Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Monism

1. My use of “monism” and correlatives uses of “pluralism” (including “dualism”) and “nihilism” are intended to be descriptive, concerning their central usage in the literature. My usage is not intended to be prescriptive—I am not trying to legislate—and it is not intended to cover every usage—no doubt there are cases where familial resemblance inspires the use of these terms.

2. It is perhaps more common for the bundle theorist to claim reductionism about concrete objects than to claim eliminativism (Hoffman and Rosenkrantz 1997: 26-7). But it would be at least consistent to accept (i) the bundle theorist's property ontology and (ii) that bundles of compresent properties are not fit to serve as concrete objects. This would yield the sort of substance nihilism contemplated in the main text.

3. Actually there are at least three different views one might take on numerical predication. First, there is the contextualist view, on which numerical predicates variantly denote different monadic properties in different contexts. Second, there is the relationalist view, on which numerical predicates invariantly denote a dyadic relation between the subject and some implicit additional argument place. There are then several choices for this additional argument place, such as a sortal or a unit. Third, there is Frege's own conceptualist view, on which numerical predicates invariantly denote monadic properties, but where the subject term shifts its reference from object to concept, so that ‘…is one’ attributes having one instance to the concept of the object in question. For reasons I cannot enter into here, I prefer the relationalist view with the additional argument place construed as taking a unit. This will not make a difference to the discussion that follows.

4. Spinoza, for example, seems to have been a monist about the number of highest categories but a pluralist about the number of categories. He regards being as the highest category: “We are accustomed to refer all individuals in nature to one genus which is called the most general, that is, to the notion of Being, which embraces absolutely all the individuals in nature” (Ethics IV pref., II: 207).) But he also posits subtypes: “Being is to be divided into being which exists necessarily, or whose essence involves existence, and into being whose essence involves only possible existence” (Cog. Meta. I, I, I: 236).

5. Thus Aristotle argues that if entity (or unity) were the unique highest type, there could be no differentia:

But it is not possible that there should be one genus of entities, or that unity or entity should be such; for it is necessary, indeed, that the differences of each genus both exist, and that each should be one: but it is impossible either for the species to be predicated about the proper differences of the genus, or for the genus to subsist, independent of the species itself. Wherefore, if unity or entity be a genus, neither will entity or unity constitute any difference. (Meta. 998b22; see also Post. Anal. 92b14)

6. The lack of a natural type/token distinction for abstracta seems connected to the idea that abstracta do not exist in spacetime. Though perhaps what emerges here is another way of drawing the abstract/concrete distinction, in terms of which entities permit a type/token distinction. See Lewis 1986 for further discussion of ways to formulate the abstract/concrete distinction. Caveat: it is not clear that the abstract/concrete distinction is any worse than any other respectable metaphysical distinction in this respect. I would be wary of drawing a skeptical moral, especially since the abstract/concrete distinction is so natural and useful.

7. Thus Plato compares the form of the good to the sun, concluding: “This reality, then, that gives their truth to the objects of knowledge and the power of knowing to the knower, you must say is the idea of good…” And then adding: “the objects of knowledge not only receive from the presence of the good there being known, but their very existence and essence is derived to them from it, …” (1961: 744; Republic VI: 508e-509b). In this vein, W. T. Stace comments: “[Plato's] own Absolute, the world of Ideas, is a many in one. It is many because it contains many Ideas. It is one because these Ideas constitute a single organized system of Ideas under the final unity of the Idea of the Good.” (1955: 79)

8. Here I am assuming classical mereology and atomism. Other conceptions of mereology will generate different counts. On the nihilist extreme, the total number of parts just is the number of atomic parts. Classical mereology without atoms (‘gunk’) will generate a minimum of continuum-many parts but zero atomic parts. For further discussion of mereological systems, see Simons 1987.

9. It does not follow from this that existence and identity are sortal-relative (a line defended by Geach 1962). All absolute existence and identity provide is one count policy among many.

10. See C. D. Broad (1925: 17-38) for a partly related taxonomy. Broad distinguishes three forms of monism: (i) Differentiating-Attribute Monism, which concerns the number of realms of substances (e.g. whether there is only the material realm); (ii) Specific-Property Monism, which concerns the number of kinds in a realm (e.g. whether there is only one kind of material substance); and (iii) Substantival Monism, which concerns the number of substances in a realm (e.g. whether there is only one material substance token). Broad evinces a “tentative acceptance of a form of Substantival Monism,” explaining that he has:

granted that the typical material substances of ordinary life, viz., human bodies, chairs, trees, etc., are only imperfectly substantial, since they are transitory and incapable of existing in isolation. And I have granted that the solar system, and still more the whole material realm, can claim a higher degree of substantiality. (1925: 33; though also see 38)

11. I will not discuss genus monism, substance monism, or property monism further here. But see the entries on categories (Thomasson 2004), and on dualism (Robinson 2003) for further discussion on these issues.

