Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Jun 3, 2004; substantive revision Mon Jan 5, 2009

A system of categories is a complete list of highest kinds or genera. Traditionally, following Aristotle, these have been thought of as highest genera of entities (in the widest sense of the term), so that a system of categories undertaken in this realist spirit would ideally provide an inventory of everything there is, thus answering the most basic of metaphysical questions: “What is there?” Skepticism about the possibilities for discerning the different categories of ‘reality itself’ has led others to approach category systems not with the aim of cataloging the highest kinds in the world itself, but rather with the aim of elucidating the categories of our conceptual system. Thus Kant makes the shift to a conceptualist approach by drawing out the categories that are a priori necessary for any possible cognition of objects. Since such categories are guaranteed to apply to any possible object of cognition, they retain a certain sort of ontological import, although this application is limited to phenomena, not the thing in itself. After Kant, it has been common to approach the project of categories in a neutral spirit that Brian Carr (1987, 7) calls “categorial descriptivism”, as describing the categorial structure that the world would have according to our thought, experience, or language, while refraining from making commitments about whether or not these categories are occupied. Edmund Husserl approaches categories in something like this way, since he begins by laying out categories of meanings, which may then be used to draw out ontological categories (categories of possible objects meant) as the correlates of the meaning categories, without concern for any empirical matter about whether or not there really are objects of the various ontological categories discerned.

A system of ontological categories drawn out in any of these modes has the potential for a great many uses in philosophy, but those who would offer such systems of categories also face a variety of difficulties. They must address the issue of what the proper methods are by means of which categories are to be distinguished, how many categories there are and what they are, whether or not there is a single summum genus subsuming all other categories, and whether we should distinguish a single system of categories or multiple dimensions of categories—issues on which there has been little agreement.

Over the past hundred years, skepticism about the possibility of offering a uniquely true and complete system of ontological categories has led discussion of categories to shift from attempts to offer complete systems of categories to attempts merely to draw particular distinctions, especially among our conceptual or linguistic categories. Work on category differences, unlike that on category systems, does not generally purport to answer deep metaphysical questions about what things or kinds of things exist; instead, category differences are articulated as a way of diagnosing and avoiding various philosophical problems and confusions. Nonetheless, even those who merely argue for category differences owe an account of the conditions under which two concepts, terms, or objects belong to different categories.

1. Category Systems

1.1 Aristotelian Realism

Philosophical interest in categories may be traced back to Aristotle who, in his treatise Categories, attempts to enumerate the most general kinds into which entities in the world divide. He does not begin from a single highest kind, but rather lists the following as the ten highest categories of things “said without any combination” (Categories 1b25):

  • Substance (e.g., man, horse)
  • Quantity (e.g., four-foot, five-foot)
  • Quality (e.g., white, grammatical)
  • Relation (e.g., double, half)
  • Place (e.g., in the Lyceum, in the market-place)
  • Date (e.g., yesterday, last year)
  • Posture (e.g., is lying, is sitting)
  • State (e.g., has shoes on, has armor on)
  • Action (e.g., cutting, burning)
  • Passion (e.g., being cut, being burned)

There are two sorts of substance: a primary substance is, e.g., an individual man or horse; the species (and genera) of these individuals (e.g., man, animal) are secondary substances. While the ten categories are all equally highest kinds, primary substances nonetheless have a certain sort of priority, since “all the other things are either said of the primary substances as subjects or in them as subjects. So if the primary substances did not exist it would be impossible for any of the other things to exist” (Categories 2b4).

Elsewhere, in Metaphysics (998b22), Aristotle argues explicitly that there cannot be a highest genus (e.g., of being or unity) shared by entities of different categories (cf. Ackrill 1963, 81). For a species is defined in terms of its subsuming genus and differentia (e.g., man is definable as an animal that is rational), and while the genus (animal) may be predicated of the species (man), it may not be predicated of the differentia (rational). As a result, if being (or unity) were a genus, no differentiae could be said to have being (or to be one); but “the differentiae of any genus must each of them both have being and be one” (Metaphysics 998b22-3).

The ancient Greek term ‘kategoria’ described what could be said against someone in a court of law, and indeed Aristotle uses what can be said of or in a subject as a route to distinguishing categories. More precisely, he arrived at his list of categories by way of distinguishing “different questions which may be asked about something” and noting “that only a limited range of answers can be appropriately given to any particular question” (Ackrill 1963, 78-9). e.g., the question ‘what is it’ can only be asked of a substance, and only answers describing substances are appropriate. The question ‘how much’, by contrast, requires a quantity for an answer, and so on.

But although Aristotle seems to have arrived at his categories by considering different sorts of question and answer, the categories he was offering were supposed to be categories of entities, not of language; language was just a clue to truths about the world. As J. L. Ackrill writes, Aristotle's Categories “is not primarily or explicitly about names, but about the things that names signify…Aristotle relies greatly on linguistic facts and tests, but his aim is to discover truths about non-linguistic items” (1963, 71).

Aristotle's approach to categories thus is in the spirit of what Brian Carr calls “categorial realism”—an approach conceiving of a system of categories as a list of the highest genera of beings, so that a complete system of categories would offer a systematic inventory of what there is, considered at the most abstract level (although it is not clear whether Aristotle intended his categories to be exhaustive). Thus on a categorial realist approach, providing a system of categories can be seen as one, or even the central task of metaphysics (cf. Grossman 1983, 3). Such a system of categories may also play a central role in answering individual questions of nature, providing the most general sort of answer to questions of the form “What is this?”, and providing the basis for definitions of narrower sorts of things by specifying the most general category (genus) under which things of this sort fall, and the differentia that distinguishes them from other things of the same category. This has endured as the paradigmatic approach to categories, and several recent authors have offered new theories of categories in this spirit of Aristotelian realism (see §1.4 below).

