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Moral Motivation

First published Thu Oct 19, 2006

In our everyday lives, we confront a host of moral issues. Once we have deliberated and formed judgments about what is right or wrong, good or bad, these judgments tend to have a marked hold on us. Although in the end, we do not always behave as we think we ought, our moral judgments typically motivate us, at least to some degree, to act in accordance with them. When philosophers talk about moral motivation, this is the basic phenomenon they seek to understand. Moral motivation is an instance of a more general phenomenon—what we might call normative motivation—for our other normative judgments also typically have some motivating force. When we make the normative judgment that something is good for us, or that we have a reason to act in a particular way, or that a specific course of action is the rational course, we also tend to be moved. Many philosophers have regarded the motivating force of normative judgments as the key feature that marks them as normative, thereby distinguishing them from the many other judgments we make. In contrast to our normative judgments, our mathematical and empirical judgments, for example, seem to have no intrinsic connection to motivation and action. The belief that an antibiotic will cure a specific infection may move an individual to take the antibiotic, if she also believes that she has the infection, and if she either desires to be cured or judges that she ought to treat the infection for her own good. All on its own, however, an empirical belief like this one appears to carry with it no particular motivational impact; a person can judge that an antibiotic will most effectively cure a specific infection without being moved one way or another.

Although motivating force may be a distinguishing feature of normative judgments, the phenomenon of normative motivation seems most significant in the case of narrowly moral judgments. Moral motivation has, in any case, received far greater attention than motivation in connection with other normative judgments. Morality is widely believed to conflict, frequently and sometimes severely, with what an agent most values or most prefers to do. Perhaps because of the apparent opposition between self-interest and morality, the fact of moral motivation has seemed especially puzzling. How is it that we are so reliably moved by our moral judgments? And what is the precise nature of the connection between moral judgment and motivation? Of course, the less puzzling and more mundane moral motivation comes to seem, the more puzzling failures of moral motivation become. If we are to explain moral motivation, we will need to understand not only how moral judgments so regularly succeed in motivating, but how they can fail to motivate, sometimes rather spectacularly. Not only do we witness motivational failure among the deranged, dejected, and confused, but also, it appears, among the fully sound and self-possessed. What are we to make of the “amoralist”—the rational, strong willed individual who seemingly makes moral judgments, while remaining utterly indifferent?

In answering the foregoing questions, philosophers have been led to sharply differing views about moral motivation, and these views have sometimes been thought to have important implications for foundational issues in ethics. More precisely, differing views about moral motivation involve commitment to particular theses which have been thought to bear on questions about moral semantics and the nature of morality. Perhaps most famously, certain theses have been jointly deployed to support skeptical or anti-realist views in metaethics. This entry provides an overview of the main positions philosophers have taken in their efforts to understand and explain the phenomenon of moral motivation. It also briefly explains how key theses concerning moral motivation have come to inform and structure debates about moral semantics and the nature of morality.

1. The Basic Phenomenon of Moral Motivation

The basic phenomenon of moral motivation might be given a more systematic depiction as follows, using ‘P’ to stand for some person or individual and ‘φ’ and ‘ψ’ each to stand for some action:

When P judges that it would be morally right to φ, she is ordinarily motivated to φ; should P later become convinced that it would be wrong to φ and right to ψ instead, she ordinarily ceases to be motivated to φ and comes to be motivated to ψ.

This depiction aims to capture features of our common experience. As observation suggests, people generally feel moved to do what they judge it right to do; what is more, their motivation ordinarily shifts to match or “track” changes in their moral judgments. If an individual judges it right to keep a promise rather than to aid a stranger in need, she will ordinarily feel moved, at least to some degree, to act so as to fulfill the promise. If she comes to change her mind about the priority of her promise, she will ordinarily no longer be moved to keep the promise and will be moved instead to provide aid.

Before we turn to the many questions which the foregoing depiction leaves open, and which lie at the heart of debates about the nature of moral motivation, we should make note of two important points. First, the depiction says nothing about the strength of moral motivation. For all that it tells us, the motivation all or some people feel to do what they judge right might be extraordinarily weak. Common experience suggests that moral motivation in fact tends to be fairly robust, but with one qualification to be noted later, philosophical views about moral motivation generally follow the depiction in taking no position regarding the exact strength of moral motivation. Second, the depiction reflects a widely shared assumption, one which forms part of the backdrop for debates about the nature of moral motivation, namely, that moral motivation is a strikingly regular and reliable phenomenon. Throughout social life, in both our personal relations and our public interactions, we take it for granted that moral judgments dependably, if not unfailingly, motivate, that they effectively influence and guide how people feel and act. Still, the assumption is not wholly uncontroversial; indeed, some have expressed serious doubts regarding whether moral motivation is as regular and reliable as we commonly suppose (Copp 1997, 50).

The basic phenomenon of moral motivation seems relatively straightforward. The difficult philosophical task becomes one of attempting to understand and explain more fully and precisely the nature of moral motivation. Sections 2 and 3 explore two approaches to the task. While the approach discussed in section 3 has been predominant, the approach to be considered briefly in section 2 provides an instructive contrast, as well as a useful first glimpse of how ideas about moral motivation have been thought to bear on broader metaethical questions.

2. Moral Motivation and the Nature of Moral Properties

When we judge that an action is right or wrong or that a state of affairs is good or bad, we seem to represent the world as being a certain way. We seem to express a moral belief, attributing a particular moral property or normative characteristic to the action or state of affairs. Taking the apparent representational form of moral judgments as our lead, we might try to explain moral motivation by appealing to the nature of the properties that figure in our moral judgments. Perhaps we are reliably motivated by our moral judgments, at least when those judgments are roughly correct, because moral properties like rightness and goodness themselves motivate us, when we apprehend them.

