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Medieval Theories of Modality

First published Wed Jun 30, 1999; substantive revision Wed Nov 5, 2008
First published Wed Jun 30, 1999; substantive revision Thu Jul 31, 2003; substantive revision Sun Aug 31, 2008

There are four modal paradigms in ancient philosophy: the ‘statistical’ or ‘temporal frequency’ interpretation of modality, the model of possibility as a potency, the model of antecedent necessities and possibilities with respect to a certain moment of time (diachronic modalities), and the model of possibility as non-contradictoriness. None of these conceptions, which were well known to early medieval thinkers through the works of Boethius, was associated with the idea of modality as involving reference to simultaneous alternatives. This new paradigm was introduced into Western thought in early twelfth-century discussions influenced by Augustine's theological conception of God as acting by choice between alternative histories.

While the new idea of associating modal terms with simultaneous alternatives was used also in thirteenth-century theology, it was not often discussed in philosophical contexts. The increasing acceptance of Aristotle's philosophy in the thirteenth century gave support to traditional modal paradigms, as is seen in Robert Kilwardby's influential commentary on Aristotle's Prior Analytics, in which modal syllogistics is treated as an essentialist theory of the structures of being. There were analogous discussions of philosophical and theological modalities in Arabic philosophy. Arabic modal theories influenced Latin discussions mainly through the translations of Averroes's works.

John Duns Scotus developed the conception of modality as alternativeness into a detailed theory. A logically possible state of affairs is something to which to be is not repugnant, though it may not be compossible with other possibilities. Scotus's modal semantics influenced early fourteenth-century philosophy and theology in many ways. The new modal logic which was developed by William Ockham, John Buridan and others was based on the new modal semantics. Thirteenth-century essentialist assumptions were dropped from modal syllogistics, the Aristotelian version of which was regarded as a fragmentary theory without a sufficient explication of the various fine structures of modal propositions.

1. Aspects of Ancient Modal Paradigms

In speaking about the general features of the universe, ancient philosophers were inclined to think that all generic possibilities will be actualized, a habit of thinking called the principle of plenitude by Arthur O. Lovejoy (1936). Correspondingly, it was natural for them to think that the types of things which never occur are impossible and that the invariant structures of reality are necessary. This line of thought is found, e.g., in Plato's doctrine of ideas which are exhaustively imitated in the world by the Demiurge, in Aristotle's theory of the priority of actuality over potentiality, in the Stoic doctrine of God, the world-order, and the eternal cosmic cycle, and in Plotinus's metaphysics of emanation (Knuuttila 1993).

In these approaches to the constituents of the universe, modal terms are used in accordance with the so-called ‘statistical’ or ‘temporal frequency’ model of modality where the meaning of modal terms is spelled out extensionally as follows: what is necessary is always actual, what is impossible is never actual and what is possible is at least sometimes actual. The term ‘statistical interpretation of modality’ was introduced into the modern discussion by Oscar Becker (1952), and it has been applied since in descriptions of certain ways of thinking in the history of philosophy as well, particularly by Jaakko Hintikka (1973).

Even though Aristotle did not define modal terms with the help of extensional notions, this model can be found in his discussion of eternal beings, the natures of things, the types of events, or generic statements about such things. Modal terms refer to the one and only world of ours and classify the types of things and events on the basis of their occurrence. This paradigm suggests that actualization is the general criterion of the genuineness of possibilities, but the deterministic implications of this view compelled Aristotle to seek ways of speaking about unrealized singular possibilities. Diodorus Chronus (fl. 300 B.C.) was a determinist who found no problem in this way of thinking. Some commentators have argued that Aristotle's views showing similarities to the statistical model are based on some special metaphysical and ontological doctrines and not on his conception of modal terms. However, it is not clear that Aristotle had any such distinction in mind. (For different interpretations and evaluations of the role of this model in Aristotle, see Hintikka 1973, Sorabji 1980, Seel 1982, Waterlow 1982a, White 1985, van Rijen 1989, Gaskin 1995.) In Posterior Analytics I.6 Aristotle says that certain predicates may belong to their subjects at all times without belonging to them necessarily. Some commentators have taken this to mean that Aristotle operated with a distinction between strong essential per se necessities and weak accidental necessities in the sense of non-essential invariances, such as inseparable accidents (see also Porphyry Isagoge 3.5-6), and that this distinction played an important role in his modal syllogistic. This was also the view of Averroes and some Latin authors in the Middle Ages. (See below.)

Another Aristotelian modal paradigm was that of possibility as potency. In Met. V.12 and IX.1 potency is said to be the principle of motion or change either as the activator or as the receptor of a relevant influence. (For agent and patient in Aristotle's natural philosophy in general, see Waterlow 1982b.) The types of potency-based possibilities belonging to a species are recognized as possibilities because of their actualization - no natural potency type remains eternally frustrated. Aristotle says that when the agent and the patient come together as being capable, the one must act and the other must be acted on (Met. IX.5). I shall return to this formulation.