1.2 Kantian Conceptualism

Others, however, have shied away from this robustly realist approach to categories, generally on grounds of skepticism about our ability to discern intrinsic divisions in ‘reality itself’, and have instead treated the project of categories as a matter of laying out the highest categories governing our conceptual scheme. This shift in approach to what Carr (1987, 6) calls “categorial conceptualism” was made famous by Immanuel Kant. While Kant famously denied that we have access to intrinsic divisions (if any) of the thing in itself that lies behind appearances or phenomena, he held that we can discover the essential categories that govern human understanding, which are the basis for any possible cognition of phenomena. Thus, as H. J. Paton puts it, for Kant “We can have a priori knowledge by means of the categories, only if the categories are due to the nature of the mind and are imposed by the mind on the objects which it knows” (1936, 258).

In his Critique of Pure Reason, Kant arrives at his list of categories by first enumerating the forms of possible judgment (A70/B95-A93/B109). On this view, objective empirical judgments (i.e., empirical judgments which purport to refer to objects rather than merely subjective seemings or connections of sense impressions, and which purport to be universally valid for all judging subjects) are endowed with their objectivity and generality in virtue of the a priori concepts embodied in the relevant forms of judgment. If we can identify all of the possible forms of objective empirical judgment, we can then hope to use them as the basis to discover all of the most general concepts or categories that are employed in making such judgments, and thus that are employed in any cognition of objects (Körner 1955, 48-49).

Thus in distinguishing his categories, Kant begins from Aristotelian logic in outlining four respects in which one can classify any judgment: according to its quantity, quality, relation, or modality. In each of these respects or ‘moments’ of judgment, there are three alternative classifications; thus, e.g., in respect of quantity, a judgment may be universal, particular, or singular; in respect of its relation, a judgment may be categorical, hypothetical, or disjunctive, and so on. These Aristotelian ways of classifying judgments are the clue to discerning the twelve correlated concepts of the understanding. So, e.g., from noting that all judgments are either universal (e.g., All swans are white), particular (e.g., Some swans are white) or singular (e.g., Cygmund is white), we can arrive at the three corresponding categories of quantity: unity, plurality, and totality. Via this route, Kant ultimately distinguishes twelve pure concepts of the understanding (A80/B106), divided into four classes of three:

The categories are presented as forming a single exhaustive list, with the four classes of categories imposing four different forms of unity on the object known (Paton 1936, 295-9). Thus, one may separately inquire after an object's quantity, quality, relation, and modality, receiving one of the three sub-answers in each case on the way to a more complete characterization of the object.

Although these are categories of the understanding, they nonetheless retain a certain sort of ontological import, as it is a priori that they apply universally to all objects of possible cognition (A79/B105). In this way, by delineating the concepts that are a priori necessary for the cognition of objects, we can acquire knowledge of categories governing any possible object of cognition, and so acquire a sort of descriptive set of ontological categories, though these must be understood explicitly as categories of objects of possible cognition, not of the thing in itself. Thus Kant was able to treat his system of concepts as a system of categories in something like the Aristotelian sense, “for our primary purpose is the same as his [Aristotle's], although widely diverging from it in manner of execution” (A80/B105). Nonetheless, it is clear that for Kant the categories find their original source in principles of human understanding, not in intrinsic divisions in mind-independent reality, and are discoverable by paying attention to possible forms of human judgment, not by study of the world itself, nor by study of our contingent manners of speaking.

An approach like Kant's has been defended more recently by P. F. Strawson and others following him, who undertake the project of “descriptive metaphysics”, which is concerned with describing “the most general features of our conceptual structure” (1959/1963, xiii), thus providing more general and durable results than mere analyses of language can be.

1.3 Husserlian Descriptivism

Edmund Husserl introduced two sorts of innovation to the study of categories. First, while Aristotle used language as a clue to ontological categories, and Kant treated concepts as the route to categories of objects of possible cognition, Husserl explicitly distinguished categories of meanings from categories of objects, and attempted to draw out the law-like correlations between categories of each sort (Smith 2007, 139ff.). Secondly, whereas Aristotle and Kant each lay out a single system of categories, Husserl distinguishes two ways of arriving at top-level ontological classifications: by formalization and by generalization, yielding two separate, orthogonal, systems of categories, in two different dimensions (cf. Smith 2004, chapter 8).

Husserl is careful to distinguish categories of meanings (by way of which we can think about the highest kinds or ‘essences’ of objects) from the categories meant—the latter are the categories of objects, or ontological categories, considered as the highest essences that entities might have: “by ‘categories’ we can understand, on the one hand, concepts in the sense of meanings, but on the other also, and to better effect, the formal essences themselves which find their expression in these meanings” (1913/1962, 61-2). But although the two sorts of categories must be distinguished, according to Husserl categories of the two sorts are essentially correlated (see below), so we can learn about one by way of the other.

Regardless of whether we are studying categories of meanings or of objects, Husserl is quite clear that the study of categories, for him, is an entirely a priori matter; the categories of meanings and objects alike “arise … solely in relation to our varying thought-functions: their concrete basis is solely to be found in possible acts of thought, as such, or in the correlates which can be grasped in these” (1913/2000, 237). As he puts it later, in the Ideas, the study of categories is a study of essences, based in essential insights about the types of meanings and correlative types of things. Such studies of essence may be conducted by way of imaginative variation of cases, independently of any matter of fact, including whether or not there actually is anything of the ontological kinds distinguished (1913/1962, 51). Thus Husserl’s ontological categories, in this sense, are descriptive categories of highest essences of possible things (that might fall under those essences), and do not purport to provide an inventory of what things actually exist (as a matter of empirical fact).