J.L. Mackie (1977) famously criticizes this picture of moral properties in his extended argument against the objectivity of ethics. Mackie claims to find something like it in the work of a number of historical figures, including Kant and Sidgwick, but his clearest presentation of the picture comes in his remarks about Plato. Mackie writes: “In Plato's theory the Forms, and in particular the Form of the Good, are eternal, extra-mental, realities. They are a very central structural element in the fabric of the world. But it is held also that just knowing them or ‘seeing’ them will not merely tell men what to do but will ensure that they do it, overruling any contrary inclinations. The philosopher-kings in the Republic can, Plato thinks, be trusted with unchecked power because their education will have given them knowledge of the Forms. Being acquainted with the Forms of the Good and Justice and Beauty and the rest they will, by this knowledge alone, without any further motivation, be impelled to pursue and promote these ideals” (Mackie 1977, 23–24).

Certain features of Plato's picture of moral motivation—or at least Mackie's characterization of it—merit attention. First, as Mackie construes Plato's view, moral motivation springs directly and entirely from moral properties themselves. Those properties move an agent to act, and they do so unaided by any additional source of motivation; their motivational power is wholly intrinsic, depending on no desire or disposition of the individual herself. Second, moral properties not only motivate entirely on their own: they provide overriding motivation. Of course, their motivational power depends on an individual's grasping or apprehending them. Once an agent does apprehend them, however, their motivating power overcomes any opposing desires or inclinations.

In maintaining, as he does, that Plato's theory of the Forms depicts what objective values would have to be like, Mackie, in effect, subscribes to (and attributes to Plato) a view called existence internalism. According to existence internalism, a necessary connection exists between having a certain normative status and motivation.[1] A state of affairs couldn't be good, for example, unless it, or at least apprehension of it, was capable of motivating, though it need not motivate overridingly. If an individual apprehends something and fails to be moved, then ceteris paribus, it isn't good. As Mackie describes Plato's view, objective values provide overriding motivation, and so the view reflects a particularly strong form of existence internalism. The internalist character of Mackie's Platonic picture curiously aligns it with contemporary views that similarly accept existence internalism, while holding that the capacity for motivation in fact depends on a preexisting desire. Consider a view about reasons associated most prominently with Bernard Williams (1981). According to what is called internalism about reasons or reasons internalism, it is necessarily the case that if an individual has a reason to do an action, he must be able to be motivated to do that action. On Williams' view, in order to be motivated, an individual must have a desire. Roughly speaking, then, if a consideration does not motivate a person given her current desires or “motivational set,” it cannot be a reason for her to act. Both the views of Williams and of Mackie's Plato posit a necessary connection between normative status and motivation, but the former view makes normative status depend, in a way the latter view would flatly reject, on an individuals' subjective motives.

Mackie's discussion provides a first illustration of how accounts of moral motivation have been deployed to defend or refute broader positions in metaethics. According to Mackie, the motivating power of objective values, if there were such values, would have to be just as Plato depicted it. “Plato's Forms give a dramatic picture of what objective values would have to be. The Form of the Good is such that knowledge of it provides the knower with both a direction and an overriding motive; something's being good both tells the person who knows this to pursue it and makes him pursue it. An objective good would be sought by anyone who was acquainted with it, not because of any contingent fact that this person, or every person, is so constituted that he desires this end, but just because the end has to-be-pursuedness somehow built into it” (Mackie 1977, 40). Mackie contends that the moral sentences we utter when we make moral judgments in fact express propositions about just such “objectively prescriptive” properties; as a result, our moral judgments can be true or false. So moral cognitivism—the view that moral judgments and beliefs, and the sentences that express them, can be true or false—provides the correct account of moral semantics, of what our moral judgments mean. Given that our moral discourse is cognitivist, it would seem to presume the correctness of moral realism, the view, roughly, that moral judgments and beliefs are truth evaluable, and some of them are literally true.[2] But moral discourse suffers from what is called “presupposition failure,” according to Mackie: moral discourse presupposes objectively prescriptive properties, but there aren't any; such properties would have to be “queer entities” unlike anything else in the world. Talk about morality is, Mackie evidently thinks, rather like talk about unicorns. Our “unicorn talk” expresses propositions (at least assuming it follows medieval legend) about horse-like creatures, tamable only by virgins, whose spiral horns possess magical powers. But there are no such creatures, and so our unicorn talk is systematically in error, though few of us any longer succumb to the error. In denying the existence of moral properties, Mackie rejects moral realism, combining a cognitivist moral semantics with an error theory. According to the error theory, “although most people in making moral judgments implicitly claim…to be pointing to something objectively prescriptive, these claims are all false” (Mackie 1977, 35).[3]