12. These interpretations are (unsurprisingly) controversial. Parmenides is usually read as an existence monist (c.f. Owen 1960). Though for a rival reading of Parmenides, on which his monism only targets particular objects of intellection, and holds that each of them has unity (whatever is thinkable has a single unified nature), see Curd 1998. Curd does acknowledge Melissus as an existence monist. See Sedley 1999 for further discussion of Melissus. (Caveat: since Parmenides and Melissus both philosophized before Plato and Aristotle codified the notion of ontological priority, asking whether they are existence monists or priority monists might be anachronistic.)

Whether Spinoza is an existence monist or a priority monist is a matter of scholarly dispute. The existence monist reading has been championed by Bennett 1984 and 1991, while Curley 1969 and 1991 champions the priority reading. As Bennett summarizes: “For Curley's Spinoza, to say that there is only one substance is to say that there is only one thing that doesn't depend on anything else for its existence; and that is all that is said” (1991: 53). While on Bennett's reading, “Spinoza says that finite particulars are ‘modes’… Spinoza really is saying that ordinary particular things are ways that reality is” (1984: 92).

13. Bennett (1984: 103-6) evinces sympathy for the existence monism (‘field metaphysic’) he attributes to Spinoza, so perhaps should be counted here as well. Rea 2001 provides a defense of ‘Eleatic monism,’ understood as including the claim that “There exists exactly one material thing” (2001: 129). But Rea's proposal for reconciling ‘Eleatic monism’ with experience is to hold that “we are not denizens of the material world” (2001: 147). This makes his monism far more restrictive than existence monism (perhaps it is best understood as substance dualism plus material monism: monism about the material objects as counted by tokens), and makes his claim to represent the actual Eleatic view rather questionable. Further, Rea's final conclusion is merely that such a monism is “a coherent (even if counterintuitive, even if false) metaphysic” (2001: 147).

14. Indeed, Horgan and Potrč seem committed to spacetime and properties, in describing the blobject as having “enormous spatiotemporal structural complexity, and enormous local variability.” Thus they go on to suppose that “the jello-world might occasionally exhibit quite abrupt local spatial and temporal variations, in the degree to which various magnitudes are locally instantiated” (2000: 50). This looks to require the existence of various locales and various magnitudes, in addition to their one concretum. Though perhaps here they are merely speaking indirectly.

15. The following argument is taken from Schaffer forthcoming-a.

16. In this vein, Albert 1996 argues that the most natural ontology of both Newtonian and quantum mechanics is in terms of a single world-atom zipping through configuration space.

17. 3 might also be defended on ontological and/or epistemic grounds. The ontological defense of 3 would invoke the Eleatic Stranger's dictum from Plato's Sophist, that to be is to have causal power. But this seems implausible: epiphenomenal entities are surely conceivable, which is good evidence that they are possible. The epistemic defense of 3 would maintain that we have no good reason for believing in explanatorily redundant and epiphenomenal entities. But this seems parasitic on Occamite principles. For further discussion see the exchange between Sider 2003 and Merricks 2003.

18. The reader familiar with the debate on mereological composition may note that this argument is quite similar to the mereological nihilist's argument that only the atomic parts exist (Merricks 2001: 56). What emerges here is that explanatory exclusion arguments can be used either to argue against the parts or to argue against wholes. If considerations of ontological economy are brought to bear, it seems that the existence monist's version of the argument is thereby preferable. See Schaffer forthcoming-a for further discussion.

19. Horgan and Potrč reject ontologies that involve vagueness, and take the remaining candidates to be (i) monism, (ii) a nihilistic ontology of point particles, and (iii) a universalist ontology involving the abundant hierarchy of classical extensional mereology. Thus they argue:

These three candidates can be ordered, with respect to comparative ontological parsimony. The simplest is… [existence monism]; it maximizes ontological parsimony by countenancing just one real concrete object, the blobject. Less parsimonious is [nihilism], since it countenances all those point-objects. Still less parsimonious is [universalism], since it countenances not only all the same point-objects, but also a completely unrestricted mereological hierarchy of snobjective region-objects as well. (2000: §2.4)

While Horgan and Potrč do not actually give the exclusion argument, presumably they also hold the sufficiency of the monistic ontology, so that the gain in parsimony does not come at any explanatory price. To that extent I think their motivations are best formalized via the exclusion argument.