In De Caelo I.12 Aristotle supposes, per impossibile, that a thing has contrary potencies, one of which is always actualized. He argues that the alleged unactualized potencies cannot be real, because one cannot assume them to be realized at any time without contradiction. Aristotle applies here the model of possibility as non-contradictoriness which is defined in Prior Analytics I.13 as follows: when a possibility is assumed to be realized, it results in nothing impossible. In speaking about the assumed non-contradictory actualization of a possibility Aristotle thinks that it is realized in our one and only history. The argument in De caelo excludes those which remain eternally unrealized from the set of genuine possibilities. It also shows that Aristotle did not operate with the distinction between logical and physical modalities and that the idea of simultaneous alternatives was absent from his modal thought. (See also Met. IX.4.)

Aristotle heavily criticized some of his contemporaries who claimed that only that which takes place is possible (Met. IX.3). His problem was, as mentioned, that the assumptions of his modal conceptions pushed him towards a very similar position with respect to singular possibilities. The model of possibility as potency prima facie allowed Aristotle to speak about all kinds of unrealized singular possibilities by referring to passive or active potencies, but taken separately they represent partial possibilities which do not guarantee that their actualization can take place. More is required for a real singular possibility, but when the further requirements are added, such as a contact between the active and passive factor and the absence of an external hindrance, the potency model suggests that the potency can really be actualized only when it is actualized (Met. IX.5, Phys. VIII.1). It is possible that this led Aristotle to define motion (kinêsis) as the actuality of the potentiality (of the end) qua potentiality (Phys. III.1), but this did not explain the possibility of beginning (Hintikka et al. 1977).

In discussing future contingent statemets in In Chapter 9 of De interpretatione, Aristotle says that what is necessarily is when it is, but he then qualifies this necessity of the present with the remark that it does not follow that what is actual is necessary without qualification. If he meant that the temporal necessity of a present event does not imply that such an event necessarily takes place in circumstances of that type, this is an unsatisfactory ‘statistical’ attempt to avoid the problem that changeability as a criterion of contingency makes all temporally definite singular events necessary (Hintikka 1973). Another interpretation is that Aristotle wanted to show that the necessity of an event at a certain time does not imply that it would have been antecedently necessary. Aristotle discusses such singular diachronic modalities in some places (Met. VI.3; EN III.5, 1114a17-21; De int. 19a13-17) in which he seems to assume that the conditions which at t1 are necessary for p to obtain at a later time t2 are not necessarily sufficient for this, although they are sufficient for the possibility (at t1) that p or its alternative obtains at t2. Aristotle did not elaborate these ideas, which might have been his most promising attempt to formulate a theory of unrealized singular possibilities. (The importance of this model is particularly stressed in Waterlow 1982a; see also von Wright 1984; Weidemann 1986; Gaskin 1995.)

Aristotle's conceptual difficulties can be seen from his various attempts to characterize the possibilities based on dispositional properties such as heatable, separable, or countable. Analogous discussions were not unusual in later ancient philosophy. In Philo's definition of possibility (ca. 300 B.C.), the existence of a passive potency was regarded as a sufficient ground for speaking about a singular possibility. The Stoics revised this definition by adding the condition of the absence of external hindrance, thinking that otherwise the alleged possibility could not be realized. They did not add that an activator is needed as well, because then the difference between potentiality and actuality would disappear. According to the deterministic Stoic world view, fate as a kind of active potency necessitates everything, but they did not accept the Master Argument of Diodorus Cronus for determinism, which was meant to show that there cannot be possibilities which will not be realized. The number of passive potencies with respect to a definite future instant of time(t1) is greater than what will be realized. As long as these possibilities are not prevented from being realized by other things, they in some sense represent open possibilities. Alexander Aphrodisias thought that it was misleading to speak about about unrealized diachronic possibilities if everything is determined. He argued for what he took to be Aristotle's view, namely that there are undetermined prospective alternatives which remain open options until the moment of time to which they refer. (See Sharples 1983; Bobzien 1993, 1998; Hankinson 1998.) Neither Aristotle nor later ancient thinkers had any conception of synchronic alternatives. They thought that what is necessarily is when it is, and that the alternative possibilities disappear when the future is fixed. Alexander's Peripatetic theory of alternative prospective possibilities could be called the model of diachronic modalities without synchronic alternatives: there are transient singular alternative possibilities, but those which will not be realized disappear instead of remaining unrealized.

Aristotle often made use of indirect arguments from false or impossible positions by adding hypotheses which he himself labeled as impossible. In order to defend Aristotle's procedure agains ancient critics, Alexander of Aphrodisias characterized these hypostheses as impossibilities which were not nonsensical. (For this controversy, see Kukkonen 2002.) Some late ancient authors were interested in impossible hypotheses as tools for conceptual analysis. In the arguments which were called Eudemian procedures something impossible was assumed in order to see what followed. The impossibilities discussed in this way by Philoponus and Boethius show similarities with Porphyry's characterization of inseparable accidents as something which cannot occur separately but can be separated in thought. These hypotheses were not regarded as formulations of possibilities in the sense of what could be actual; they were counterpossible and not merely counterfactual (Martin 1999).