Although contemporary philosophers have been divided with respect to Mackie's moral skepticism, they have mostly agreed in rejecting his extremely strong claims about what moral motivation, and the objective moral properties that figure in our moral judgments, would have to be like. They have uniformly rejected the suggestion that a grasp of morality's requirements would produce overriding motivation to act accordingly. And most have rejected efforts to explain moral motivation by appealing to a motivating power emanating from moral properties and the acts and states of affairs that instantiate them. One partial exception to this last claim may be worth noting. Christine Korsgaard (1996) has endorsed the idea of something like objectively prescriptive entities, though these entities are not, in her view, moral properties. Korsgaard shares Mackie's skepticism about objective values of the sort he describes as figuring in the moral realist views of philosophers like Plato. Nevertheless, she observes, Mackie is wrong and the realist is right with respect to whether any extant entities can meet the dual criteria of providing the agent who knows of them with “both a direction and a motive.” It is, she insists, “the most familiar fact of human life that the world contains entities that can tell us what to do and make us do it. They are people, and the others animals” (Korsgaard 1996, 166). Most philosophers, even those sympathetic to Kant's moral philosophy and to Korsgaard's brand of Kantianism, find the idea that people (and non-human animals) have value and can in that regard “tell us what to do” and “make us do it” rather elusive. But Korsgaard's claims are part of a large, extremely rich picture of ethics which cannot be explored here, and a fair assessment of her claims would require attention to this larger picture. The important point, for present purposes, is that at least some philosophers, Korsgaard, and perhaps others drawn to ideas deriving from Kant's moral philosophy, retain some attraction to the idea that moral motivation and normativity find their source in inherently normative or “objectively prescriptive” entities.

Whether or not there are any properties or entities with anything like the powers Mackie describes, it is a mistake to suppose that moral realists and objectivists must be committed to their existence. No realist or objectivist need think that moral properties, or facts about their instantiation, will, when apprehended, overridingly move all persons regardless of their circumstances, including their cognitive and motivational makeup. An individual might grasp a moral fact, for example, but suffer from temporary irrationality or weakness of will; she might be free of such temporary defects but possess a more indelible motivational makeup that impedes or defeats the motivating power of moral facts. Any plausible account of moral motivation will, and must, acknowledge these sources of motivational failure; and any plausible analysis of moral properties must allow for them. Even those realists or objectivists who maintain that all rational and motivationally unimpaired persons will be moved by moral facts need not think they will be overridingly moved. As already noted, regardless of their views with respect to broader metaethical questions, contemporary philosophers do not take any position on the precise strength of moral motivation—with the qualification (alluded to earlier) that they reject, apparently universally, the idea that moral motivation is ordinarily overriding.

3. Moral Judgment and Motivation

Philosophers have most often attempted to explain moral motivation not by appealing to the special powers of moral properties but by appealing to the nature of moral judgments. Perhaps moral judgments are such that no person could sincerely judge an act morally right or a state of affairs good, while remaining wholly unmoved. Efforts to understand moral motivation in terms of motivation by moral judgments must confront two central questions. First, what is the nature of the connection between moral judgment and motivation—do moral judgments motivate necessarily or do they motivate only contingently? Second, can moral judgments motivate on their own or can they motivate only by the intermediation of a desire or other conative state? Of course, philosophers have answered these questions in varying ways.

3.1 Humeanism v. Anti-Humeanism

Let's consider the second question first. Now one way in which moral judgments could motivate, and, indeed, motivate on their own, would be if moral judgments were not representational after all. Suppose moral judgments did not ascribe properties and express moral beliefs about what things have those properties. Suppose instead, as moral noncognitivism maintains, that moral judgments express desires or other conative states—what philosophers sometimes call “pro-attitudes.” Then it would be clear how moral judgments connect to motivation. They simply express a motivating state that the individual already has; to make a moral judgment is already to be motivated, at least to some degree. The real puzzle as to how moral judgments can motivate arises for those who maintain that moral judgments express moral beliefs, for the connection between belief, a cognitive state, and motivation is uncertain.

How philosophers resolve the puzzle turns on a central issue in moral psychology, namely, whether what is called the Humean theory of motivation is true. According to the Humean view, belief is insufficient for motivation, which always requires, in addition to belief, the presence of a desire or conative state. Moral motivation thus cannot arise from moral belief alone but must depend as well upon a preexisting desire or other conative or intrinsically motivating state. It would perhaps be fair to say that Humeanism continues to be the dominant view. It has been held both by some who accept and by some who reject cognitivism and moral realism, so it has not alone been considered decisive in settling broader issues in metaethics. The view has been held by noncognitivist anti-realists, for example, but also by moral realists like Michael Smith (1994) and Peter Railton (1986a). A number of prominent philosophers, including Thomas Nagel (1970), John McDowell (1979), Mark Platts (1980), David McNaughton (1988), Jonathan Dancy (1993), Thomas Scanlon (1998), and Russ Shafer-Landau (2003), have rejected the Humean picture, however, arguing that, in fact, moral motivation does not depend on the existence of desire: moral belief can itself give rise to motivation.

Precisely how and under what conditions moral belief can itself motivate is a matter of dispute among anti-Humeans. Some hold that moral belief is sufficient to motivate directly. Merely believing that it is right, say, to keep a promise will move the believer, at least to some degree, to act so as to keep it. Others hold that moral beliefs produce desires, which then motivate in conjunction with the moral beliefs that produced them. Believing that it is right to keep a promise produces a desire to do so, and these cognitive and conative states jointly move the believer, at least to some degree, to act so as to keep the promise. Certain virtue theorists offer a quite refined version of the latter idea, arguing that only a particular type of moral belief—one tied to an ideal or complete conception of a situation in light of a more expansive understanding of how to live—necessarily generates in an individual the motivation to do as a moral belief of that type indicates she ought.[4] The virtuous person has not mere moral beliefs but a complex of moral belief and outlook which will reliably move her to behave morally. Proponents of various anti-Humean views readily acknowledge that persons often fail to be moved and to act as they believe they ought. According to any of these views, however, a failure of motivation springs from a cognitive failure.

