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Moral Psychology: Empirical Approaches

First published Wed Apr 19, 2006

Moral psychology investigates human functioning in moral contexts, and asks how these results may impact debate in ethical theory. This work is necessarily interdisciplinary, drawing on both the empirical resources of the human sciences and the conceptual resources of philosophical ethics. The present article discusses several topics that illustrate this type of inquiry: thought experiments, responsibility, character, egoism v. altruism, and moral disagreement.

1. Introduction: What is Moral Psychology?

The study of moral psychology is simultaneously pursued in two disciplines with very different methodologies. Until recently, the moral psychology of philosophy departments has been largely speculative; prominent empirical claims — about the structure of character, say, or the nature of moral reasoning — have seldom been subject to systematic empirical scrutiny. Conversely, although better grounded empirically, the moral psychology of psychology departments has not always been conversant with important philosophical considerations. At the beginning of the 21st century, this situation has begun to change, as researchers in both philosophy and psychology have begun to pursue thoroughly interdisciplinary approaches to moral psychology. [1]

Moral psychology is a discipline of both intrinsic and practical interest; uncovering the determinants of moral judgment and behavior is fascinating in its own right, and a better understanding of these determinants may help us to better understand what educational and policy interventions may facilitate good conduct and ameliorate bad conduct. Of particular philosophical interest, however, is how inquiry into moral psychology may help adjudicate between competing ethical theories. The plausibility of its associated moral psychology is not, of course, the only dimension on which an ethical theory may be evaluated; equally important are evaluative or normative questions having to do with how well a theory fares when compared to important convictions about such things as justice, fairness, and the good life. Such questions have been, and will continue to be, of central importance for philosophical ethics. Nonetheless, there has been in recent years a growing consensus to the effect that an ethical theory committed to an impoverished or inaccurate conception of moral psychology is at a serious competitive disadvantage. As Bernard Williams (1973, 1985; cf. Flanagan 1991) forcefully argued, an ethical conception that commends relationships, commitments, or life projects that are at odds with the sorts of attachments that can be reasonably be expected to take root in and vivify actual human lives is an ethical conception with — at best — a very tenuous claim to our assent.

Questions about the psychological contours of actual human lives demand empirically substantiated answers; accordingly, problems in ethical theory choice making reference to moral psychology can be structured around two related inquiries:

(1) What empirical claims about human psychology do advocates of competing perspectives on ethical theory assert or presuppose?

(2) How empirically well supported are these claims?

The first question is one of philosophical scholarship: what are the psychological commitments of various positions in philosophical ethics? The second question takes us beyond the corridors of philosophy departments, to the sorts of questions asked, and sometimes answered, by the empirical human sciences, such as biology, psychology, anthropology, sociology, history, cognitive science, linguistics and neuroscience. Thus, contemporary moral psychology is methodologically pluralistic: it aims to answer philosophical questions, but in an empirically responsible way.

However, it will sometimes be difficult to tell which claims in philosophical ethics require empirical substantiation. Partly, this is because it is sometimes unclear whether, and to what extent, a contention counts as empirically assessable. Consider questions regarding “normal functioning” in mental health care: Are the answers to these questions statistical, or evaluative ( Bourse 1975; Fulford 1989; Murphy 2006)? For example, is “normal” mental health simply the psychological condition of most people, or is it good mental health? If the former, the issue is, at least in principle, empirically decidable; if the latter, the issues must be decided, if they can be decided, by arguments about value. Additionally, philosophers have not always been explicit about whether, and to what extent, they are making empirical claims: For example, are their depictions of moral character meant to identify psychological features of actual persons, or to articulate ideals that need not be instantiated in actual human psychologies? Such questions will of course be complicated by the inevitable diversity of philosophical opinion.

In every instance, therefore, the first task is to carefully document a theory's empirically assessable claims, whether they are explicit or, as may often be the case, only tacit. Once claims apt for empirical assessment have been located, the question becomes one of identifying any relevant empirical literatures. The next task is to assess those literatures, in an attempt to determine what conclusions can be responsibly drawn from them. Science, particularly social science, being what it is, many conclusions will be provisional; the philosophical moral psychologist must be prepared to adjudicate controversies in other fields, or offer informed conjecture regarding future findings. Often, the empirical record will be crucially incomplete; in such cases, philosophers may be forced to engage in empirically disciplined conjecture, or even to engage in their own empirical work, as some philosophers are beginning to do.[2]

When the philosophical positions have been isolated, and putatively relevant empirical literatures assessed, we can begin to evaluate the plausibility of the philosophical moral psychology: Is the speculative picture of psychological functioning that informs some region of ethical theory compatible with the empirical picture that emerges from systematic observation? In short, is the philosophical picture empirically adequate? If it is determined that the philosophical conception is empirically adequate, the result is vindicatory. Conversely, if the philosophical moral psychology in question is found to be empirically inadequate, the result is revisionary, compelling alteration, or even rejection, of those elements of the philosophical theory presupposing the problematic moral psychology. The process will often be comparative: theory choice in moral psychology, like other theory choice, involves tradeoffs, and while an empirically undersupported approach may not be decisively eliminated from contention on empirical grounds alone, it may come to be seen as less attractive than theoretical options with firmer empirical foundations.