Husserl provides an extensive discussion of categories of meaning in the Logical Investigations, arguing that differences in categories of meaning (which seem to be more like syntactic than semantic categories) can be distinguished by noting where nonsense results from substituting one term for another. E.g., in the sentence “This tree is green” we may substitute “chair”—but not “careless”—for “tree” without turning sense into nonsense, marking the difference between the meaning categories of nominative material and adjectival material (1913/2000, 511-512). Husserl’s understanding of ‘nonsense’ is rather strict: he counts only those strings of words that are syntactically incorrect (so that they form a mere ‘heap of words’ and cannot be combined into any unified meaning (Husserl 1913/2000, 522)) as strictly nonsensical, and thus as signs of differences in categories of meaning. (Husserl repeatedly distinguishes the nonsense of verbal formations like “a round or” (in which no unified meaning emerges) from cases of mere absurdity such as “a round square”, in which the expression has a unified meaning, although it is a priori that no object can correspond to the expression (1913/2000, 516-17)).

Correlated with the categories of meanings are ontological categories; e.g., object, state of affairs, unit, plurality, number, and relation are (formal) categories that categorize objects, not meanings (Husserl 1913/2000, 237). Categories of the two sorts are, according to Husserl, connected by ‘ideal laws’. Thus, for example, presumably objects are the ontological correlates of the meaning category of nominative expressions, properties are the ontological correlates of adjectival expressions, and states of affairs are the ontological correlates of propositions. So while Husserl does not (to my knowledge) explicitly lay out a method of discerning ontological categories, it may be that we can derive them by beginning from the above nonsense test for distinguishing meaning categories, and then shifting attention to the correlative ontological categories, since “pure truths concerning meaning can be transformed into pure truths concerning the object” (1913/1962, 61).

As well as explicitly distinguishing categories of meanings from categories of the correlated objects that could possibly be ‘meant’, Husserl introduced a second innovation to the study of categories by distinguishing highest formal essences (which Husserl calls ‘categories’) from highest material essences (which he calls ‘regions’) (1913/1962, §10; cf. Smith 1995, 329-330 and Smith 2007, 142-148). Thus far I have been describing the formal ontological categories, the correlates of the different meaning categories distinguishable by the nonsense test. In fact, Husserl reserves the term ‘category’ for the highest formal genera, which are distinguished by a process of formalization—a removal of content. These ‘categorial essences’ begin with ‘object in general’ at the top of the tree, which is then divided at the next level into categories including (as examples) object, state of affairs, property, relation, number, etc. (compare lists 1913/2000, 237 and 1913/1962, 61). Much as Aristotle distinguished (independent) primary substances from (dependent) things of other kinds, within his formal categories Husserl distinguishes the ‘substrative’ category of individuals (or, more properly, the mere this-there) from the dependent ‘syntactic objectivities’—the correlates of nominative terms that are derived from ways in which we speak about the primary substances (1913/1962, 62-3 and 67) (as, e.g., the nominative term ‘this relation of brightness’ may be derived from claims that ‘A is brighter than B’ (1913/2000, 797-8)).

Husserl's material categories, by contrast, classify entities according to their nature or essence, with the highest material genera to be arrived at by a process of generalization to the most general kind of content involved, rather than by the formalization that involves an emptying of all content (1913/1962, 65). The highest material categories are the three regions: nature (including physical objects and events), culture (including artifacts, social entities, and values), and consciousness (cf. Smith 2004). While formal and material category systems each form a hierarchy (1913/1962, 64), considered jointly their categories are not mutually exclusive, since one and the same entity may be categorized either in terms of its material nature or its form. For further discussion of Husserl's categories, see Smith (2007, 135-161).

Husserl is nowhere explicit about the proper method for distinguishing material ontological categories, but he does distinguish material absurdity from formal absurdity, and from the formal nonsense that marks the difference in meaning categories (1913/2000, 523). Expressions are formally absurd if it is a priori that no object could correspond to them, based purely on formal, logical laws, without regard to which particular material concepts are employed, e.g., “a round not-round thing” is formally absurd; its absurdity would remain regardless of which adjective we substituted for ‘round’ or which noun for ‘thing’. On the other hand, expressions are materially absurd if the impossibility of there being any corresponding object is based in the particular material concepts employed, e.g., ‘a round square’ is a materially absurd expression based in the particular meanings of ‘round’ and ‘square’. Thus presumably one could attempt to distinguish material ontological categories by the material absurdity that results from substituting expressions for objects of different material kinds; ‘a round table’, for example, makes perfect sense, but if we substitute for ‘table’ a term for a geometric figure such as ‘square’ or for a day of the week such as ‘Thursday’, we get a materially absurd statement (to which it is a priori that nothing corresponds). As we will see in §2.2 below, Gilbert Ryle developed Husserl's nonsense test for category differences in something like this way.

Roman Ingarden (1960/1964, 22ff) took Husserl's multi-dimensional ontology one step further. Like Husserl, he distinguished formal categories from material categories, but he also distinguished categories in a third dimension: existential categories (those describing an entity’s mode of being). The highest existential categories on Ingarden’s list are the real (spatio-temporal being), the ideal (abstract), the absolute (completely independent, atemporal), and purely intentional (consciousness-dependent). While any conceivable entity should be uniquely locatable in a single category of each dimension, the three sorts of ontology are mutually orthogonal, providing different most abstract ways of considering the putative entity in question. Thus, e.g., a sculpture might be categorized formally as an object, materially as a work of art, and existentially as purely intentional.