As already noted, many have found the basic Humean picture most plausible. Before examining a few of the considerations thought to favor it, we should make note of the fact that Humeanism does not itself commit one to any particular view as to the sorts of desires responsible for moral motivation. A Humean might well take the view that no particular desire is implicated in moral motivation. On the contrary, varying desires may, when contingently present, move an individual to do what she judges she ought to do, including the desire to be well regarded by her neighbors, to advance her interests in some way, or to promote the welfare of those who matter to her. Appealing simply to some contingent desire or other may be inadequate, however, to explain the basic phenomenon of moral motivation. After all, what needs to be explained, many would argue, is not merely how we may, on occasion or even frequently, be motivated to do as we think we ought: what needs to be explained is how we are reliably motivated to do as we think we ought. That includes explaining why motivation reliably shifts so as to track changes in our moral beliefs. As we will see, those who accept the Humean picture have sometimes suggested that we look to quite particular desires or to deep features of human psychology to explain moral motivation.

One argument in favor of Humean picture alleges that if beliefs were sufficient to motivate, then we would expect people with the same beliefs to be motivated in the same way. In fact, however, whereas some people are motivated by their moral belief, say, that contributing to famine relief is a duty, to write a check to Oxfam, others feel no such inclination whatsoever. But anti-Humeans claim that they can explain away these differences by showing either that differential motivation is in fact due to other differences in belief or to motives that compete with and override the desires generated by moral beliefs (Shafer-Landau 2003, 129–130).

A second argument in favor of Humeanism appeals to the view about reasons associated with Williams (1981), briefly discussed earlier. Recall that according to internalism about reasons or reasons internalism, it is necessarily the case that if an individual has a reason to do an action, then he must be able to be motivated to do that action. On a more specific version of the view, an individual has a reason to do an action only if he has a desire to perform that action or to achieve some end which requires doing that action. If internalism about reasons is correct, then when an individual correctly judges himself to have a reason to perform an action, he must already have a preexisting desire. Anti-Humeans sometimes reject reasons internalism, as well as the Humean theory of motivation. But even allowing that reasons internalism is correct, they believe this second argument fails to undermine their position. For it seems possible that not all of our moral judgments involve the judgment (correct or otherwise) that we have a reason for action. An individual could, for example, judge that it would be right to fulfill a promise without judging that she has a reason to do anything. What might explain this? Perhaps, for instance, she fails to reflect on the connection between what it is right to do and what one has reason to do; or perhaps she mistakenly believes that truths about morally right action do not entail truths about what one has reason to do. If an individual can judge an action right without judging that she has a reason to perform the action, then even if an action's being right entails a reason for action and reasons entail desires, moral beliefs need not involve a preexisting desire (Shafer-Landau 2003, 128–129).[5]

Perhaps the most sophisticated argument in favor of the Humean theory of motivation appeals to considerations in the philosophy of mind and moral psychology, specifically, to fundamental differences between belief and desire that would seem to count against anti-Humeanism.[6] Belief and desire, as a conceptual matter, it is argued, differ in what has been called their “direction of fit.” They differ in such a way, it would seem, that belief states cannot entail desire states. Whereas beliefs aim to fit the world, desires aim to change the world. That is to say, whereas beliefs have a “mind-to-world” direction of fit, desires have a “world-to-mind” direction of fit. For a mental state to count as a belief, it must be at least somewhat responsive to evidence that bears on the truth or falsity of its propositional content; that the facts are contrary to a belief counts against it. In contrast, facts contrary to the propositional content of a desire—the fact that the world is not currently as one wants—need not count against that desire. Precisely because desires aim not to answer to the world but to make the world answer to them (to make the world fit their propositional contents or what the desires are desires for), they may well persist even when the world refuses to cooperate. Assuming the foregoing claims about belief and desire are true, as they surely are, so the argument goes, at least some versions of anti-Humeanism would require what is incoherent, namely, mental states with incompatible directions of fit: mental states that could be at once representational in the way that beliefs are and motivational in the way that desires are. But anti-Humeans would argue that their picture of moral motivation via moral belief need involve no incoherence. To see this, we need merely consider the possibility that a mental state could have opposing directions of fit so long as in exhibiting each direction of fit, the mental state was directed at different propositions: the virtuous agent “believes” (belief direction of fit), say, that a state of affairs S ought to be promoted and “desires” (desire direction of fit) that S be brought about (Little 1997, 64).[7]

Anti-Humeans have offered various considerations—some positive, others negative—to support their rejection of Humeanism. On the negative side, they attempt to defeat considerations thought to favor the Humean theory, as we have already seen in the course of exploring some of those considerations. On the positive side, Anti-Humeans sometimes appeal to the phenomenology of moral motivation, arguing that it supports their view. Ask the agent who is sorely tempted to do otherwise why he ultimately acted as he believed morality required and he will not report his desires at the moment of action; rather, he will explain that he believed the action was the right thing to do (Shafer-Landau 2003, 123). Our own experience and that of others tells us that although our actions often arise from our desires, sometimes they arise instead from our evaluative beliefs. As further support for these claims about the phenomenology of moral motivation, Shafer-Landau has appealed to nonmoral cases in which motivation seems to follow from belief. Consider the individual who convinces herself that she has a desire she in fact lacks, such as the desire to become a lawyer. She enrolls in law school only to find herself unmotivated by her coursework and dropping out after a summer spent working as a carpenter reveals her love of carpentry (Shafer-Landau 2003, 125). What most plausibly explains the individual's enrollment in law school and her efforts during that first year would seem to be her mistaken belief that she desired to become a lawyer. Given that many of our choices will involve subjecting ourselves to tedious, even painful, experiences—experiences which surely none of us desire for their own sake—the Humean owes us some explanation of our willingness to persist in such choices. The Humean will, it seems, be forced to appeal to some further desire we thereby seek to satisfy, such as, in the case of the law school drop-out, the desire to become a lawyer. But such an explanation will be implausible in cases in which we are mistaken about our desires. No compelling reason can be given to accept a desire-based explanation of our actions, Shafer-Landau argues, over the more straightforward explanation in terms of our beliefs.