The winds driving the sort of disciplinary cross-pollination we describe do not blow in one direction. As philosophers writing for an encyclopedia of philosophy, we are naturally concerned with the ways empirical research might shape, or re-shape, philosophical ethics. But philosophical reflection may likewise influence empirical research, since such research is often driven by philosophical suppositions that may be more or less philosophically sound. The best interdisciplinary conversations, then, should benefit both parties. To illustrate the dialectical process we have described, we will consider a variety of topics in moral psychology. Our primary concerns will be philosophical: What are some of the most central problems in philosophical moral psychology, and how might they be resolved? However, as the hybrid nature of our topic invites us to do, we will pursue these questions in an interdisciplinary spirit. Hopefully, the result will be a broad sense of the problems and methods that will structure research on moral psychology during the 21st century.

2. Thought Experiments and the Methods of Ethics

“Intuition pumps” or “thought experiments” have long been well-used items in the philosopher's toolbox (Dennett 1984: 17-18). Typically, a thought experiment presents an example, often a hypothetical example, in order to elicit some philosophically telling response; if a thought experiment is successful, it may be concluded that competing theories must account for the resulting response. These responses are supposed to serve an evidential role in philosophical theory choice; if you like, they can be understood as data competing theories must accommodate.[3] If an appropriate audience's ethical responses to a thought experiment conflict with the response a theory prescribes for the case, the theory has suffered a counterexample.

The question of whose responses “count” philosophically is a question that has been answered in a variety of ways, but for many philosophers, the intended audience for thought experiments seems to be some species of “ordinary folk” (see Jackson 1998: 118, 129; Jackson and Pettit 1995: 22-9; Lewis 1989: 126-9).[4] Of course, the relevant folk must possess such cognitive attainments as are required to understand the case at issue; very young children are probably not an ideal audience for thought experiments. Accordingly, some philosophers may insist that the relevant responses are the considered judgments of people with the training required to see “what is at stake philosophically.” But if the responses are to help adjudicate between competing theories, the responders must be more or less theoretically neutral, and this sort of neutrality, we suspect, is rather likely to be vitiated by philosophical education. A dilemma emerges: On the one hand, philosophically naïve subjects may be thought to lack the erudition required to grasp the philosophical stakes. On the other, with increasing philosophical sophistication comes, very likely, philosophical partiality; one audience is naïve, and the other prejudiced.

However exactly the philosophically relevant audience is specified, there are empirical questions that must be addressed in determining the philosophical potency of a thought experiment. In particular, when deciding what philosophical weight to give a response, philosophers need to determine its origins. What features of the example are implicated in a given judgment — are people reacting to the substance of the case, or the style of exposition? What features of the audience are implicated in their reaction — do different demographic groups respond to the example differently? Such questions raise the following concern: judgments about thought experiments dealing with moral issues might be strongly influenced by ethically irrelevant characteristics of example and audience. Whether a characteristic is ethically relevant is a matter for philosophical discussion, but determining the status of a particular thought experiment also requires empirical investigation of its causally relevant characteristics. We'll now describe two examples of such investigation.

As part of their famous research on the “heuristics and biases” that underlie human reasoning, Tversky and Kahneman (1981) presented subjects with the following problem:

Imagine that the U.S. is preparing for the outbreak of an unusual Asian disease, which is expected to kill 600 people. Two alternative programs to combat the disease have been proposed. Assume that the exact scientific estimate of the consequences of the programs are as follows:

If Program A is adopted, 200 people will be saved.

If Program B is adopted, there is a 1/3 probability that 600 people will be saved, and a 2/3 probability that no people will be saved.

A second group of subjects was given an identical problem, except that the programs were described as follows:

If Program C is adopted, 400 people will die.

If Program D is adopted, there is a 1/3 probability that nobody will die and a 2/3 probability that 600 people will die.

