhamist view of divine foreknowledge in contemporary philosophical theology (Zagzebski 1991, 66–97).  

Many early fourteenth-century authors were interested in the distinctions between determinate and indeterminate truth and falsity. Ockham characterized all prospective truths, whether necessary or contingent, as immutable and therefore determinate, but there were other suggestions as well (Normore 1982, 1993, Genest 1992, Gelber 2004, 224–250). It was increasingly believed that in Aristotle future contingent statements were neither true nor false, and some authors associated the notions of indeterminate truth and falsity with the denial of bivalence for future contingent statements. One of these was Peter Auriol, who argued that since these lack a truth value, even God is aware of the future in a way which does not imply that future contingent statements are true or false (Schabel 2000, 67–123). This was an exceptional view, and came to be regarded as heretical when a Papal commission made a decision about the theses of Peter de Rivo, who defended a view similar to that of Auriol. Some of de Rivo's statements were officially damned in 1474 by Pope Sixtus IV (Baudry 1950, Schabel 1995, 1996, 2000, 315–36).

Giving up the Boethian-Thomistic view of the atemporal presence of the flux of time to God, many authors wondered how God could know the acts of the will, which is a free cause. This question was dealt with in the theory of middle knowledge by Luis de Molina (1535–1600). In addition to the knowledge of all possibilities and the possibilities which will be actualized in the providentially chosen history, God has a third kind of knowledge (scientia media), which comprises the hypothetical truths about possible beings. In creating the world, God knows what possible creatures would do in any possible situation (Freddoso 1988). Molina's ‘middle knowledge’ theory about counterfactuals of freedom was actively debated in the sixteenth and seventeenth century and has remained a living issue in the philosophy of religion (Dekker 2000).


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Auriol [Aureol, Aureoli], Peter | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | fatalism | free will: divine foreknowledge and | Gersonides | Gregory of Rimini | Holkot [Holcot], Robert | modality: medieval theories of | prophecy