Yet Humeans would insist that there is nothing straightforward about attempts to explain moral motivation and action in terms of beliefs; just recall the argument for Humeanism based on differences in “direction of fit” between belief and desire. Leaving that argument to one side, however, neither the phenomenology of moral motivation nor cases in which individuals are mistaken about their desires support the anti-Humean view. The fact that an individual may cite a belief rather than a desire in explaining why she did what she judged to be right does nothing to show either that her moral belief directly moved her to act or that it generated a desire that moved her to act. Individual self-reports are notoriously unreliable and can hardly settle so fundamental a question about moral psychology. As for cases in which individuals are (allegedly) mistaken about their desires, common sense suggests that the Humean has the more straightforward explanation. The Humean might argue that the law school drop-out in fact did desire to become a lawyer, or at least to enroll in law school; she simply didn't understand what studying law would be like. Once she experienced it, she lost her desire to continue her studies. Alternatively, perhaps she really didn't desire to become a lawyer, though she told herself that she did. Still, she was moved to enter law school not by her bare belief, but by a more deep seated, perhaps not fully conscious desire, such as the desire to please her parents or to have the prestige or pay that comes with being a lawyer. Anti-Humeans have given us no reason to favor their explanation over the Humean alternatives. Of course, anti-Humeans need not think the phenomenology, as they suppose it to be, settles the dispute, but Humeans will insist that it does not even tend to favor the anti-Humean position.

The foregoing discussion does not, of course, cover every argument that has been offered in the longstanding debate between Humeans and anti-Humeans, just a few of the ones that philosophers have evidently found most persuasive. Whether and how the debate might be resolved remains uncertain, in part, because the nature of the dispute is rather unclear. Is it at bottom a conceptual dispute to be resolved, for instance, by analysis of the concepts of belief and desire? Perhaps, though arguments that appeal to considerations in the philosophy of mind and moral psychology have thus far proved less than fully convincing. Is the dispute instead fundamentally empirical? The tendency to appeal to common sense and the phenomenology of moral action would seem to betray some temptation to treat the issue as at least partly empirical, though perhaps these appeals are meant to serve merely as a check on conceptual claims. Appeals to our experience can, in any case, be just as well, and just as inconclusively, invoked by those on either side of the debate. In the context of warding off criticisms of the view that virtue is knowledge, Little (1997) suggests that the dispute is fundamentally theoretical, implicating large and complex questions about the nature of agency, normativity, and responsibility. Whether or not that is so, Little may be right in suggesting that the dispute will not be resolvable by appeal to merely local arguments of the sort we have considered. How plausible one finds either side may turn, in the end, on the plausibility of the larger normative theories in which these views respectively figure.

3.2 Internalism v. Externalism

Whatever one might conclude as to whether moral judgments or beliefs motivate on their own or only by means of some preexisting conative state, a question remains as to the precise nature of the connection between moral judgment and motivation. Do moral judgments motivate necessarily or do they motivate only contingently? If the latter, then how are we to explain why the contingent connection between moral judgment and motivation is as strong and reliable as it appears to be?

The main division of opinion regarding the nature of the connection between moral judgment and motivation is between those philosophers who accept and those who reject a thesis known as motivational judgment internalism. The latter thesis is a form of judgment internalism, which holds that a necessary connection exists between sincere moral judgment and either justifying reasons or motives: necessarily, if an individual sincerely judges that she ought to φ, then she has a reason or motive to φ. Judgment internalism must be distinguished from the thesis of existence internalism, which we considered earlier. Recall that according to existence internalism, a necessary connection exists between having a certain normative status and motivation.[8] A consideration can be a reason or be right-making, for example, only if it is capable of motivating. Whereas judgment internalism states a necessary condition on being a judgment of a certain kind, existence internalism states a necessary condition on being an act or state or consideration of a certain normative kind.

Motivational judgment internalism, hereafter “internalism,” holds that a person cannot sincerely make a moral judgment without being motivated as least to some degree to abide by her judgment. Internalism can assume weaker or stronger forms, depending on whether one allows that the connection between moral judgment and motivation is defeasible and on precisely how strong the motivation is taken to be. We might call “strong internalism” the view that, necessarily, the person who makes a sincere moral judgment will be overridingly motivated to comply with her judgment. Mackie's view of what objective moral properties must be like involves, as we have seen, a strong existence internalism akin to strong internalism about moral judgments. Contemporary moral philosophers have been no more attracted to so strong a claim when moral motivation is tied to moral judgment than they have been when moral motivation is tied to moral properties. More commonly, they have accepted forms of what we might call “weak internalism,” which allows that even though, necessarily, the person who makes a sincere moral judgment will feel some motivation to comply with it, that motivation can be overridden by conflicting desires and defeated by a variety of mental maladies, such as depression and weakness of will. Smith (1994) has advanced an even weaker version of internalism, or what he calls the “practicality requirement,” maintaining a necessary connection between moral judgment and motivation, at least in the “good and strong-willed person.”