20. See also the exchange between Simons (2003) and Varzi (2006). Though note that much of Simons's concern about treating the universe as an individual traces to his treatment of it as a trans-categorical sum (the sum of all entities from all categories). The existence monist (and likewise the priority monist below) should only think of the world as the maximal concrete hunk and thus as a mono-categorical sum (the sum of all actual concrete objects).

21. Classical mereology guarantees the existence of the world by unrestricted composition over unrestricted pluralities: U is the fusion of all (actual, concrete) individuals. But unrestricted composition is not required here. For instance, on the restricted ‘brute composition’ view of Markosian 1998, the existence of U may be regarded as a brute fact (not due to any general principle of composition). Such would be tantamount to simply adding a ‘world-making’ axiom to the mereology, to the effect that there exists a unique individual such that every (actual, concrete) thing is part of it (Simons 1987: 34).

22. For instance, Hartle and Hawking 1983 (in a classic paper entitled “Wave function of the Universe”) attempt to write down the wave function of the world (!) And here are some of the opening lines of the final chapter of a standard college physics textbook: “Fundamental particles are the smallest things in the universe, and cosmology deals with the biggest thing there is – the universe itself” (Young and Freedman 2004)

23. The view that composition is identity is defended in Baxter 1988. See Lewis 1991, Armstrong 1997, and Sider 2006 for further discussion. Caveat: Lewis, Armstrong, and Sider all defend a view labeled ‘weak composition-as-identity,’ which is really the view that composition is not identity, but merely analogous to it in many respects. This weaker (and perhaps more plausible) thesis will not support resistance to 2. As long as whole and part are not really identical, the question “why posit both?” will arise.

24. As Sider (2006: §3) points out, the ‘set-like structure’ of pluralities is crucial to the theoretical role of the plural quantifiers in standing in for sets (e.g. in the definition of the ancestral relation), interpreting second-order logic, and comparing the cardinalities of pluralities too big to form sets.

25. Relativization to a target and a unit (as recommended for all numerical predication: §1) may undermine this argument. The question is whether the whole and its parts would still take different numerical predicates relative to a single <target, unit> pair.

26. This is the conclusion of Schaffer forthcoming-a. There I suggest that this modified version of Occam's Razor supports priority monism, with its one basic concretum.

27. This use of ‘it’ is what linguists call ‘expletive it,’ as seen in constructions such as ‘it is raining’ and ‘it is 4pm.’ Part of the evidence for the semantic vacuity of expletive-it is that it cannot bear focus (thus: *‘it is raining’ is bizarre). Since focus presents contrastive meanings, the inability to provide contrastive meaning for ‘it’ is evidence that it has no meaning in the first place. There is nothing to contrast to. Further evidence for the semantic vacuity of expletive-it is that it cannot appear in syntactic positions that assign theta-roles. If expletive-it were meaningful, it ought to be able to saturate the argument place associated with the relevant theta-role.

28. Along these lines, Descartes says:

We should notice something very well known by the natural light: nothingness possesses no attributes or qualities. It follows that, whenever we find some attributes or qualities, there is necessarily some thing or substance to be found for them to belong to; … (1984: 196)

29. Actually the existence monist might consider three subtly different paraphrases. First, she might relativize modes to regions, producing claims of the form: the world is F at R. Second, she might relativize the instantiation relation itself to regions (in the manner of Johnston 1987), producing claims of the form: the world is-at-R F. Third, she might invoke distributional properties (in the manner of Parsons 2004), producing claims of the form: the world is D, where D is a property (like being polka-dotted) that expresses how the feature in question is distributed through the world. I think the existence monist may be best off with distributional properties, but nothing in the main text should turn on this.

30. See van Inwagen 1990 for the ‘simples arranged tablewise’ paraphrase, and Merricks 2001 as well as Uzquiano 2004 for further discussion. See Rosen and Dorr 2002 for the ‘according to the fiction of composition’ amendment, and McGrath 2005 for further discussion.

31. For further discussion on this issue see Quine 1948, Alston 1958, Jackson 1980, Burgess and Rosen 1997, and Yablo 1998, inter alia.

32. At this point Horgan and Potrč introduce an aspect of contextual variability in the language, allowing that different contexts generate different degrees of directness required for correspondence. In the barroom it may count as true to say “there are many bottles of beer,” but in the classroom this would by their lights count as false.