There are several recent works on Aristotle's modal syllogistics, but no generally accepted historical reconstruction which would make it a coherent theory. It was apparently based on various assumptions which were not fully compatible. (For some reconstructions, see van Rijen 1989; Patterson 1995; Thom 1996; Nortmann 1996; Malink 2006.)

2. Early Medieval Developments

The early medieval thinkers were well acquainted with ancient modal conceptions through Boethius's works. One of the Aristotelian modal paradigms occurring in Boethius is that of possibility as potency (potestas, potentia). According to Boethius, when the term ‘possibility’ (possibilitas) is applied in the sense of ‘potency’, it refers to real powers or tendencies, the ends of which are either actual or non-actual at the moment of utterance. Some potencies are never unrealized. They are said to be necessarily actual. When potencies are not actualized, their ends are said to exist potentially (In Periherm. II.453-455). Necessarily actual potencies leave no room for the potencies of their contraries, for they would remain unrealized forever and the constitution of nature cannot include elements which would be in vain (In Periherm. II. 236). The potencies of non-necessary features of being do not exclude contrary potencies. They are not always and universally actualized, but as potency-types even these potencies are taken to satisfy the actualization criterion of genuineness (In Periherm. I.120-1; II.237).

Boethius's view that the types of potencies and potency based possibilities are sometimes actualized is in agreement with the Aristotelian statistical interpretation of modality. This is another Boethian conception of necessity and possibility. He thought that modal notions can be regarded as tools for expressing temporal or generic frequencies. According to the temporal version, what always is is by necessity, and what never is is impossible. Possibility is interpreted as expressing what is at least sometimes actual. Correspondingly, a generic property of a species is possible only if it is exemplified at least in one member of that species (In Periherm. I.120-1, 200-201; II.237).

Like Aristotle, Boethius often treated statement-making utterances as temporally indeterminate sentences. The same sentence can be uttered at different times, and many of these temporally indeterminate sentences may sometimes be true and sometimes false, depending on the circumstances at the moment of utterance. If the state of affairs the actuality of which makes the sentence true is omnitemporally actual, the sentence is true whenever it is uttered. In this case, it is necessarily true. If the state of affairs associated with an assertoric sentence is always non-actual, the sentence is always false and therefore impossible. A sentence is possible only if what is asserted is not always non-actual (I.124-125). Statistical ideas are also employed in Ammonius's Greek commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione which shares some sources with Boethius's work (88.12-28) and in Alexander of Aphrodisias's commentary on Aristotle's modal syllogistic (Mueller 1999).

In dealing with Chapter 9 of Aristotle's De interpretatione Boethius argues (II.241) that because

(1) M(pt   &   ¬ pt)
(1) It is possible that p obtains at t and not-p obtains at t.

is not acceptable, one should also deny

(2) pt   &   Mt ¬pt
(2) p obtains at t and it is possible at t that not-p obtains at t.

The denial of (2) is equivalent to

(3) pt →  Lt pt
(3) If p obtains at t then it is necessary at t that p obtains at t.

(2) was generally denied in ancient philosophy and its denial was taken as an axiom by Boethius as well. Correspondingly, (3) shows how the necessity of the present was understood in ancient thought. Boethius thought that the temporal necessity of p can be qualified by shifting attention from temporally definite cases or statements to their temporally indeterminate counterparts (I.121-122; II.242-243; cf. Ammonius 153.24-26). This was one of Boethius's interpretations of the Aristotelian distinction between necessity now and necessity without qualification. But he also made use of the diachronic model according to which the necessity of p at t does not imply that, before t, it is necessary that p obtains at t.

Boethius developed the diachronic ideas as part of his criticism of Stoic determinism. If it is not true that everything is causally necessitated, there must be genuine alternatives in the course of events. Free choice was the source of contingency in which Boethius was mainly interested, but he thought in addition that according to the Peripatetic doctrine there is a real factor of indeterminacy in the causal nexus of nature. When Boethius refers to chance, free choice, and possibility in this context, his examples include temporalized modal notions which refer to diachronic prospective possibilities at a given moment of time. A temporally determinate prospective possibility may not be realized at the time to which it refers, in which case it ceases to be a possibility. Boethius did not develop the idea of simultaneous alternatives which would remain intact even when diachronic possibilities had vanished, insisting that only what is actual at a certain time is at that time possible at that time (cf. (3) above). But he also thought that there are objective singular contingencies, so that the result of some prospective possibilities is indefinite and uncertain ‘not only to us who are ignorant, but to nature’ (In Periherm. I.106, 120; II.190-192, 197-198, 203, 207). (For Boethius's modal conceptions, see Kretzmann 1985; Knuuttila 1993, 45-62.)