1.4 Contemporary Category Systems

By the mid twentieth century, systems of ontological categories had fallen somewhat out of fashion (for reasons I will discuss in §1.5 below), with most discussion of categories shifting to merely articulating category differences rather than outlining a comprehensive system of categories. Nonetheless, in recent years there have been several notable attempts to offer new systems of categories in either the realist or descriptivist spirit, although little agreement exists about what the categories are or how one could decide among competing systems.

Ingvar Johansson (1989) and Roderick Chisholm (1996) both take a neo-Aristotelian realist approach to categories, attempting to lay out a complete system of the categories, where this is understood as providing a list of categories of real entities in the world. Ingvar Johansson explicitly insists that his interest is in the world: “This book is a book about the world. I am concerned with ontology, not merely with language” (1989, 1), and attempts to offer “a realist theory of categories regarded as real aspects of being” (1989, 2). His list (1989, 20) includes nine main categories (some of which subdivide further):

Unlike Aristotle, Johansson makes no explicit use of language in discerning ontological categories, instead appealing to the method of successive abstraction (Johansson 1989, 1-2). Thus, e.g., we arrive at the category ‘quality’ by moving up in abstraction from a particular shade of dark red, to red, color, and finally quality. Similarly (to use an example of Sellars') one might try to arrive at the category of ‘substance’ by considering an individual entity, say, Fido, and moving by successive abstraction from “Fido is a dachshund” through “Fido is a dog” and “Fido is an animal”, ultimately reaching “Fido is a substance” (1970/1974, 321). Like Aristotle's categories, Johansson's categories top out with a number of distinctions without a highest single category subsuming them all.

Like Aristotle and Johansson, and Roderick Chisholm presents his work on categories as being “about the ultimate categories of reality” (1996, 3). Unlike them, however, Chisholm (1996, 3) lays out categories in the form of a porphyrian tree starting from a single most general category comprising everything, but divided into successively narrower genera at lower levels of branching. (For an interesting discussion of whether such general terms as ‘entity’ or ‘thing’ could be seen as naming a highest category, see Thompson 1957, cf. §2.3 below). Chisholm's system of categories thus reads:

Other contemporary authors have approached the issue of categories in a purely descriptive spirit. Reinhardt Grossman, for example, distinguishes eight highest categories (1983, xvi):

But although Grossman characterizes his book as an attempt to “bring Aristotle's Categories up-to-date” (1983, xv), he is explicit in denying that he is making any claims about whether or not there are things belonging to any of the eight categories he distinguishes, taking this as beyond the scope of ontology (1983, 10-12).

Joshua Hoffman and Gary Rosenkrantz (1994) lay out a tree-form system of categories, with entity the summum genus, subdivided into abstract and concrete (rather than Chisholm's contingent and necessary), each of which is further subdivided:

They, too, explicitly offer their system of categories in the spirit of categorial description, as offering an analysis of the various possible categories of being, rather than making any claims about which of these categories is non-empty (1994, 7-8).

E. J. Lowe takes categories to be categories of “what kinds of things can exist and coexist” (2006, 5). Such categories, he argues, are to be individuated according to the existence and/or identity conditions of their members; fundamental categories are those regarding which the existence and identity conditions for their members cannot be exhaustively specified in terms of ontological dependence relations they bear to entities of other categories (2006, 8). Accordingly, he argues that there are four fundamental ontological categories: objects (individual substances such as Fido), modes (property or relation instances such as Fido's four-leggedness), kinds (substantial universals such as the kind dog), and attributes (property or relation universals, such as being four-legged). But although he argues that there are exactly four fundamental categories, Lowe nonetheless takes a heirarchical approach to arranging categories. The four fundamental categories appear at the third level of his heirarchical chart; the categories that appear at the higher levels (particulars and universals at the second level; entity at the top) are “mere abstractions and do no serious ontological work on their own account” (2006, 39). His fuller chart of categories appears as follows:

1.5 Skepticism about Category Systems

Both realist and descriptivist category systems, at least as traditionally presented, seem to presuppose that there is a unique true answer to the question of what categories of entity there are—indeed the discovery of this answer is the goal of most such inquiries into ontological categories. Grossman, for example, argues that a list of categories must be complete, contain everything, with everything in its proper place (1983, 4). Johansson similarly takes his project as to “develop a coherent system of all the most abstract categories needed to give a true description of the world” (1989, 1). Arguments about which of the many systems of categories offered is correct likewise seem to presuppose that there is a uniquely correct list of categories.

But actual category systems offered vary so much that even a short survey of past category systems like that above can undermine the belief that such a unique, true and complete system of categories may be found. Given such a diversity of answers to the question of what the ontological categories are, by what criteria could we possibly choose among them to determine which is uniquely correct?

Some minimal standards of adequacy immediately suggest themselves (Butchvarov 1995, 75). Whether one takes a realist or descriptivist approach to providing a system of categories, if that system is supposed to be comprehensive, it clearly must meet at least the standard of being exhaustive—providing a category for everything there is (on the realist approach) or might be (on the descriptive approach). Nonetheless, one may, as Hoffman and Rosenkrantz (1994, 140) and Lowe (2001, 180) do, present a system of some fundamental categories without taking it to be exhaustive.