As should already be evident, those who accept one or another form of motivational judgment internalism have a ready explanation of the reliability of moral motivation, including the reliability of motivational shifting so as to track changes in moral judgment. Indeed, one argument offered in favor of internalism is that only if we accept it can we plausibly explain why changes in moral motivation reliably follow upon changes in moral judgment (Smith 1994, 71–76). Suppose Jones and Thomson are debating the moral permissibility of abortion. Jones is inclined to believe abortion is morally wrong. She has been known to join the protest line outside of a local abortion clinic and to try to dissuade women from having abortions. Thomson, in contrast, believes abortion is morally permissible. Suppose that after extensive discussion, Thomson convinces Jones that the more plausible arguments support the permissibility of abortion. What would people reasonably predict in terms of Jones's future conduct? They would reasonably predict, among other things, that she would no longer be inclined to join the protest line and that she would desist from her efforts to discourage other women from having abortions. But that prediction rests precisely on the expectation that, at least insofar as Jones is a good and strong-will person—not depressed or apathetic or suffering from weakness of will—what she is motivated to do will have been altered in response to the change in her moral judgment, which is just what internalism would have us expect. If internalism is true, then, we can readily account for motivational changes. The reliable connection between moral judgment and motivation is, ultimately, best explained internally as due to the very content or nature of moral judgment itself (Smith 1994, 72). Those who accept internalism will, of course, ultimately owe us an account of the content of moral judgments that explains and captures the necessary connection that supposedly exists between moral judgment and motivation.[9]

The thesis that directly opposes motivational judgment internalism, motivational externalism, or just externalism, denies the existence of a necessary connection between moral judgment and motivation. According to externalism, any connection that exists between moral judgment and motivation is purely contingent, though it may turn out to rest on deep features of human nature.[10] The foregoing argument in favor of internalism in effect denies that externalism can adequately explain the basic phenomenon of moral motivation and, in particular, the reliable shifting of moral motivation to match changes in moral judgment. But why think externalism will be explanatorily inadequate? Once we have the internalist thesis about the necessary connection between moral judgment and motivation, it seems we have, as it were, the whole story: if an individual makes a moral judgment, she is, ceteris paribus, motivated; if she is not motivated, she was not making a sincere and competent moral judgment at all, appearances to the contrary notwithstanding. Because the externalist denies the existence of a necessary connection between moral judgment and motivation, the externalist thesis leaves us in need of an independent explanation of moral motivation. The internalist maintains that any such explanation will fall short.

According to one important version of the internalist challenge, offered by Michael Smith, the externalist would have to explain the connection between moral judgment and motivation externally as due not to the content of moral judgments but, rather, the “content of the motivational dispositions possessed by the good and strong-willed person” (Smith 1994, 72). But this allegedly commits the externalist to an unacceptable picture of moral motivation. The internalist will say that an agent who is moved to do the right thing is moved to do the very thing that is given by the content of her moral judgment; she is motivated to do the right thing, “where this is read de re and not de dicto” (73). The person who judges it right to perform an act that advances another's welfare, for example, acquires and is moved by a non-derivative desire or concern to advance his welfare. In contrast, the externalist must say that an agent is moved to do what she judges right due to the content of the motivational dispositions that she has in being a good person. The question then is what those dispositions might be. They cannot be nonderivative concerns for the values her judgment is about, such as another's welfare, for in the case in which a person's judgment changes, her motivation changes. If motivational shifting is to be explained in terms of the motivational dispositions of the good person, rather than in terms of the content of her moral judgments, then the only disposition that could do the explaining would be the motivation to do the right thing, whatever it happens to be; the good person is motivated to do the right thing, “where this is read de dicto and not de re” (75). According to Smith, such a view implausibly treats moral motivation as derivative; it derives from the desire to do the right thing together with a person's current moral judgment about the right thing to do. A person desires to promote another's good, not non-derivatively because she judges it right to promote his good and so desires to do just that, but because she desires to do what is right, and that just happens to be promoting his good. But the good person, Smith claims, cares non-derivatively about justice, equality, and the welfare of loved ones. To care non-derivatively only about doing what one believes right, to be motivated in that way, and not by these other things, is “a fetish or moral vice” (75). Smith suggests that in taking the good person to be motivated to do what she believes morally right, whatever that might be, the externalist picture “alienates her from the ends at which morality properly aims” (76).

Externalists have responded to this challenge by pointing out that the fact that a good person is motivated to do what she thinks right does not preclude her from also being motivated non-derivately by direct concern, for example, for the welfare of loved ones. They have also argued that there is nothing fetishistic in supposing that the good person is motivationally disposed to do the right thing and that, in any case, alternative externalist explanations of a reliable connection between moral judgment and motivation are available (Copp 1997, 49–50). An individual could, for example, simply be disposed to desire immediately to do whatever she believes it right to do or whatever she judges to be valuable (Copp 1997, 50–51). Sigrun Svavarsdottir (1999) has argued that while Smith is mistaken when he claims that the externalist's only option for explaining motivational shifting is to appeal to a desire to do the right thing, something close to the view Smith rejects provides just the right externalist picture of moral motivation. We should, on her view, understand the good person as concerned with doing what is morally valuable or required, where that concern should be understood to encompass what is honest, fair, kind, considerate, just, and so on. The fact that the good person is so motivationally disposed does not mean, as Smith seems to suggest, that she cares only about one thing, namely, doing what she believes is right. Nor does it mean that she undertakes an act conceiving of it simply as the right thing to do. On the contrary, it is compatible with the externalist picture that the good person will often simply respond directly to another's need for comfort or relief. Finally, an externalist view that conceives of the good person as motivated by the desire to be moral does not involve introducing an alien (or alienating) thought—“it's the right thing to do”— into her consciousness in order to explain moral motivation. Rather, having formed the moral judgment that she ought to φ, the desire to be moral plays, in the good person, a role in effecting the “psychological transition” from judging it right to φ to wanting to φ (Svavarsdottir 1999, 201).