As for the discussion of future contingent statements in De interpretatione 9, Boethius's view shows similarities to that of Ammonius, both authors apparently having known some similar Greek discussions. (Ammonius's Greek commentary on De interpretatione is translated by D. Blank and Boethius's two Latin commentaries by N. Kretzmann in the same volume, with essays by R. Sorabji, N. Kretzmann and M. Mignucci, in 1998.) According to the majority interpretation, Ammonius and Boethius ascribe to Aristotle the view that the predictions of future contingent events and their denials differ from other contradictory pairs, because truth and falsity are not definitely distributed between them and the propositions are consequently neither true nor false. (For various interpretations of how Boethius restricted bivalence, see Frede 1985; Craig 1988; Gaskin 1995, Kretzmann 1998.) Another interpretation holds that future contingents are not definitely true or false in Boethius's view, because their truth-makers are not yet detemined, but are true or false in an indeterminate way. No qualification of the principle of bivalence is involved (Mignucci 1989, 1998; for related interpretation of Ammonius, see Seel 2000.) While most medieval thinkers regarded the latter view as true, many of them thought that Aristotle's opinion was similar to the majority interpretation of Boethius. Peter Abelard and John Buridan were among those who read Aristotle as holding that future contingent propositions are true or false. Peter Auriol argued that these propositions lack a truth-value; even God is aware of the future in a way which does not imply the contrary. This was an exceptional view. (See Normore 1982, 1993; Lewis 1987; Schabel 2000; Knuuttila 2006.) Boethius, Thomas Aquinas, and many others thought that God can know future contingents only because the flux of time is present to divine eternity. Many late medieval thinkers defended God's ability to foreknow free acts. This led to the so-called middle knowledge theory of the counterfactuals of freedom (Craig 1988; Freddoso 1988; Dekker 2000).

From the point of view of the history of modal thought, interesting things took place in theology in the eleventh and twelfth centuries. Augustine had already criticized the application of the statistical model of possibility to divine power; for him, God has freely chosen the actual world and its providential plan from alternatives which he could have realized but did not will to do (potuit sed noluit). This way of thinking differs from ancient philosophical modal paradigms, because the metaphysical basis is now the eternal domain of simultaneous alternatives instead of the idea of one necessary world order. In Augustine God's eternal ideas of finite beings represent the possibilities of how the highest being can be imitated, the possibilities thus having an ontological foundation in God's essence. This was the dominating conception of theological modal metaphysics until Duns Scotus departed from it. The discrepancy between the Catholic doctrine of God's freedom and power and the philosophical modal conceptions was brought into the scope of discussion by Peter Damian and Anselm of Canterbury and was developed in a more sophisticated way in twelfth-century discussions of the distinction between God's absolute and ordained power and between divine and natural possibilities. While the new idea of associating modal terms with simultaneous alternatives continued to be used in thirteenth-century theology, it was not often discussed in philosophical contexts. The increasing acceptance of Aristotle's philosophy gave support to traditional modal paradigms in logical treatises on modalities, in metaphysical theories of the principles of being, and in the discussions of causes and effects in natural philosophy. (See Holopainen 1996; Knuuttila 2001, 2001a, 2004, 2005; for Arabic discussions; see also Bäck 2001; Kukkonen 2000, 2002.)

In addition to Augustinian theological issues, one can find some theoretical considerations of the new modal semantics in the twelfth century. Even though Abelard made use of traditional modal concepts, he was also interested in the philosophical significance of the idea of modality as alternativeness. Assuming that what is actual is temporally necessary at a certain point of time as no longer avoidable, he adds that unrealized counterfactual alternatives are possible at the same time in the sense that they could have happened at that time. There are also merely imaginable alternatives, such as Socrates' being a bishop, which never had a real basis in things. (See Martin 2001, 2003; Marenbon 2007, 156-158, is sceptical about this interpretation.) Gilbert of Poitiers stressed the idea that natural regularities which are called natural necessities are not absolute, since they are freely chosen by God and can be overridden by divine power. This basically Augustinian conception was a widespread theological view, but in explaining Plato's ‘Platonitas’ Gilbert argues that this includes all that Plato was, is and will be as well as what he could be but never is (The Commentaries on Boethius 144.77-78, 274.75-76). The modal element of the individual concept was probably needed in order to speak about Plato in alternative possible histories (Knuuttila 1993, 75-82). An interesting early thirteenth-century philosophical analysis of Augustinian modalities was put forward by Robert Grosseteste (Lewis 1996; Knuuttila 2005, 713). One of the theses of twelfth-century authors, later called nominales, was that ‘What is once true is always true’. It was argued that while tensed statements about temporally definite singular events have a changing truth-value, the corresponding non-tensed propositions are unchangingly true or false, without being necessarily true or false for this reason (Nuchelmans 1973, 177-189; Iwakuma and Ebbesen 1992). This was in agreement with Abelard's view that future contingent propositions are true or false. The actuality of a contingent state of affairs at a specified future time does not exclude the non-temporal possibility of simultaneous alternatives, nor does the truth of a proposition about this state of affairs make it necessary (Logica ‘Ingredientibus’ 421.28-422.40, 429.26-430.36; see also 272.39-273.19 and Super Perihermenias 36.11-21, 41.23-42.6; Peter of Poitiers, Sententiae I.7.133-43, I.12.164-223, I.13, 192-220.)