Another minimal criterion of adequacy is generally taken to be that the highest categories (or, for tree systems, the categories at each level of branching) be mutually exclusive, ensuring that whatever there is (or might be) finds its place in exactly one highest category, or one category at each level (Chisholm 1989, 162). (This still allows for nested categories, so that something may belong to both a more specific category like substance and a more general category like individual.)

But these criteria are not enough to provide the needed reassurance. First, we lack assurance that most proposed category systems meet even these minimal conditions. As mentioned above, Aristotle drew out his categories largely by considering the types of question that could be asked (and the types of answer appropriate to them). It is difficult to know, however, how one can be assured that all kinds of questions have been surveyed, and so difficult to know that an exhaustive list of categories has been offered—a point Aristotle does not attempt to demonstrate (Ackrill 1963, 80-81). Indeed, the fact that Aristotle provides different lists of categories in different places suggests that he did not consider his list final and exhaustive. Similarly, Kant’s system of categories can be thought to be exhaustive only as long as the list of forms of judgment from which he derives them exhausts the possible forms of judgment—but we have reason to think this is not so (Körner 1955, 50). Johansson, as we have seen, instead uses the method of successive abstraction. But it is not clear how following such a method could ensure either that the categories thereby distinguished are exhaustive (how do we know we have considered something of each highest kind if we do not yet know what the highest kinds are?) or even mutually exclusive.

Secondly, even if we can verify that the standards of mutual exclusivity and exhaustiveness are met, these conditions alone are far too weak to uniquely pick out a system of categories. Provided one accepts the law of the excluded middle, an endless supply of mutually exclusive and exhaustive classifications can be generated at will: we can divide things into the spatio-temporally located and the not-spatio-temporally-located, the intentional and the non-intentional, the extended and the non-extended, to name but a few of the more relevant ways in which things could be divided. Indeed one of the sources of puzzlement about categories comes from the fact that philosophers have selected so many different sorts of divide as the fundamental category difference—for Descartes, the extended and the thinking (unextended), for Chisholm the contingent and the necessary, for Hoffman and Rosenkrantz the concrete and the abstract, and so on. Thus another reason for skepticism about the existence of a unique set of categories comes from the fact that categories are supposed to be the most abstract genera under which things (may) fall. But from any given entity, abstraction may apparently be done in a variety of ways—even if we are careful to do so in ways that ensure mutual exclusivity and exhaustiveness.

Doubts about possibilities for discovering the one true category system have led many to eschew talk of category systems altogether, and others to adopt some kind of relativism about category systems that ceases to take systems of categories seriously as candidate lists of the single set of highest genera under which anything falls (or could fall). Jan Westerhoff (2005), for example, argues that there is no unique, absolute set of ontological categories. On his view categories in metaphysics turn out to be analogous to axioms in mathematical theories; in each case, there may be more than one way to systematize our knowledge from a relatively simple basis. The result is a kind of relativity about systems of categories: “which set of ontological categories we choose is primarily a matter of convenience, in the same way as specific axiomatizations of propositional logic or Newtonian mechanics are more convenient to use than others” (2005, 218). As a result, Westerhoff argues, we must reassess the importance of ontological categories in metaphysics--these should not be considered “the most fundamental parts of the world, but... the most fundamental parts of our systematization of the world” (2005, 135).

Others have taken the variety of category systems explicitly offered or presupposed by philosophers as mere evidence of the particular presuppositions of their thought, or prejudices of their age—not as evidence about anything to do with the world and its divisions. Thus, e.g., Stephan Körner's discussion of categorial frameworks is designed to make explicit how a thinker’s framework categorizes objects, making use of certain individuative principles, and making clear his reasons for holding that framework (1970, 10). R. G. Collingwood, in similar vein, treats the task of metaphysics generally as merely uncovering the “presuppositions underlying ordinary science” (1940/1998).

The specific worries about (1) guaranteeing the mutual exclusiveness and joint exhaustiveness of the categories, and (2) whether or not any single system of categories could purport to be uniquely correct, can, however, be met by certain ways of formulating ontological categories. The first sort of worry can be met by ensuring that categories (of the same level) are defined in ways that guarantee mutual exclusiveness and exhaustiveness. Thus, e.g., Thomasson (1999, chapter 8) distinguishes categories in terms of what relations of dependence a purported entity has or lacks on mental states (and a second dimension distinguished in terms of what relations of dependence a purported entity has or lacks on spatio-temporally located objects), so that the law of the excluded middle alone ensures mutual exclusiveness and exhaustiveness of the categories distinguished. (Dummett’s method of distinguishing categories provides another route for guaranteeing mutual exclusivity—see §2.3 below).

Multi-dimensional systems (Husserl 1913/1962, §10; Ingarden 1960/1964, Chapter 2; Thomasson 1999, Chapter 8; Smith forthcoming, Chapter 8) address the second worry to some extent by acknowledging that the different dimensions of categorization are possible, and that no one-dimensional list can purport to completeness. In principle, multi-dimensionalists may even accept that there is no fixed number or limit on how many one-dimensional lists of categories there may be, though each such list may purport to provide a unique, correct, exhaustive categorization of entities considered in the chosen respect.