33. Presumably the existence monist who would reject the intuitions of plurality would do so as part of a general distrust of intuitions. This raises fundamental issues about the methodology of metaphysics. It is troubling that intuitions in this domain prove so unstable. Here one might recall Bosanquet's explanation of why he did not trouble to give arguments for idealism: “I don't think it important,” since after all: “the universe is so obviously experience” (quoted in Muirhead 1935: 243).

34. The historical pedigree of priority monism traces back to the Platonic cosmology of Timaeus, in which the demiurge creates the cosmos as “one visible animal comprehending within itself all other animals” (Tim. 30d). The Timaean thread then runs through Plotinus (“this All is one universally comprehensive living being, encircling all the living beings within it” [Enn. IV.4]), and Proclus, who says: “But since the monad is everywhere prior to the plurality, all beings must be attached to their particular monads. In the case of bodies, the whole that precedes the parts is the whole that embraces all separate beings in the cosmos” (1987: 79). Notice the explicit invocation of the smaller organisms and other parts of the whole—the ‘organic unity’ analogy requires priority monism rather than existence monism.

For Spinoza (who abstains from organic metaphors), there is the world and its modes, where the finite modes of extension are themselves individual objects (Curley 1969, 1991). Thus Spinoza explicitly invokes parts throughout the digression on the nature of bodies, conceiving of “the whole of nature as one individual, whose parts, that is, all bodies, vary in infinite ways” (E2l7s), invoking postulates such as “The human body is composed of a number of individual parts, of diverse nature, each one of which is in itself extremely complex” (E2pos1). In this vein consider what Spinoza wrote to Oldenburg: “each body, in so far as it exists as modified in a particular manner, must be considered as a part of the whole universe, as agreeing with the whole, and associated with the remaining parts” (1966: 21).

Hegel picks up the Timaean thread (Beiser 2005: 87), saying of the limbs and organs that it is “only in their unity that they are what they are” and holding that this “is the case to a much greater extent” with “mind and the formulations of the spiritual world” (1975: 191-2). Indeed, Hegel claims in the Logic that the many parts are not “self-subsistent or grounded in themselves” (WL 5:172/1:155). Thus Caird (one of the founding British neo-Hegelians) explains the Hegelian position as follows: “Thus neither things nor thoughts can be treated as… independent or atomic existences, which are related only to themselves. They are essentially parts of a whole,… and as such they carry us beyond themselves, the moment we clearly understand them” (1883: 137).

Following Hegel, Lotze argues that causal interactions refute “our preconceived idea that [things] are originally many and self-existent,” showing instead that “there is a truly existent being m” which is “the ground and basis of all individual beings a, b, c, …” (1892: 39). Royce argues that any alleged plurality of real objects would be internally related “so as not to be mutually independent,” such that these must be “parts or aspects of One real being” (1900: 122), thus suggesting that we are “only bits of the true Self” (1967: 416). Bosanquet writes: “A world or a cosmos is a system of members, such that every member, being ex hypothesi distinct, nevertheless contributes to the unity of the whole” (1913: 37). And Bradley speaks of how: “The plurality then sinks to become merely an integral aspect in a substantial unity” (1994: 138). This is not the denial of plurality, but merely the denial of the substantiality (independence, basicness) of said plurality.

In general the core monistic thesis is the priority thesis that whole is prior to part:

The wholes emphasized by monistic philosophers are, therefore, logically prior to their parts. They are there, as it were, to begin with, and being there, proceed to express themselves in parts whose natures they pervade and determine. (Joad 1957: 420)

In this vein Clayton invokes “the classic philosophical idea that ‘the whole is prior to the parts,’ a position shared by most idealists, by Neoplatonists, and by most of the Eastern Vedanta traditions” (2004: 7-8). See Schaffer forthcoming-b for a more extended discussion.

35. One exception is Schaffer forthcoming-b. Another exception may be Campbell 1990, for whom the basic entities are tropes, and the basic tropes are worldwide fields: “All basic tropes are space-filling fields, each one of them distributes some quantity, perhaps in varying intensities, across all of space-time” (1990: 146). So if Campbell forms basic objects by compresent bundles of basic tropes (as would be thematic for him), then he would be a priority monist. In this vein, Campbell concludes: “We would reach Spinoza's conclusion, that there is just one genuine substance, the cosmos itself…” (1990: 154).