3. Modalities in Thirteenth Century Logical Treatises

Modifying Boethius's systematization of Aristotle's remarks in De interpretatione 12 and 13, twelfth- and thirteenth-century logicians often presented the equipollences between modal terms and opposed relations between modal propositions with the help of the following diagram:


The square could be taken to refer to modals de dicto or singular modals de re (see below.) Abelard tried to define the opposed relations between quantified de re modals as well, mistakenly thinking that these were the same as those between singular modal propositions (Super Periherm. 26.8-15). This question was not much discussed before its satisfactory solution in fourteenth-century modal semantics. (See Hughes 1989 and his description of Buridan's octagon of modal opposites and equipollences.)

The anonymous Dialectica Monacensis (ca. 1200) is one of the numerous works representing the new terminist approach to logic and can be used as an example of how modalities were treated in it. (A collection of late twelfth and early thirteenth century logical texts is edited in de Rijk 1962-67.) In discussing the quantity (universal, particular, singular) and quality (affirmative, negative) of the modals, the author states that modal terms may be adverbial or nominal. The modal adverb qualifies the copula, and the structure of the sentence can be described as follows:

(4) quantity/subject/modalized copula/predicate (for example: Some A's are necessarily B)

In this form, the negation can be located in different places, either

(5) quantity/subject/copula modalized by a negated mode/predicate (for example: Some A's are-not-necessarily B)


(6) quantity/subject/modalized negative copula/predicate (for example: Some A's are-necessarily-not B)

The modal sentences with nominal modes can be read in two ways. One can apply an adverbial type of reading to them, which is said to be how Aristotle treats modal sentences in the Prior Analytics. The quality and quantity of such a de re modal sentence is determined by the corresponding non-modal sentence. In a de dicto modal sentence that which is asserted in a non-modal sentence is considered as the subject about which the mode is predicated. When modal sentences are understood in this way, they are always singular, their form being:

(7) subject/copula/mode (for example: That some A's are B is necessary.)

This reading is said to be the one which Aristotle presented in De interpretatione (De Rijk 1967, II-2, 479.35-480,26). The idea of the systematic distinction between the readings de dicto (in sensu composito) and de re (in sensu diviso) of modally qualified statements was introduced into medieval discussions in Abelard's investigations of modal statements (Super Periherm. 3-47, Dialectica 191.1-210.19) and was often mentioned, as in the Dialectica Monacensis, in discussions of the composition-division ambiguity of sentences. (See also Maierù 1972, ch. 5; Jacobi 1980, ch. 4.)

The author of the Dialectica Monacensis says that the matter of an assertoric sentence may be natural, remote, or contingent. True affirmative sentences about a natural matter maintain the existence of natural compounds which cannot be otherwise; these sentences as well as the natural compounds are called necessary. False affirmative sentences about a remote matter maintain the existence of compounds which are necessarily non-existent; they are called impossible. Sentences about a contingent matter are about compounds which can be actual and which can be non-actual (472.9-473.22). The theory of the modal matter was popular in early medieval logic and was also dealt with in mid-thirteenth-century handbooks. It was sometimes associated with the statistical interpretation of natural modalities, for example by Thomas Aquinas who wrote that universal propositions are false and particular propositions are true in contingent matter (In Periherm. I.13, 168). Another often discussed theme was the distinction between modalities per se and per accidens which was based on the idea that the modal status of a temporally indefinite sentence may be changeable or not; for example, ‘You have not been in Paris’ may begin to be impossible, whereas ‘You either have or have not been in Paris’ may not. (See, for example, William of Sherwood, Introduction to Logic, 41). Another distinction between sentences necessary per se and per accidens was based on Aristotle's theory of per se predication in Posterior Analytics I.4. A sentence was said to be accidentally necessary when it was unchangeably true but, as distinct from per se predications, there was no necessary conceptual connection between subject and predicate. This became an important part of thirteenth-century interpretations of Aristotle's modal syllogistics. (See, for example, Robert Kilwardby's In libros Priorum Analyticorum expositio (ca. 1240, 7ra-b, 45rb)

One example of the prevalence of the traditional use of modal notions can be found in the early medieval de dicto/de re analysis of examples such as ‘A standing man can sit’. It was commonly stated that the composite (de dicto) sense is ‘It is possible that a man sits and stands at the same time’ and that on this reading the sentence is false. The divided (de re) sense is ‘A man who is now standing can sit’ and on this reading the sentence is true. Many authors formulated the divided possibility as follows: ‘A standing man can sit at another time’. It was assumed that a possibility refers to an actualization in the one and only world history and that it cannot refer to the present moment because of the necessity of the present understood in the Aristotelian sense formulated in (2) and (3) above. When authors referred to another time, they thought that the possibility will be realized at that time or that the divided possibility refers to the future even though it may remain unrealized. Those who made use of the modern idea of simultaneous alternatives took the composite reading to refer to one and the same state of affairs and the divided reading to simultaneous alternative states of affairs. This analysis was also applied to the question of whether God's knowledge of things makes them necessary (Knuuttila 1993, 118-121).