In any case, given the great potential uses of a system of categories (many of which do not depend on claims that that category system is uniquely acceptable), we should not abandon attempts at systems of categorization prematurely. Even if we do not think of a category system as providing a realist inventory of all that exists, a system of categories laid out in the descriptivist spirit provides a framework within which existence questions can be answered in a systematic and wholesale way, by enumerating categories so that we can then undertake further investigations into whether or not there really is anything of each kind. Working from within a categorial framework can help ensure that whatever ontology we provide is principled and unified, avoiding ad hoc and piecemeal decisions. The descriptivist's categories also provide a tool that may be used elsewhere in ontology, e.g., in helping to ensure that comparisons of parsimony are legitimately made (by examining which categories of entity are accepted and which denied by various theories), and in checking that potential solutions to metaphysical problems are not overlooked by tacit use of a category system that is not exhaustive (Thomasson 1999, Chapters 8 and 9). Indeed assumptions about categorizations play such a strong role in philosophical discussions (e.g., discussions of the Cartesian theory of mind, Platonist theories of mathematics, etc.), that doing the work on categories necessary to make these categorial assumptions explicit and open them for examination must remain a highly useful exercise regardless of doubts about the prospects for discovering a uniquely correct system of categories.

1.6 Categories in Other Disciplines

Recently, work on ontological categories has attracted interest not only among philosophers, but also in information science and the biomedical sciences, where ontologies are used to organize the knowledge represented in information systems (Smith 2003). In some cases, the ontologies developed are domain-specific (e.g. specific to medical information, geographic information, etc.), but there has also been a great deal of interest in developing a ‘top-level’ ontology of maximally general categories applicable to all specific domains; it is such top-level ontologies that draw upon philosophical work on ontological categories most directly, although categorial distinctions also play a crucial role in domain-specific ontologies.

Discussion of categories also plays an important role in cognitive science, where the goal is not to discover the fundamental categories of being, but rather the means by which experiencers come to categorize their world. Here, debates have centered on how humans in fact come to group things into categories--whether this involves lists of definitional (observable or hidden) features, resemblance to prototypes, prominent features weighted probabalistically, etc. Debates also concern the relation between conceptual and linguistic categories, which levels of category are more basic, and whether or to what extent categorizations are consistent across cultural groups. For further discussion of the debates about categorization in cognitive science see Lakoff (1987) and Rakison and Oakes (2003). Whether information from cognitive science about our formation of conceptual and linguistic categories has any import for our understanding of what ontological categories there are is itself, of course, a contentious issue (to which I will return briefly in section 2.3 below).

2. Category Differences

Recent work on categories has been strongly directed by reaction to skepticism about the possibility of offering a system of ontological categories. On the one hand, difficulties like those mentioned above have undermined the idea that a uniquely true and comprehensive system of categories could be developed. As a result, while categories have continued to play a central role in analytic philosophy in the past century, the focus has shifted to articulating particular category differences, without attempting to provide an exhaustive inventory of metaphysical categories or even presupposing that such a list is possible.

On the other hand, an even more influential source of skepticism about the possibility of laying out a system of ontological categories in the realist spirit derives from the general positivist rejection of metaphysics: if all metaphysical talk is nonsense, then talk about what sorts of thing there really are in the world is just part of the general rubbish constituting metaphysics, and debates about, e.g., whether or not substance is a category of being, whether there are ten or twelve or twenty-seven top level categories, whether or not there is a single highest category, etc. are all meaningless. Moreover, even for philosophers who regained comfort with certain forms of metaphysical talk, naturalistic concerns about ontological commitment to such abstract entities as qualities, relations, etc., have made many shy away from providing a realist list of categories that would include any such things (Sellars 1970/1974, 322-3).

In response to such positivist and naturalistic qualms, talk about categories over the past century has also tended to shift to identifying differences in semantic categories rather than drawing out systems of ontological categories. Thus when Gilbert Ryle (1949, 1938/1971) talks of categories, he does not speak directly of categories of entities, but rather of differing logical types of concepts, where such type differences are detectable by the absurdities that result from substituting in terms of one sort for terms of another in sentences of certain kinds (see §2.2 below). Wilfrid Sellars, developing a strategy of Ockham’s, argues explicitly that we may construe category statements as disguised metalinguistic statements about the role of certain expressions (and their functional counterparts in other languages). According to Sellars, “Socrates is a substance”, for example, has the sense of “The ·Socrates· is a basic mental singular term”, and “Yellow is a quality” has the sense of “The ·yellow· is a (one-place) predicate (in mentalese)” (1970/1974, 328) (where the “·___·” notation has the function of enabling us to speak about linguistic roles without being tied to a particular natural language). As a result we can replicate the work done by traditional category distinctions between, e.g., substance and quality, without committing ourselves ontologically to the existence of qualities or other abstracta (1970/1974, 329).

2.1 The Uses of Category Distinctions

Those who focus on articulating category distinctions rather than on laying out complete systems of categories generally invoke categories not in hopes of providing answers to such basic metaphysical questions as ‘what exists’, but rather as a way of exposing, avoiding, or dissolving various presumed philosophical mistakes, confusions, and paradoxes.

Thus, e.g., Russell and Whitehead introduced type theory (which might in some sense be considered a theory of categories) to avoid a certain form of paradox found in Fregean set theory (where we must consider the putative set of all non-self membered sets, which is a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself), liar’s paradoxes (“This sentence is false”, which is true if and only if it is false), etc. On their analysis, paradoxes like these arise from the attempt to form an illegitimate totality by trying to collect into a single totality a collection that has members that presuppose the existence of the totality. To avoid such paradoxes, we must accept that “Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection” (1913/1962, 37) and thus that such totalities (involving all of a collection) must be of a higher type, making, e.g., classes of sets of a higher type than are sets of individuals, and so on, leading to an infinite hierarchy of types. The type-mixing paradox-generating claims are rejected as ill-formed and meaningless (1913/1962).