On the first version of the problem most subjects thought that Program A should be adopted. But on the second version most chose Program D, despite the fact that the outcome described in A is identical to the one described in C. The disconcerting implication of this study is that ethical responses may be strongly influenced by the manner in which cases are described or framed. Such framing sensitivities, we are strongly inclined to think, constitute ethically irrelevant influences on ethical responses. Unless this sort of possibility can be confidently eliminated, one should hesitate to rely on responses to a thought experiment for adjudicating theoretical controversies. Such possibilities can only be eliminated through systematic empirical work.[5]

Audience characteristics may also affect the outcome of thought experiments. Haidt and associates (1993: 613) presented stories about “harmless yet offensive violations of strong social norms” to men and women of high and low socioeconomic status (SES) in Philadelphia (USA), Porto Alegre, and Recife (both in Brazil). For example:

A man goes to the supermarket once a week and buys a dead chicken. But before cooking the chicken, he has sexual intercourse with it. Then he cooks it and eats it. (Haidt et al. 1993: 617)

Lower SES subjects tended to “moralize” harmless and offensive behaviors like that in the chicken story: these subjects were more inclined than their high SES counterparts to say that the actor should be “stopped or punished,” and more inclined to deny that such behaviors would be “OK” if customary in a given country (Haidt et al. 1993: 618-19). The point is not that lower SES subjects are mistaken in their moralization of such behaviors while the urbanity of higher SES subjects represents a more rationally defensible response. The difficulty is deciding which — if any — of the conflicting responses is fit to serve as a constraint on ethical theory, when both may equally be the function of more or less arbitrary cultural factors.

In our experience, philosophical audiences typically decline to moralize the offensive behaviors, and we ourselves share their tolerant attitude. But of course these audiences — by virtue of educational attainments if not stock portfolios — are overwhelmingly high SES. Haidt's work suggests that it is a mistake for a philosopher to say, as Jackson (1998: 32n4; cf. 37) does, that “my intuitions reveal the folk conception in as much as I am reasonably entitled, as I usually am, to regard myself as typical.” The question is: typical of what demographic? Are philosophers' ethical responses determined by the philosophical substance of the examples, or by cultural idiosyncrasies that are very plausibly thought to be ethically irrelevant? Once again, until such possibilities are ruled out by systematic empirical investigation, the philosophical heft of a thought experiment is open to question.[6]

While a relatively small percentage of empirical work on “heuristics and biases” directly addresses moral reasoning, philosophers who have addressed the issue (Horowitz 1998; Doris and Stich 2005; Sinnott-Armstrong 2005; Sunstein 2005;) agree that phenomena like framing effects are likely to be pervasively implicated in responses to ethically freighted examples, and argue that this state of affairs should cause philosophers to view the thought-experimental method with considerable concern. According to Sunstein (2005: 541), philosophical analysis based on the exotic moral dilemmas typical of intuition pumps is “inadvertently and even comically replicating the early work of Kahneman and Tversky, by uncovering situations in which intuitions, normally quite sensible, turn out to misfire.”

How might this situation be rectified? One might, of course, eschew thought experiments in ethical theorizing. While this methodological austerity is not without appeal, it comes at a cost; despite the difficulties, thought experiments are a window, in some cases the only accessible window, on important regions of ethical experience. In so far as it is disconnected from the thoughts and feels of the lived ethical life, ethical theory risks being “motivationally inaccessible,” or incapable of engaging the ethical concern of agents who are supposed to live in accordance with the normative standards of the theory.[7] Fortunately, there is another possibility: initiate a research program that systematically investigates responses to intuition pumps. In effect, the idea is to subject philosophical thought experiments to the critical methods of experimental social psychology. If investigations employing different experimental scenarios and subject populations reveal a clear trend in responses, we can begin to have some confidence that we are identifying a deeply and widely shared moral conviction. Philosophical discussion may establish that convictions of this sort should serve as a constraint on moral theory, while responses to thought experiments that empirical research determines to lack such solidity, such as those susceptible to framing effects or admitting of strong cultural variation, may be ones that ethical theorists can safely disregard.

3. Moral Responsibility

A philosophically informed empirical research program akin to the one just described is more than a methodological fantasy. Led by Knobe (2003a, b, forthcoming) and associates, a number of philosophers have recently begun, in consort with their colleagues in psychology departments, to empirically investigate the “folk morality” of everyday life, especially as manifested in the attribution of moral responsibility. While this research is in its infancy, philosophically striking results have already been identified.