A great deal of Abelard's logical works consisted of discussions of topics, consequences and conditionals. Like Boethius, Abelard thought that true conditionals express necessary conceptual connections between the antecedents and the consequents. Some twelfth century masters regarded the principle that the antecedent is not true without the consequent as a sufficient condition for the truth of a conditional and accepted the so-called paradoxes of implication (Martin 1987). The question of the nature of conditionals and consequences remained a popular theme in medieval logic (Broadie 1993; King 2001a).

The principles of propositional modal logic, found in Prior Analytics I.15, were generally expressed as follows: if the antecedent of a valid consequence is possible/necessary, the consequent is possible/necessary (Abelard, Dialectica 202.6-8). However, the main interest was in the modal syllogistics and modal predicate logic. Avicenna wrote a brief summary of Aristotle's modal syllogistics, but his own theory was different, being based on the assumptions that the subject terms and the predicate terms of assertoric and modal propositions stand for all possible applications and the truth-conditions of assertoric propositions and corresponding possibility propositions are the same. It follows, for example, that syllogisms with assertoric premises coincide with uniform possibility syllogisms (Street 2002, 2005). While Averroes's commentaries on the Prior Analytics followed the main lines of Aristotle's text, his separate treatise on modality involved new systematic ideas, mainly the theory of accidental and per se necessary terms and the interpretation of syllogistic necessity premises as per se necessary predications with per se necessary terms. Both ideas were ispired by Aristotle's remarks in the Posterior Analytics I.4; the syllogistic applications were Averoes's own inventions. Since Averroes takes modal premises to be of the divided type, assertoric premises in Aristotelian mixed necessity-assertoric syllogisms must have a predicate term which is necessary. The same applies to the subject term of the first premise in mixed assertoric-necessity syllogisms (Quaesita octo in librum Priorum Analyticorum, IV.3, 84, in Aristotelis Opera cum Averrois Commentariis I.2b; see also Thom 2003, 81-85. This is a speculative explanation of Aristotle's asymmetric treatment of mixed necessity-assertoric syllogisms and mixed assertoric-necessity syllogisms. Analogous essentialist ideas were developed in thirteenth-century Latin discussions. (For medieval Arabic modal syllogisms, see also Rescher 1974.)

The first Latin commentary on the Prior Analytics is an anonymous late twelfth-century treatise which involves detailed discussions of modal conversion and modal syllogisms as well as many problems dealt with in ancient commentaries. (See Ebbesen 1981.) Dialectica Monacensis involves a brief summary of Aristotle's modal syllogistic the elements of which were discussed in logic courses in Paris in the first part of the thirteenth centuiry. Robert Kilwardby's commentary became an authoritative work from which the discussions of modal syllogisms in the commentaries of Albert the Great (ca. 1250) and many others were largely derived (Knuuttila 2008, 545-548). Abelard, who did not deal with Aristotle's modal syllogistics, said that the modals in mixed syllogisms with both modal and assertoric premises should be read de re (Super Periherm. 10.22-11.16) This reading of modal premises was often assumed, although it was seldom discussed as such. A central problem of Aristotle's theory is that the structure of the premises is not analyzed. Even if it is natural to think that the presupposition of the mixed moods is a de re reading of modally qualified premises, this creates difficulties when applied to the conversion rules, most of which are unproblematic only if understood as rules for modals de dicto. (According to Aristotle, necessity premises are converted in the same way as assertoric premises, ‘Every/some A is B’ implies ‘Some B is A’ and ‘No A is B’ implies ‘No B is A’. Negative contingency premises are converted to corresponding affirmative contingency propositions and these by the conversion of terms to particular contingency propositions.)

While many historians think that Aristotle's modal syllogistics included incompatible elements, this was not the view of mid-thirteenth century logicians. Many of them discussed the same alleged counter-examples to the universal convertibility of necessary propositions, such as

(8) Everything healthy (or awake) is necessarily an animal.

Robert Kilwardby's explanation is based on the view that convertible necessity premises are necessity propositions per se and not per accidens, like (8), which are not convertible. In affirmative necessity propositions per se, the subject is per se connected to the predicate. In negative necessity propositions per se, the subject is per se incompatible with the predicate. The terms in per se inherences or incompatibilities are essential and necessarily stand for the things they signify. The historical background of Kilwardby's interpretation is not clear, but it does show close similarities to Averroes's discussion mentioned above. (See Lagerlund 2000, 25-42; Thom 2007, 19-28; Gersonides tried to develop further Averroes's remarks; see Manekin 1992.)

As for the conversion of contingency propositions (neither necessary nor impossible), Kilwardby notes that while the converted propositions of indefinite (utrumlibet) contingency are of the same type of contingency, the conversion of natural contingency propositions (true about most cases) results in contingency propositions when contingency means possibility proper (not impossible). There were extensive discussions of the kinds of contingency based on various philosophical ideas in Kilwardby, Albert the Great and their contemporaries (Knuuttila 2008, 540-541).