Most famously, Ryle (1949) introduced the idea of the category mistake as a way of dispelling the confusions he thought to be rampant in the Cartesian theory of the mind, and thus of dissolving many apparent problems in philosophy of mind. According to Ryle, one makes a category mistake when one mistakes the logical type or category of a certain expression (1949, 16-17). Thus, e.g., a foreigner would make a category mistake if he observed the various colleges, libraries, and administrative offices of Oxford, and then asked to be shown the university. The foreigner mistakes the university for another institution like those he has seen, when in fact it is something of another category altogether: “the way in which all that he has already seen is organized” (1949, 16). The category mistake behind the Cartesian theory of mind, on Ryle's view, is based in representing mental concepts such as believing, knowing, aspiring, or detesting as acts or processes (and concluding they must be covert, unobservable acts or processes), when the concepts of believing, knowing, and the like are actually dispositional (1949, 33). Properly noting category distinctions may help alleviate a variety of philosophical problems and perplexities, and the idea of the category mistake was widely wielded (by Ryle and others) with this aim.

Another potential application of work on categories lies in the idea that various mistakes and puzzlements in ontology can be traced to the mistaken belief that category-neutral existential and quantificational claims are truth-evaluable (see Thomasson 2007). A great many arguments in ontology rely on claims about whether, in various situations, there is some object present (or how many objects there are), where the term 'object' must be used in a category-neutral way for the argument to go through (Thomasson 2007, 112-118). But if truth-evaluable existential and quantificational claims must tacitly presuppose some category or categories of entity over which we are quantifying, then such arguments go astray. Thomasson (2007) gives independent grounds for thinking that all quantification must at least tacitly presuppose a category or categories of entity over which we are quantifying, and argues that adopting that view provides the uniform basis for dissolving a number of problems supposed to arise with accepting an ontology of ordinary objects.

2.2 The Ryle/Husserl Method of Distinguishing Categories

While those who only make use of the idea of category differences (rather than purporting to offer a category system) have no need to worry about how to provide an exhaustive list of categories, they nonetheless owe an account of the conditions under which we can legitimately claim that two entities, concepts, or terms are of different categories, so that we know when a category mistake is (and is not) being made. Otherwise, they would face the charge of arbitrariness or ad hocery in views about which categories there are or where category differences lie. Yet there is little more agreement about the proper criteria for distinguishing categories than there is about what categories there are.

Ryle famously considered absurdities to be the key to detecting category differences. But although Ryle made the method famous, he apparently derived the idea from Husserl's method of distinguishing categories of meaning (cf. Ryle 1970, 8; Simons 1995, 120; Thomasson 2002, 124-8, and §1.3 above). But while Husserl used syntactic nonsense as a way of detecting differences in categories of meaning (yielding different grammatical categories), Ryle broadened the idea, taking absurdities more widely conceived to be symptoms of differences in logical or conceptual categories (1938/1971, 180). Thus, e.g., the statement “She came home in a flood of tears and a sedan-chair” (Ryle 1949, 22) is perfectly well-formed syntactically, but nonetheless Ryle classifies it as a sentence that is absurd, where the absurdity is a symptom of the fact that the sentence conjoins terms of different categories.

Ryle describes the test for category differences as follows: “Two proposition-factors are of different categories or types, if there are sentence-frames such that when the expressions for those factors are imported as alternative complements to the same gap-signs, the resultant sentences are significant in the one case and absurd in the other” (1938/1971,181)—in other words, two expressions (or rather: what they signify) differ in category if there are contexts in which substituting one expression for the other results in absurdity. This test, of course, provides no way of establishing that two expressions are of the same category (but only that they are not), since there is an infinite number of sentence-frames, and one may always yet be found that does not permit the substitution to be made without absurdity. It also leaves open and merely intuitive the notion of ‘absurdity’ itself; in fact, Ryle concludes his paper “Categories” with the question “But what are the tests of absurdity?” (1938/1971, 184). Ryle's approach was further developed, in a more formal fashion, by Fred Sommers (1959, 1971).

J. J. C. Smart (1953) criticized Ryle’s criterion for drawing category distinctions on grounds that it could apparently be used to establish a category difference between any two expressions whatsoever. “Thus ‘the seat of the—is hard’ works if ‘chair’ or ‘bench’ is put into the blank, but not if ‘table’ or ‘bed’ is. And if furniture words do not form a category, we may well ask what do” (1953, 227). Without a test for absurdity apart from a certain kind of intuitive unacceptability to native speakers, we seem to be left without a means of declaring ‘Saturday is in bed’ to be a category violation but ‘The seat of the bed is hard’ not to be. Bernard Harrison attempts to meet this challenge by distinguishing the sorts of inappropriateness that result from violations of category facts (such as the former) from those that result from mere violations of facts of usage (the latter) (1965, 315-16). The use of the term ‘bed’ could conceivably be extended in ways that would make ‘The seat of the bed is hard’ acceptable (e.g., if beds came to be made with seats), whereas ‘Saturday’ could not conceivably be extended in a way that would make ‘Saturday is in bed’ acceptable—any such attempted ‘extension’ would just involve using ‘Saturday’ homonymously (e.g., as the name for a day of the week and for a person) (1965, 316-18). For further discussion of intersubstitutability approaches to drawing category distinctions, see Westerhoff (2005, 40-59).

2.3 The Dummett/Frege Method of Distinguishing Categories

Developing some suggestions of Frege's, Michael Dummett (1973/1981) lays out a novel way of drawing category distinctions among objects. For Frege, the logical categories of things are the correlates of different categories of linguistic expression, where the categories of linguistic expression in turn are based on the proper use of the expressions (Dummett 1973/1981, 57). Thus the ontological category of object is distinguished by reference to the linguistic category of proper name (Dummett 1973/1981, 55-56; cf. Wright 1983, 13 and Hale 1987, 3-4)—i.e., an object just is the correlate of a proper name, where proper names are held to include all singular terms (including singular substantival phrases preceded by the definite article).