Moral psychology is home to one of the most venerable, and most heated, debates in philosophy, an area so contentious that even some participants have raised fears of a “dialectical stalemate” (Fischer 1994: 83-5). In one corner are incompatibilists, who insist that determinism, the view that all events are causally or nomologically determined by antecedent events, is incompatible with moral responsibility, and argue that responsibility requires that agents enjoy alternate possibilities for behavior, or are the “ultimate” source of their behavior, or both (Kane 2002: 5; Haji 2002: 202-3).[8] In the other corner are compatibilists, who argue that determinism and responsibility are compatible, often by denying that responsible agency requires that the actor have genuinely open alternatives, or rejecting ultimacy, and denying that origins of responsible action must ultimately be “internal” rather than “external” to the agent. In short, compatibilists hold that people may be legitimately be held responsible even when they “could not do otherwise” or are not the “ultimate source” of their behavior, while incompatibilists deny that this is the case.

It has seemed to many philosophers that folk morality is incompatibilist (e. g., Strawson 1986: 88; Smilansky 2003: 259; Pereboom 2001: xvi; O'Connor 2000: 4; Nagel 1986: 113, 125; Campbell 1951: 451; Pink 2004: 12). For example, Robert Kane (1999: 218; cf. 1996 83-5), a leading incompatibilist, reports that in his experience “most ordinary persons start out as natural incompatibilists,” and “have to be talked out of this natural incompatibilism by the clever arguments of philosophers.” Unsurprisingly, some working the compatibilist side of the street have been quick to assert the contrary. For example, Peter Strawson (1982) famously argued that in the context of “ordinary interpersonal relationships,” people are not haunted by the specter of determinism; indeed, they seem to have no difficulty in directing at one another the “reactive attitudes” — anger, resentment, gratitude, forgiveness, and the like — associated with responsibility assessment. Any anxiety about determinism, Strawson insisted, is due the “panicky metaphysics” of philosophers, not incompatibilist convictions on the part of ordinary people. Incompatibilists are commonly thought to have the edge here; even some philosophers with compatibilist leanings are prepared to concede the incompatibilist her point about the “typical” response tendencies (e.g., Vargas 2004, forthcoming).

Regarding the actual contours of folk morality, neither side can claim, so far as we are aware, to have offered much systematic evidence. Recently, however, some experimental evidence has been adduced. Inspired by the work of Frankfurt (1988) and others, Woolfolk, Doris, and Darley (forthcoming) hypothesized that observers may hold actors responsible even when the observers judge that the actors could not have done otherwise, if the actors appear to “identify” with their behavior. Very roughly, the idea is that the actor identifies with a behavior — and is therefore responsible for it — to the extent she “embraces” the behavior, or performs it “wholeheartedly.” [9] Woolfolk et al.'s suspicion was, in effect, that people's (possibly tacit) theory of responsibility is compatibilist.

In the Woolfolk studies, subjects read a story about two married couples vacationing together. According to the story, one of the vacationers has discovered that his wife is having an affair with his opposite number in the foursome; on the flight home, the vacationers' plane is hijacked, and armed hijackers, in order to intimidate the other passengers, force the cuckold to shoot the man who has been having an affair with his wife. In a “low identification” variation, the subjects read the following material:

Bill was horrified. At that moment Bill was certain about his feelings. He did not want to kill Frank, even though Frank was his wife's lover. But although he was appalled by the situation and beside himself with distress, he reluctantly placed the pistol at Frank's temple and proceeded to blow his friend's brains out.

Conversely, in a “high identification” variation, the angry cuckold welcomes the opportunity:

Despite the desperate circumstances, Bill understood the situation. He had been presented with the opportunity to kill his wife's lover and get away with it. And at that moment Bill was certain about his feelings. He wanted to kill Frank. Feeling no reluctance, he placed the pistol at Frank's temple and proceeded to blow his friend's brains out.

Consistent with Woolfolk and colleagues' hypothesis, subjects judged the high identification actor more responsible, more appropriately blamed, and more properly subject to guilt than the low identification actor.[10]

It is tempting to conclude that the Woolfolk group's subjects are, at a minimum, not consistently incompatibilist in their habits of responsibility attribution. But those who believe that folk morality is incompatibilist will be quick to object: the study may suggest that responsibility attributions are influenced by identification, but it says nothing about incompatibilist commitments or their lack, because subjects may have believed that the actor could have done otherwise. According to this objection, people may think that even when coerced, actors “always have a choice”; however degraded one's circumstances, one can always “just say no.”