36. The conflation of existence and priority monisms may have arisen with Russell. Thus Russell sometimes treats his monistic opponents as if they were existence monists who viewed ‘parts’ as merely: “phases and unreal divisions of a single indivisible Reality” (1985: 36). But Russell sometimes treats the issue as one of priority rather than existence: “the existence of the complex depends on the existence of the simple, and not vica versa” (2003: 92). It probably did not help that previous priority monists such as Bradley used the notion of ‘degrees of reality’ to track ontological priority. Thus Candlish summarizes Bradley's metaphysics as: “reality itself admits of degrees, a phenomenon being the less real the more it is just a fragmentary aspect of the whole” (2002: §6).

Among contemporary authors, Hoffman and Rosenkrantz dismiss monism as “inconsistent with something that appears to be an evident datum of experience, namely, that there is a plurality of things” (1997: 78). Obviously such a dismissal only applies to existence monism. Indeed, this is their only mention of monism in a book-length, historically informed treatment of substance. (Though in their defense, this is a more detailed treatment of monism than one usually sees!)

The most detailed discussion of monism that I am aware of in the contemporary literature is due to van Inwagen (2002). But van Inwagen starts by defining ‘monism’ as the doctrine that: “There is one individual thing” (2002: 25). This is existence monism. He then says: “The question naturally arises why anyone accepts this metaphysic. It seems most natural to accept individuality as a real feature of the World” (2002:30). In defense of van Inwagen, he does later mention the view that “there is one independent being, the World or physical universe itself, tables and chairs and such being parts of the one independent thing” (2002: 32). That is priority monism. But it is not accorded further discussion.

37. Indeed the notions of what is “basic,” “fundamental,” and “ultimate” now pervade contemporary metaphysics, as do the correlated notions of “derivative,” “dependent,” and “secondary,” and the correlating notions of “grounding,” “existing in virtue of,” and “being nothing over and above.” Though it is rare to see the presuppositions of these notions explicated.

For application of these notions to properties see Armstrong 1978b, Lewis 1983, and Campbell 1990, inter alia. For application to physicalism (inter alia) see Lewis 1983. Thus Loewer characterizes physicalism as follows: “the fundamental properties and facts are physical and everything else obtains in virtue of them” (2001: 39). For application to reduction see Fine 2001: “On this approach, reduction is to be understood in terms of fundamental reality rather than the other way around” (2001: 26). For application to truthmaking see Rodriguez-Pereyra 2005 and Bricker 2006, inter alia. For application to set theory see Fine 1994. Here Zangwill speaks of the “metaphysical determination” of the singleton set {Socrates} by Socrates (2003: 129). For application to holes see Casati and Varzi 1994. For application to the relation between objects and properties, see Armstrong 1978a and 1997, inter alia.

38. Lowe (2005) suggests that ontological priority (/dependence) is best rendered as a reflexive, antisymmetric, and transitive relation. But Lowe's suggestion is actually compatible with that of the main text. One might recognize Lowe's notion as ‘priority’, and also recognize an irreflexive, asymmetric and transitive priority relation (as per the main text), which might then be relabeled ‘proper priority.’ Priority and proper priority would then be compatible, interdefinable notions, in exactly the same way that parthood and proper parthood are compatible, interdefinable notions (indeed the formal features are parallel: parthood and priority are reflexive, antisymmetric, and transitive; while proper parthood and proper priority are irreflexive, asymmetric, and transitive). In the main text I will continue to use ‘priority’ to label proper priority. This is merely terminological.

39. Gill provides the following useful overview of Aristotle's ontology in the Categories:

In the Categories the main criterion [for deciding what things are the primary substances] is ontological priority. An entity is ontologically primary if other things depend for its existence on it, while it does not depend in a comparable way on them. The primary substances of the Categories, such as particular men and horses, are subjects that ground the existence of other things; some of the nonprimary things, such as qualities and quantities, exist because they modify the primary substances, and others, such as substantial species and genera, exist because they classify the primary entities… Therefore the existence of other things depends upon the existence of these basic entities;… (1989: 3)

40. In this vein Markosian says: “I wish I were in a position to give an analysis of the in virtue of relation, but I am not. I think it is fair to assume, however, that we have some rough idea of what that relation is” (1998: 217). Likewise Curley, in defending Spinoza's monistic use of the concept of dependence, writes:

[T]he concept of an independent being is just as intelligible as the concept of a dependent one. Since we know what it means to say that one thing depends on another, we must know what it means to say that one thing does not depend on another. And the idea of an independent being is simply the idea of a being that does not depend on any other. (1969: 39-40)

For various attempts at accounts of ontological priority see Fine 1994, Lowe 2005, and Bricker 2006.