Indeed, the point on which perhaps most externalists want to insist is that some conative state must be at work in the movement from judging it right to φ to wanting or being moved to φ. We do not, after all, the externalist will remind us, see this movement occur in all moral agents; some will judge it right to φ without coming to want to φ. Externalists typically take it as a point of common sense observation that wide variation exists in the impact moral judgments have on people's feelings, deliberations, and actions (Svavarsdottir 1999, 161).

Debates between internalists and externalists often center on the figure of the “amoralist”—the person who apparently makes moral judgments, while remaining wholly unmoved to comply with them. Internalists insist that the amoralist is a conceptual impossibility. The standard strategy internalists employ to cope with the hypothetical amoralist is to identify a content for moral judgments which would have the result that no agent (or no rational agent, anyway) could employ moral concepts competently and make a sincere moral judgment, while remaining unmoved. Internalists allow that moral motivation need not be overriding; competing desires may be stronger and so may win out. They allow, too, that moral motivation is defeasible; a person may judge it right to φ, while failing to be moved to φ, due to depression or weakness of will. Cases of irrationality aside, however, the person who appears to be making a moral judgment, while remaining unmoved, must really either lack competence with moral concepts or be speaking insincerely. In the latter case, she judges an act “right” only in an “inverted commas” sense, as when the unrepentant criminal, seeking a lesser sentence, tells the judge, in a remorseful tone, that he knows what he did was “wrong”.

Externalists maintain that the amoralist is not a conceptual impossibility. After all, if we can imagine such persons—and we surely can imagine amoralists—then they are not conceptually impossible (Shafer-Landau 2003, 146). Contrary to what internalists claim, individuals can sincerely and competently apply moral concepts without being motivated in any specific way. While some amoralists may use moral terms only in an inverted commas sense, not all cases of motivational failure can be explained away as cases of irrationality, conceptual incompetence, or insincerity.

At this point in the dialectic, internalists and externalists tend to produce additional cases and probe our intuitions further in an effort to overcome what seems an impasse. Externalists, for example, may invite us to consider cases in which a person judges it right to φ, while believing it would in fact be impossible to succeed in doing φ, or cases in which she thinks doing φ would markedly interfere with her welfare or would prevent her from obtaining something she dearly desires. Doesn't it seem plausible that in such cases a person could judge it right to φ, while failing to be moved to φ? More generally, externalists argue that internalists cannot make sense of morality's historical challenger—the skeptic who asks, “Why be moral?”

Externalists maintain that they can fully and adequately account for the strong but ultimately contingent connection between moral judgment and motivation, offering various explanations of how moral judgments reliably motivate. As we have seen, Svavarsdottir seeks to explain moral motivation by appealing to a particular conative state, namely, the desire to do what is morally valuable or required—the desire, in short to be moral. Peter Railton appeals to the concern people generally have to be able to justify their choices and conduct from a more impartial standpoint. But he also apparently thinks that people's more ordinary motives play a part; at least this is suggested when he remarks that, if we really want people to take morality seriously, “we should ask how we might change the ways we live so that moral conduct would more regularly be rational given the ends we actually have” (Railton 1986a, 203). According to David Brink, externalism makes the motivational force of our moral judgments “a matter of contingent psychological fact, depending on both the content of people's moral views and their attitudes and desires” (Brink 1989, 49). Still, these attitudes and desires may be widely shared and rooted in central features of human nature. Suppose, as the philosopher David Hume maintained, that sympathy is a deep and widely shared feature of human psychology. Then, Brink observes, while it may be a contingent fact that most people will have some desire to comply with what they believe morality requires, it will also be a deep fact about them. “Moral motivation, on such a view, can be widespread and predictable, even if it is neither necessary, nor universal, nor overriding” (Brink 1989, 49).

Philosophers who endorse externalism commonly also endorse Humeanism. Indeed, some contend that the basic observation that supports the former thesis also lends support to the latter thesis: wide variation in the motivational impact of moral judgments suggests not only that they motivate contingently but that they do so via some conative state. Still, externalists need not be Humeans. Shafer-Landau, who rejects both Humeanism and internalism, holds that moral beliefs are indeed intrinsically motivating—they can motivate by themselves. But contra internalism, they are not necessarily motivating. Intrinsically motivating beliefs may fail to motivate under conditions of extreme exhaustion, serious depression, or overwhelming contrary impulses (Shafer-Landau 2003, 147–148). The fact that Shafer-Landau treats the defeasibility of moral motivation under such conditions as supporting a form of externalism, whereas Smith treats defeasibility under like conditions as compatible with a form of internalism, suggests some disagreement among philosophers as to precisely when a view should be classified as a form of internalism or externalism.[11]

4. Moral Motivation and Metaethics

Philosophical thinking about the phenomenon of moral motivation has long overlapped with and influenced ongoing efforts to address foundational questions in ethics. Of special importance has been the use of ideas concerning the nature of moral motivation to support anti-realism in ethics—the view that contrary to the claims of moral realists, there are no moral facts, no truths about what morality requires, forbids, or permits. We have already seen one example of how ideas about moral motivation might bear on broader metaethical views in Mackie's critique of ethical objectivism. As noted earlier, Mackie defends cognitivist anti-realism, a form of anti-realism that couples cognitivism with an error theory. According to cognitivist anti-realism, although ethical sentences express propositions about objectively prescriptive properties—ones with “to-be-pursuedness” built in—no such properties exist; and due to this presupposition failure, we are systematically in error in our moral judgments.