To address this objection, Woolfolk et al. attempted to elevate perceived constraint to the “could not have done otherwise” threshold, by presenting subjects with the following material:

The leader of the kidnappers injected Bill's arm with a “compliance drug” — a designer drug similar to sodium pentathol, “truth serum.” This drug makes individuals unable to resist the demands of powerful authorities. Its effects are similar to the impact of expertly administered hypnosis; it results in total compliance. To test the effects of the drug, the leader of the kidnappers shouted at Bill to slap himself. To his amazement, Bill observed his own right hand administering an open-handed blow to his own left cheek, although he had no sense of having willed his hand to move. The leader then handed Bill a pistol with one bullet in it. Bill was ordered to shoot Frank in the head… . when Bill's hand and arm moved again, placing the pistol at his friend's temple, Bill had no feeling that he had moved his arm to point the gun; it felt as though the gun had moved itself into position. Bill thought he noticed his finger moving on the trigger, but could not feel any sensations of movement. While he was observing these events, feeling like a puppet, passively observing his body moving in space, his hand closed on the pistol, discharging it and blowing Frank's brains out.

Once again, the high identification actor was judged more responsible, more appropriately blamed, and more properly subject to guilt than a low identification actor. Moreover, Woolfolk et al. found that after reading this scenario subjects were markedly less likely to agree to statements asserting that the actor “was free to behave other than he did,” and “could have behaved differently than he did,” than they were in the first scenario. These results look to pose a clear challenge to the view that ordinary folk are typically incompatibilists.

Nahmias, Morris, Nadelhoffer and Turner (forthcoming) obtained related results with stimulus materials describing immoral behaviors performed in a “deterministic world” of the sort often found in philosophy classrooms. One variation read as follows:

Imagine that in the next century we discover all the laws of nature, and we build a supercomputer which can deduce from these laws of nature and from the current state of everything in the world exactly what will be happening in the world at any future time. It can look at everything about the way the world is and predict everything about how it will be with 100% accuracy. Suppose that such a supercomputer existed, and it looks at the state of the universe at a certain time on March 25th, 2150 A.D., twenty years before Jeremy Hall is born. The computer then deduces from this information and the laws of nature that Jeremy will definitely rob Fidelity Bank at 6:00 PM on January 26th, 2195. As always, the supercomputer's prediction is correct; Jeremy robs Fidelity Bank at 6:00 PM on January 26th, 2195.

Subjects were then asked whether Jeremy was morally blameworthy. Most said yes, indicating that they thought an agent could be morally blameworthy even if his behaviors were entirely determined by natural laws. Consistent with the Woolfolk et al. results, it appears that the subjects' judgments, at least those having to do with moral blameworthiness, were not governed by a commitment to incompatibilism.

The picture is complicated, however, when we turn to a recent study by Nichols and Knobe (in preparation). All subjects were asked to imagine two universes — a universe completely governed by deterministic laws (Universe A) and a universe including free will, where agents are the ultimate source of their actions (Universe B). Some subjects were assigned to a concrete condition, and asked to make a judgment about a specific individual in specific circumstances, while others were assigned to an abstract condition, and asked to make a more general judgment, divorced from any particular individual. The hypothesis was that these conditions would tap different responses regarding the relationship between determinism and moral responsibility. Subjects in the concrete condition read a story about a man, “Bill,” in the deterministic universe who murders his wife in a particularly ghastly manner, and were asked whether Bill was morally responsible for what he had done. By contrast, subjects in the abstract condition were simply given the sentence “People are sometimes fully morally responsible for their actions” and asked whether this sentence was true of both universes or only of one. The results were dramatic. Seventy-two percent of subjects in the concrete condition gave a compatibilist response, holding Bill responsible in Universe A, whereas less than five percent of subjects in the abstract condition gave a compatibilist response, allowing that people could be fully morally responsible in the deterministic Universe A.

Nichols and Knobe hypothesize that responses in the concrete condition were influenced by the affectively laden nature of the stimulus materials; in contrast to the affectively neutral abstract condition, the lurid description of the homicide in the abstract condition induced an emotional response that facilitated a responsibility judgment — despite the background material one might expect to caution against it. Such an interpretation, inspired by experimental work indicating that increased affective arousal amplifies the punitiveness of responses to wrongdoing (Lerner, Goldberg, and Tetlock 1998), is also available for the Woolfolk et al. study, where the graphic description of the homicide might be expected to heighten affect. It is less obvious that it is applicable to the Nahmias et al. results, where the stimulus materials seem, comparatively, affectively neutral. On the other hand, the Nahmias et al. study, in contrast to Nichols and Knobe's abstract condition, requires a concrete social judgment; perhaps subjects are more likely to make compatibilist judgments when faced with the problem of making a specific social attribution. By contrast, Nichols and Knobe's incompatibilist result was obtained by divorcing judgment from specific individuals, concrete contexts and, by implication, the affective associations that such contexts call forth. While such research is in early days, we expect that the trend of finding results that challenge the idea that folk morality is incompatibilist will persist for subjects faced with problems in social judgment, while incompatibilist responses will be more likely to surface, when they do, in contexts more abstracted from everyday social judgment.