Following Aristotle's remark that ‘A contingently belongs to B’ may mean either ‘to that to which B belongs’ or ‘to that to which B contingently belongs’, Kilwardby argues that the subject terms in contingency syllogisms are read in the second way and ampliated, if syllogistic relations do not demand restrictions. In explaining the difference in this respect between necessity propositions and contingency propositions, he states that since the terms in per se necessity propositions are essential, ‘Every A is necessarily B’ and ‘Whatever is necessarily A is necessarily B’ mean the same. Contingency propositions which are ampliated do not mean the same as those which are not ampliated, although both are convertible (19vb, 21ra-b, 22rab).

According to Kilwardby, the modal character of the predication in the conclusion of the perfect first figure syllogism follows from the first premise, which involves the whole syllogism in accordance with the dici de omni et nullo (Lagerlund 2000, 41-42). The premises and the conclusion in uniform necessity syllogisms are necessary per se. In mixed first-figure syllogisms with a major necessity premise and a minor asertoric premise, the non-modalized premise should be simpliciter assertoric, i.e., a necessarily true per se predication. Similarly, in mixed first-figure syllogisms with contingent major and assertoric minor premises, the assertoric premise must be simpliciter assertoric, but this time the criteria are that the predicate belongs to the subject per se, invariably or by natural contingency (16va, 21ra, 22ra, 25ra).

Kilwardby explains that in first-figure mixed necessity-assertoric syllogisms the necessity premise appropriates to itself a minor which is necessary per se; no such appropriation occurs in first-figure mixed assertoric-necessity syllogisms. There are similar appropriation rules for some mixed second-figure and third-figure moods with assertoric and necessity premises and for various mixed contingency moods pertaining to the kind of appropriated contingency premises or assertoric premises (Thom 2007, chs. 5-6).

Kilwardby and his followers considered Aristotle's modal syllogistic as the correct theory of modalities, the explication of which demanded various metaphysical considerations. As exemplified by the appropriation rules, they assumed that propositions of the same form had different interpretations, depending on how they were related to other propositions in a syllogism. From the logical point of view, these rules have an ad hoc character. (For further discussions of Kilwardby's modal syllogistic, see Thom 2007.)

4. Fourteenth Century Discussions

John Duns Scotus's modal theory can be regarded as the first systematic exposition of the new intensional theory of modality, some elements of which were put forward in the twelfth century. In criticizing Henry of Ghent's theory of theological modalities, Scotus sketched the famous and sometimes misunderstood model of ‘divine psychology’ in which certain relations between theological, metaphysical, and modal notions are defined. Scotus deviated from the metaphysical tradition in which possibilities were founded in divine being. According to him, when God as an omniscient being knows all possibilities, he does not know them by turning first to his essence. Possibilities can be known in themselves (Ord. I.35.32). In fact they would be what they are even if there were no God. Scotus states that if it is assumed that, per impossibile, neither God nor the world exists and the proposition ‘The world is possible’ then existed, this proposition would be true. The actual world is possible as it is, and this possibility and the possibilities of unrealized things are primary metaphysical facts which are not dependent on anything else (Ord. I.7.1, 27; Lect. I.7, 32, I.39.1-5, 49).

Scotus calls the propositional formulations of pure possibilities ‘logical possibilities’. These express things and states of affairs to which it is not repugnant to be. Possibilities as such have no kind of existence of their own nor are they causally sufficient for the existence of anything, but they are real in the sense that they form the precondition for everything that is or can be. God's omniscience involves all possibilities and as object of divine knowledge they receive an intelligible or objective being. Some of these are included in God's providential plan of creation and will receive an actual being. The description of a possible world at a certain moment consists of compossible possibilities. Though possibilities necessarily are what they are, the actualization of non-necessary possibilities are contingent. Since all finite things are contingently actual, their alternatives are possible with respect to the same time, though these are not compossible with what is actual. Impossibilities are incompossibilities between possibilities (Ord. I.35.32, 49-51, I.38, 10, I.43, 14; Lect. I.39.1-5, 62-65).

In criticizing extensional modal theories Scotus redefined a contingent event as follows: ‘I do not call something contingent because it is not always or necessarily the case, but because its opposite could be actual at the very moment when it occurs’ (Ord. I.2.1.1-2, 86). This is a denial of the traditional thesis of the necessity of the present and the temporal frequency characterization of contingency . In Scotus's modal semantics, the meaning of the notion of contingency is spelt out by considering simultaneous alternatives. What it actual is contingently so if, instead of being actual, it could be not actual. This conception of simultaneous contingent alternatives is part of an argument that the first cause does not act necessarily. According to Scotus, the eternal creative act of divine will is free only if it could be other than it is in a real sense (Lect. I.39.1-5, 58). (For Scotus's modal theory, see Vos et al. 1994; Knuuttila 1996; Marrone 1996; King 2001; Normore 2003.)

Scotus's approach to modalities brought new themes into philosophical discussion. One of these was the idea of the domain of possibility as a non-existent objective precondition of all being and thinking. This was well known in the seventeenth century as well through Suárez's works (Honnefelder 1990). In his discussion of eternal truths, Descartes criticized the classical view of the ontological foundation of modality as well as the Scotist theory of modality and conceivability. (There are different interpretations of Descartes's view of the foundations of modality and how it is related to late medieval discussions; see Alanen and Knuuttila 1988; Alanen 1990; Normore 1991, 2006.)