The development of metaethical theories over roughly the past seventy years has perhaps been shaped most profoundly by the use of certain theses about moral motivation to support noncognitivist anti-realism. Noncognitivist anti-realism, like cognitivist anti-realism, rejects the existence of moral properties and moral facts. But unlike the latter view, it rejects cognitivism in favor of noncognitivism, which as traditionally depicted is the view that moral judgments express attitudes rather than beliefs and propositions, and that, consequently, they are not truth evaluable.[12]

Shafer-Landau (2003) offers a formulation of what he calls the Non-cognitivist Argument, which helpfully makes explicit how theses that have figured in efforts to understand moral motivation have been employed to support noncognitivist anti-realism:

  1. Necessarily, if one sincerely judges an action right, then one is motivated to some extent to act in accordance with that judgment. (Motivational Judgment Internalism)
  2. When taken by themselves, beliefs neither motivate nor generate any motivationally efficacious states. (Motivational Humeanism)
  3. Therefore, moral judgments are not beliefs. (Moral Non-cognitivism)[13]

Because every form of cognitivism and moral realism hold that moral judgments are beliefs, that some moral judgments are true, and that therefore there are moral facts, the noncognitivist argument entails that moral realism is false.

Contemporary philosophers who have sought to defend versions of moral realism or objectivism have had to come to grips with this basic line of argument, even if they have not always engaged it explicitly. The Non-cognitivist Argument therefore provides us with a useful tool for mapping out competing positions in metaethics. We can categorize philosophers' positions negatively in terms of which premises of the noncognitivist argument they accept or reject.[14] Some have rejected premise 1, often going on to defend forms of naturalist moral realism that embrace externalism (e.g. Railton 1986; Brink 1989). According to the latter views, moral properties are a kind of natural property and moral facts are natural facts. Judgments about these facts express propositions, and so they can be true or false, but these judgment do not necessarily motivate. Whether our moral judgments motivate us is fixed by contingent facts about our psychologies and our substantive moral beliefs. Some have rejected premise 2, aligning themselves with versions of moral constructivism or rationalism (e.g. Darwall 1983; Scanlon 1998). The latter views take widely varying forms, but they generally see moral principles as requirements of rationality or reason, or as the output of a hypothetical agreement among reasonable, suitably situated persons. Moral reasons are considerations that are motivating, at least when we properly reflect on them, but their motivating force does not depend on a prior desire. Some have rejected both premises 1 and 2, defending forms of nonnaturalist moral realism (Shafer-Landau 2003). Moral properties, on this view, are not identical with natural or descriptive properties, although they may be wholly constituted by them. Moral judgments are intrinsically motivating—they can motivate in the absence of a preexisting desire, but they are not necessarily motivating. Finally, some have accepted both premises 1 and 2, at least appropriately refined, arguing that we can see them both to be compatible with moral realism (Smith 1994). Normative reasons are given by facts about what we would, suitably idealized, want ourselves to desire; and the existence of such facts means that some desires are rationally required. If we believe ourselves to have a normative reason to φ, then rationally we ought to φ, and in judging that we have normative reason to φ, we will necessarily, insofar as we are rational, be moved to φ. The concept of rightness is the concept of what we would desire ourselves to do in our actual world, were we fully rational. When we believe it would be right to φ, then, we will, insofar as we are rational, be motivated to φ.

The debate about moral motivation has been presented in this entry following a fairly common way of framing it. But Thomas Scanlon (1998, ch. 4) suggests that the debate about moral motivation has, in fact, been misleadingly framed. It would, he claims, be better understood as concerned not with motivation but with understanding the reasons people have. According to Scanlon's contractualism, an action is wrong “if its performance under the circumstances would be disallowed by any set of principles for the regulation of behavior that no one could reasonably reject as a basis for informed, unforced general agreement” (153). Moral motivation, on his view, requires no appeal to a conative state. Rather, we can explain how persons are moved, say, to avoid wrongful actions “by the fact that people have reason to want to act in ways that could be justified to others, together with the fact that when a rational person recognizes something as a reason we do not need a further explanation of how he or she could be moved to act on it” (154). Scanlon's position turns on a number of controversial ideas, among them, rejection of the Humean theory and, perhaps most important, his contractualism together with his view about the normative primacy of reasons.

Full consideration of Scanlon's rich system of thought would obviously take us far afield. It is worth simply registering here, however, his suggestion that the debate about moral motivation has been framed improperly. For his suggestion serves to illustrate that how we ought to understand the debate about moral motivation is itself a matter open to dispute. Theses about moral motivation have shaped arguments about foundational issues in ethics. But as Scanlon's own ideas suggest, views about foundational issues in ethics may in turn shape both how we understand the question of moral motivation and how we answer it.


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cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism, moral | moral anti-realism | moral realism | naturalism: moral | non-naturalism, moral | practical reason: and the structure of actions | Williams, Bernard


I want to thank Sarah Buss for helpful suggestions on an earlier draft.