This presents an intriguing possibility: both the compatibilist experimentalists and the incompatibilist philosophers are right. The Woolfolk et al. studies are designed to address, within the limitations of social psychological method, the sorts of responsibility attributions that inform Strawson's “ordinary interpersonal relationships”. Those asserting a natural incompatibilism, on the other hand, are typically professional teachers of philosophy, and the data they report, we imagine, is typically drawn from their experience teaching “the problem of free will and determinism” to their undergraduates. Like them, we ourselves have been struck by the comparative ease with which students can be brought to see the force of the incompatibilism. It may be that philosophers who assert that folk morality is incompatibilist are accurately reporting the responses of their client population to relatively abstract reflective exercises of the sort typically endured in lecture halls. The appearance of conflict with the experimental data arises from failing to see that the problems of the philosophy classroom may be experienced quite differently than the social judgment problems typical of empirical work on attribution.

It should be noted that social psychological work of the sort we have been describing is not without methodological difficulty. The responses of “homo psychologicus” — undergraduates speeding through questionnaires for course credit — are an imperfect window on folk morality.[11] At the same time, such methodology promises advances on informal methods, such as experimental control, systematic sampling, and statistical analysis. To be sure, social psychology vignettes of the sort we've considered typically fall comically short of literary realism; in order to effectively isolate the variables of interest and reduce the possibility of confounds investigators must eliminate the ambiguities and nuances that give life its texture. But notice that the resulting lack of naturalness is entirely typical of philosophical thought experiments, where it is argued that the stripping away of detail helps focus attention on the philosophically relevant issues identified by an “intuition pump” (see Dennett 1984: 16-17). In this regard, there is nothing uniquely problematic about the social psychology scenarios; indeed, the Woolfolk et al. vignettes are relatives of the “Frankfurt-type cases” which have spawned a massive and fecund philosophical literature (see Fischer and Ravizza 1998), and they certainly don't seem outlandish by the standards current there. The take-home message is not that the methods of social psychology are without flaws, but that they are a useful — and productive — corrective to philosophical speculation unencumbered by empirical constraints.

4. Virtue Ethics and Skepticism About Character

To date, discussion of empirical psychology in philosophical ethics has tended to focus on moral character. In contrast to Kantianism and Utilitarianism, which share an emphasis on identifying morally obligatory actions, the burgeoning tradition of contemporary virtue ethics emphasizes the psychological constitution, or character, of actors. The central question for virtue ethics, so the slogan goes, is not what sort of action to do, but what sort of person to be.[12] The importance of moral psychology to this tradition is not far to seek. On the one hand, proponents of virtue ethics often contend that ethical theories focused on character manifest greater psychological realism than do their competitors (see Anscombe 1958: 1,15; Williams 1985; Flanagan 1991: 182; Hursthouse 1999: 19-20). On the other, there are masses of empirical research in personality and social psychology that appear directly relevant to familiar philosophical notions of character; although the parallel was not much noticed until fairly recently, philosophers and psychologists had, to a considerable extent, been talking about the same things.

Initially, philosophers interested in the empirical literature advanced views that were, in varying degrees, skeptical of the conceptions of character current in virtue ethics (Doris 1998, 2002, forthcoming a, b; Harman 1999, 2000; Merritt 2000; Vranas 2005), but this skepticism subsequently drew spirited replies from defenders of virtue ethics and character psychology (e. g., Annas forthcoming; Kamtekar 2004; Miller 2003; Sabini and Silver 2005; Solomon 2003; forthcoming).[13] This debate concerns globalist moral psychologies, which are distinguished by the expectation that behavior is ordered by robust traits. The virtues are paradigmatic examples of such traits: if someone possesses the virtue of courage, for example, she is expected to consistently behave courageously across the full range of situations where it is ethically appropriate to do so, despite the presence of inducements to behave otherwise. This conception of traits seems intuitive enough, and there exists abundant evidence, both in the philosophical literature[14] and in psychological research on social perception (Jones 1990; Ross and Nisbett 1991; Gilbert and Malone 1995) that many people — at least Western people[15] — find it so.