Frege leaves the distinction between these so-called ‘proper names’ and other parts of speech merely intuitively understood, but Dummett argues that, e.g., one could make a start at criteria for distinguishing proper names by requiring substitutability of terms while preserving the well-formedness of a sentence (which, as we have seen in §1.3, also plays a role in Husserl's distinction of meaning categories), and while preserving the validity of various patterns of inference (where the latter requirement is needed to distinguish proper names from other substantival terms such as ‘someone’ and ‘nobody’) (1973/1981, 58 ff.). (For further refinements of these criteria, see Dummett (1973/1981, 61-73) and Hale (1987, Chapter 2)).

In line with Frege's requirement (1884/1968, §62) that names must be associated with a criterion of identity, Dummett argues that an additional test (beyond these formal tests) is needed to distinguish genuine proper names (to which objects correspond) from other sorts of expression: “Even though an expression passes the more formal tests we devised, it is not to be classified as a proper name, or thought of as standing for an object, unless we can speak of a criterion of identity, determined by the sense of the expression, which applies to the object for which it stands” (1973/1981, 79).

Once grammatical categories are distinguished, enabling us to thereby distinguish the ontological category object by reference to the linguistic category of proper name, we can go on to draw out category distinctions among objects.

As Dummett argues (in a point further developed in Lowe 1989 and Wiggins 2001), proper names, whether simple or complex, must be associated with a criterion of identity that determines the conditions under which the term may be correctly applied again to one and the same thing (1973/1981, 73-75). All of those names and general sortal terms (usable in forming complex names) that share a criterion of identity are then said to be terms of the same category, even if the criteria of application for the associated sortals vary (1973/1981, 546). Thus, e.g., the sortal terms ‘horse’ and ‘cow’ (similarly, names of horses and cows) are terms of the same category, since they share the identity criteria suitable for animals.

As Lowe (1989, 108-118) notes, this approach to categories blocks certain reductivist moves in metaphysics. For, e.g., if sortal terms such as ‘person’ and ‘organism’ are associated with different identity conditions, those who seek to reductively identify persons with biological organisms are involved in a category mistake.

The idea that category distinctions may be drawn out in terms of the identity and/or existence conditions associated with terms of each category has recently gained popularity. Though they differ in details, versions of the approach have been utilized not only by Frege and Dummett but also by Lowe (2006, 6) and Thomasson (2007).

This approach to drawing category distinctions can avoid various potential problems and sources of skepticism. It is not subject to problems like those Smart raised for Ryle’s criterion, for days of the week clearly have different identity conditions than do persons, whereas beds and chairs seem to share identity conditions (those suitable for artifacts). Such a method of drawing out categories also is not subject to the sorts of skepticism raised above for category systems. Here there is no claim to provide an exhaustive list of categories, and for a principled reason: different categories may come into discussion as long as nominative terms or concepts associated with distinct identity conditions may be invented, so there may be no fixed number of possible categories at all.

Following this method also guarantees that the categories distinguished are mutually exclusive, for it is a corollary of this position that entities may be identified only if they are governed by the same identity conditions (and meet those), so that it is ruled out a priori that one and the same entity could belong to two or more distinct categories, in violation of the mutual exclusivity requirement.

This method of distinguishing categories also provides a principled way of answering some of the central questions for theories of categories, including whether or not there is a single summum genus, and what the relationship is between linguistic/conceptual and ontological categories. Such completely general terms as “thing” “entity” or “object”, on Dummett’s view, are not genuine sortal terms, since they fail to provide any criteria of identity. Thus clearly on this view (as on Aristotle's) there is no summum genus under which categories such as artifact, animal, etc. could be arranged as species, since (lacking criteria of identity) such candidate catch-all terms as ‘object’, ‘being’, ‘entity’ and the like are not even sortal terms and so cannot be categorial terms.

Views that, like Ryle's and Dummett's, approach categorization by way of language rather than ontologically, are sometimes criticized as capable only of noting differences in category of certain linguistic expressions, but why, it might be asked, should that have anything to tell us about differences in the categories of real things? But Dummett's way of understanding categorization shows a way through this issue. For Dummett argues that, without some associated categorial concept, we cannot single out objects (even using names or demonstratives) (1973/1981, 571). Categorial concepts are necessary for us to single out ‘things’ at all, and cannot be derived from considering ‘things’ preidentified without regard to categories. (It would thus follow from this that Johansson’s idea that we could arrive at categories by abstraction from considering individual things would be wrong-headed.) On this view, then, categories not only may but must be distinguished primarily by way of distinguishing the identity conditions criterially associated with the proper use of different sortal terms and names. If we cannot refer to, discover, or single out objects at all except by way of a certain categorial conception (providing application and identity conditions), then the categorial differences in our sortal terms or names (marked by their differences in identity conditions) are ipso facto, and automatically, category differences in the things singled out by these terms—the possibility of a ‘mistake’ here just does not arise, and the connection between the category of an expression used to refer to a given entity and the category of the entity referred to is ensured.


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Aristotle, General Topics: metaphysics | Husserl, Edmund | Ingarden, Roman | Kant, Immanuel | metaphysics | ontology and ontological commitment | Russell, Bertrand | sortals


Many thanks go to Willem de Vries, Simon Evnine, Jonathan Lowe, Linda Palmer, David Woodruff Smith, Jennifer Uleman, and Achille Varzi for very helpful comments on earlier drafts of this entry.