Another influential idea was the distinction between logical and natural necessities and possibilities. In Scotus's theory, logically necessary attributes and relations are attached to things in all those sets of compossibilities in which they occur. Against this background one could ask which of the natural invariances treated as necessities in earlier natural philosophy were necessary in this strong sense of necessity, and which of them were merely empirical generalizations without being logically necessary. (For the distinction between logical and natural necessity in Ockham and Buridan, see Knuuttila 1993, 155-160, 2001b).

One important branch of medieval logic developed in treatises called De obligationibus dealt, roughly speaking, with how an increasing set of true and false propositions might remain coherent. According to thirteenth-century rules, false present tense statements could be accepted only if they were taken to refer to a moment of time different from the actual one. Scotus deleted this rule, based on the Aristotelian axiom of the necessity of the present, and later theories accepted the Scotist revision. In this new form, obligations logic could be regarded as a theory of how to describe possible states of affairs and their mutual relationships. These discussions influenced the philosophical theory of counterfactual conditionals (Yrjönsuuri 1994, 2001; Gelber 2004.) In dealing with counterfactual hypotheses of indirect proofs mentioned above, Averroes and Thomas Aquinas made use of the idea of abstract possibilities which did not imply the idea of alternative domains. The possibilities of a thing can be dealt with at various levels which correspond to Porphyrian predicables. Something which is possible for a thing as a member of a genus can be impossible for it as a member of a species. The same holds of it as a member of a species and an individuated thing. These abstract possibilities are impossible in the sense that they cannot be actualized. Buridan heavily criticized this approach from the point of view of his new modal theory. He argued that if a counterfactual state of affairs is possible, it can be coherently imagined as actual. If something cannot be treated in this way, calling it possible is based on a conceptual confusion. (See Knuuttila 2001b; 2005, 719-720; Kukkonen 2005.)

With the new modal semantics, William Ockham (Summa logicae), John Buridan (Tractatus de consequentiis, Summulae de Dialectica) and some other fourteenth-century authors could formulate the principles of modal logic much more completely and satisfactorily than did their predecessors. Questions of modal logic were discussed separately with respect to modal propositions de dicto and de re; modal propositions de re were further divided into two groups depending on whether the subject terms refer to actual or possible beings. It was thought that logicians should also analyze the relationships between these readings and, furthermore, the consequences having various types of modal sentences as their parts. Richard of Campsall played an interesting role in the development of medieval modal syllogistics. He introduced the habit of treating the de dicto and de re moods separately, but he was also dependent on Kilwardby's interpretation. Ockham, Buridan and their followers largely dropped thirteenth-century essentialist assumptions from modal syllogistics. They regarded the Aristotelian version as a fragmentary theory in which the distinctions between different types of fine structures were not explicated and, consequently, did not try to reconstruct it as a consistent whole by one unifying analysis of modal propositions; they believed, like some modern commentators, that such a reconstruction was not possible. (For fourteenth-century modal logic, see King 1985; Lagerlund 2000; Thom 2003; Knuuttila 2008, 551-567.)

According to Hughes (1989), one could supply a Kripke-style possible worlds semantics to Buridan's modal system. Comparing Buridan's general ideas with this may be of heuristic value, although many theoretical questions of modern formal semantics were not those of medieval logicians. Ockham and Buridan state that the truth of ‘A white thing can be black’ demans the truth of ‘This can be black’ and that ‘This can be black’ and ‘‘This is black’ is possible’ mean the same. Compound (de dicto) and divided (de re) readings do not differ at this level, but are separated in dealing with universal and particular propositions. While Ockham did not discuss unrestricted divided necessity propositions, Buridan took the subject terms of all quantified divided modal propositions as standing for possible beings if they are not restricted. The truth of these propositions demand the truth of all or some relevant singular propositions of the type just mentioned; the demonstrative pronoun is then taken to refer the possible beings even though they do not exist. Buridan could have said that the possible truth of ‘This is X’ means that it is true in a possible state of affairs in which the possible being referred to by ‘this ’ occurs and that the necessary truth of ‘This is X’ means that it is true in all possible states of affairs in which ‘this’ occurs.

The new modal logic of Ockham and Buridan was among the most remarkable achievements of medieval logic. Buridan's modal logic was dominant in late medieval times. It was embraced by Marsilius of Inghen, Albert of Saxony, Jodocus Trutfetter and others (Lagerlund 2000, 184-227; for the later influence of medieval modal theories, see also Coombs 2003; Knebel 2003; Roncaglia 1996, 2003; Schmutz 2006). The rise of the new modal logic was accompanied by theories of epistemic logic (Boh 1993) and deontic logic (Knuuttila and Hallamaa 1995).


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Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Boethius, Anicius Manlius Severinus | Buridan, John [Jean] | Duns Scotus, John | Kilwardby, Robert | Latin Averroism | logic: modal | medieval philosophy | Ockham [Occam], William | possible worlds | Stoicism | truth: necessary vs. contingent