At the same time, there exists a long experimental tradition in social psychology —often cited, for reasons that will become obvious, under the title of “situationism” — that unsettles the globalist notions of character central in much philosophical theorizing.[16] For example:

These experiments are not aberrational, but representative: social psychologists have repeatedly found that the difference between good conduct and bad appears to reside in the situation more than the person; both disappointing omissions and appalling actions are readily induced through seemingly minor situational features. What makes these findings so striking is just how insubstantial the situational influences effecting troubling moral failures seem to be; it is not that people fail to adhere to standards for good conduct, but that the can be induced to do so with such ease. (Think about it: a dime may make the difference between compassionate and callous behavior.) At the same time, research predicated on the attribution of character and personality traits has enjoyed limited success in the prediction of behavior; standard measures of personality have very often been found to be tenuously related to behavior in particular situations where the expression of a given trait is expected.[17]

The skeptical argument suggested by the empirical record may be formulated as a modus tollens :[18]

  1. If behavior is typically ordered by robust traits, systematic observation will reveal pervasive behavioral consistency.
  2. Systematic observation does not reveal pervasive behavioral consistency.
  3. Therefore, behavior is not typically ordered by robust traits.

If this argument is sound, a central thesis in characterological moral psychology — so long as it is committed to empirically assessable descriptive claims — is seriously undermined.

So far as we can tell, the observation embodied by premise (2) is not much in dispute; while there may be differences of degree, all parties agree that situational variability is a pervasive feature of human behavior. Instead, typical responses to the skeptical argument can be seen as addressing premise (1), and it is here that we will focus our discussion. Numerous defenders of virtue ethics have denied that behavioral consistency is necessary for virtue, instead emphasizing virtue's characteristic rational tendencies, particularly as manifested in practical deliberation (Kametekar 2004; Annas forthcoming; cf. Swanton 2003: 30-1).

However plausible or implausible, the focus on practical rationality is unlikely to diffuse the empirical issues, since there is more empirical work suggesting difficulty with familiar conceptions of reason than there is making trouble for familiar notions of character. Indeed, the process of reasoning has been shown to be susceptible to situational flux in much the way that overt behavior has. A wealth of empirical work indicates that people experience remarkable difficulty “transferring” cognitive skills across even closely related domains, such as from job training to actual work situations; they may perform well in one context and poorly in other (Detterman 1993; Ceci 1996). Additionally, there is much research in cognitive psychology suggesting that varying the formulations of problems may have very considerable effects on the solutions people favor. The research on “heuristics and biases” described in section two is an excellent example of this, and subsequent research by Gigerenzer and associates (1999, 2000) has shown that the manifestation of heuristics like framing effects may vary quite strikingly according to minor variations in the problems cognizers face. Another suggestive line of research indicates that the salience of values is readily malleable. Gardner, Gabriel, and Lee (1999; cf. Brewer and Gardner 1996; Gardner, Gabriel, and Hochschild 2002) found that subjects “primed” by searching for first personal plural pronouns (e. g., we, ours) in a writing sample were subsequently more likely to report that “interdependent” values (belongingness, friendship, family security) were a “guiding principle in their lives” than were subjects primed by searching for first personal singular pronouns (e. g., I, mine). Apparently, what matters to people — or seems to them to matter — can be influenced by things that don't matter very much; circumstance can have a surprising and powerful impact on the experience of value and thus on episodes of practical reasoning in which such experience plays a role.

Of course, “reason” and “action” cannot be easily disentangled; indeed, the situational variability of cognitive processes helps explain the observed behavioral variability in moral behavior. Darley and Batson (1973: 107-8) observe that some of their hurried subjects may have failed to help not because of callousness or indifference, but because haste impaired their ability to perceive the situation as an “occasion for ethical decision.” What reasons we respond to depends on how we “code” our environment, and this coding is itself highly dependent on environmental factors. Reason-responsiveness, then, is likely to be no less situationally variable than is overt behavior.

As defenders of virtue ethics have observed, the skeptical criticisms impact differently on different variations of character theory: there are many views that might be articulated under the title of “virtue ethics” and their proponents may disagree as to the most important commitments of a virtue ethics (Nussbaum 1999, Swanton 2003). For example, some defenders of virtue ethics have denied that virtue ethics makes empirical claims of sufficient strength to be troubled by the evidence. A typical version of this response insists that virtue is not widely instantiated, but is expected to be found in only a few extraordinary individuals. This minimal empirical commitment, so the story goes, is quite compatible with the disturbing, but not exceptionlessly disturbing, behavior in experiments like Milgram's (see Athanassoulis 1999: 217-219; Depaul 1999; Kupperman 2001: 242-3). Of course, the empirical evidence cannot show that the instantiation of virtue in actual human psychologies is impossible; no amount of empirical evidence could completely rule out this possibility. But so construed, the aspirations of virtue ethics are not entirely clear; for example, if virtue is expected to be rare, it is not obvious what role virtue theory could have in a (generally applicable) program of moral education.[19] This sounds a little unsettling, given that moral education — construed as aiming for the development of the good character necessary for a good life — has traditionally been a distinctive emphasis in writing on virtue, from Aristotle (1984: 1099b9-32, 1103b3-26) to Bennett (1993: 11-16; cf. Williams 1985: 10). The resolution of such arguments will not detain us here, for while “empirically modest” virtue ethics may offer valuable contributions to ethical theory,[20] it is of limited relevance to our present topic of moral psychology, since it does not aspire to a generally applicable, empirically adequate account of actual moral functioning.