41. In this vein, Fine suggests as natural the following ontological principle: “Foundation: Necessarily, any element of the ontology can be constructed from the basic elements of the ontology by means of constructors in the ontology” (1991: 267).

42. Of course not all orderings require lower bounds. For instance it seems coherent to imagine an infinite temporal order, with no first moment of creation. It would be ideal to have a general account of which orderings require lower bounds. See Schaffer forthcoming-b for some brief further reflections here.

43. Ontological foundationalism (without concreta foundationalism) is thus compatible with the following scenario: there is an infinite sequence of priority relations amongst concreta, grounded at the limit in basic entities of another ontological category. (Analogy: there is an infinite sequence of extended regions nested inside any given region in a pointy space. At the limit of this sequence are not regions but points.) This is what concreta foundationalism excludes.

44. These four arguments are discussed in greater detail in Schaffer forthcoming-b.

45. Thus Aristotle offers the following intuitive judgments on whether whole or part is prior:

If the parts are prior to the whole, and the acute angle is a part of the right angle and the finger a part of the animal, the acute angle will be prior to the right angle and the finger to the man. But the latter are thought to be prior; for in formula the parts are explained by reference to them, and in virtue also of the power of existing apart from the parts the wholes are prior. (1987: 298)

46. Perhaps this explains the historical affinity between (priority) monism and idealism. In this vein, Joad notes: “We entertain our ideas, we form our plans as wholes… The wholes of monistic philosophy are in this respect like mental wholes” (1957: 420). Though of course the monist need not be an idealist—the point is rather that the idealist is likely to be a monist.

47. Thus Marcus Aurelius proclaims: “All things are woven together and the common bond is sacred,… for they have been arranged together in their places and together make the same ordered Universe. For there is one Universe out of all, one God through all, one substance and one law” (Rutherford 1989: 57).

48. See Halvorson and Clifton 2002, and Kuhlmann 2006 (esp. §5.1) for further discussion here.

49. The argument from heterogeneity equally arises against existence monism (§2), and the replies I will consider are equally available for the existence monist.

50. Really I think this is just a bad pun on ‘different.’ What is true is that nothing can be non-identical to itself. What is false is that nothing can be internally qualitatively diverse.

51. The scenario of heterogeneity all the way down is a gunky scenario (gunk being matter every part of which has proper parts). If gunk is possible (to be argued below), it seems that heterogeneity-all-the-way-down must be possible. For such constitutes a consistent distribution of properties over gunk.

52. Here I follow Parsons (2004), who offers examples such as being polka-dotted and being hot at one end and cold at the other, and invokes the possibility of heterogeneity-all-the-way-down to argue against the reductionist view that distributional properties derive from a plurality of homogeneous parts.

53. This maneuver (and the one to follow) does require a version of ‘existence pluralism’ that targets regions.

54. The idea of using adverbials is lifted from adverbialist theories of perception, such as Chisholm 1957. The adverbialist about perception replaces a plurality of objects of experience (sense-data) by a single subject sensing in different manners. So when I perceive red here and green there, the adverbialist says that I am sensing-herely red and sensing-therely green. Thus Burgess and Rosen explain (in skeptical tones):

Nominalists are very moderate compared to monists, whose view is summarized by Prior [as]: ‘there is only a single genuine individual (the Universe) which gets John-Smithish or Mary-Brownish in such-and-such regions for such-and-such periods’. (David Lewis has pointed out that Prior really should say, ‘…regionally and periodically’.)  And Mary Brown and John Smith don't do anything: the Universe does things Mary-Brownishly and John-Smithishly. (1997: 185-6; see also Johnston 1987, and Hawthorne and Cortens 1995)

55. For further discussion here see Sider 2001 (espec. pp. 92-8) and Lewis 2002.

56. Here I remain neutral on whether metaphysical necessity should be understood as full-blown necessity, or as a restriction imposed on a larger space (which would include metaphysically impossible and perhaps even logically impossible worlds: see Nolan 1997 for a view with this character).

57. For further discussion on the possibility of gunk see Sider 1993, Zimmerman 1996, Hudson 2001, and Schaffer 2003. For general discussions of the extent of possibility see the volume edited by Gendler and Hawthorne 2002.

58. Though see Sider 2007b for some further arguments against both existence and priority monism, concerning possibility and intrinsicness, inter alia. There is a great deal of unexplored ground here.