Responding to the empirical challenge will likely require certain tradeoffs. Just as the “rarity response” appears to make concessions regarding the ambitions of its moral psychology, a more empirically ambitious moral psychology may require concessions regarding the normative elements of the virtue ethics tradition. For example, on Meritt's (2000) “Humean” virtue ethics, behavioral reliability is supported “contingently by climates of social expectation” as opposed to an Aristotelian conception where behavioral reliability is secured by robust traits. This approach offers a plausible explanation of the behavioral consistency we undeniably do observe, by appealing to the social structures and relationships that reward conformity and punish non-conformity with shared ethical standards. If these standards mandate behavior consistent with the requirements of virtue, we can expect a fair measure of behavior in conformity with those requirements.

But as Meritt (2000: 380) is quick to see, this socially sustained account of character seems to run afoul of familiar convictions about virtue: “[I]sn't it essential to our normative conception of the virtues that they are resistant to contrary social pressures?” she asks, “[I]sn't it paradigmatic of possessing the virtues that one stands firm in the midst of a contrary climate of social expectation?” Her answer is yes; despite the costs in declining to offer a theory of virtue that conforms to familiar normative conceptions, we “must come to grips with psychological reality in understanding what kinds of things can possibly bring about stability in the possession of virtuous qualities …” (Meritt 2000: 381). Thus, Meritt disavows a commitment to globalism in order to develop a moral psychology that is widely applicable and empirically adequate. As Meritt recognizes, this conception of character is not maximally inspiring; it is not the stuff that enabled Socrates to thumb his noise at the Athenian Kangaroo court.

Meritt's Humean account of “socially sustained” virtue is a striking departure from the notion of robust traits that has figured prominently in the virtue ethics tradition, so a theory that eschews it represents something of a departure from that center. Of course, this departure may be thought a considerable advantage, in so far as it allows virtue ethics to evade the skeptical arguments. At the same time, one may wonder if this expedient secures empirical adequacy at the expense of normative appeal. The appeal of character ethics, one might have thought, substantially lies in the promise of a self-cultivation that makes great differences in our ethical behavior, through fair times and foul. The virtuous person — actual or fictional — is admirable because she sticks to her guns while the shells are falling; she is so admirable precisely because her admirable traits are also robust traits. Again, this does not mean that an ethical theory, such as Merritt's, is not a workable theory; as Meritt argues, this may be the ethical theory that is appropriate to its (all too) human subjects. But we must be clear, as Merritt is, on the costs: to eschew traits is not only a departure from central strains of the virtue ethics tradition, it is a departure from an attractive strain of that tradition. Our purpose here is not to argue over who counts as a “real” virtue ethicist; such endeavors promise rather meager returns. Rather, we want to urge, as philosophers encounter the empirical evidence on character, that they make explicit how their approaches may accommodate the evidence, and what the costs and benefits of the accommodations are. It is only then that the impact of the evidence, and the philosophical prescriptions indicated by it, can be fairly assessed.

5. Egoism vs. Altruism

5.1 Some Philosophical Background

People often behave in ways that benefit others, and they sometimes do this knowing that it will be costly, unpleasant or dangerous. But at least since Plato's classic discussion in the second Book of the Republic, debate has raged over why people behave in this way. Are their motives really altruistic, or is their behavior ultimately motivated by self-interest? Famously, Hobbes gave this answer:

No man giveth but with intention of good to himself, because gift is voluntary; and of all voluntary acts, the object is to every man his own good; of which, if men see they shall be frustrated, there will be no beginning of benevolence or trust, nor consequently of mutual help. (1651/1981, Ch. 15)

Views like Hobbes' have come to be called egoism,[21] and this rather depressing conception of human motivation has been favored by any number of eminent philosophical advocates, including Bentham, J.S. Mill and Nietzsche.[22] Egoism is also arguably the dominant view about human motivation in much of contemporary social science (see Grant 1997). Dissenting voices, though perhaps fewer in number, have been no less eminent. Butler, Hume, Rousseau and Adam Smith have all argued that, sometimes at least, human motivation is genuinely altruistic.

Though the issue that divides egoistic and altruistic accounts of human motivation is largely empirical, it is easy to see why philosophers have thought that the competing answers will have important consequences for moral theory. For example, Kant famously argued that a person should act “not from inclination but from duty, and by this would his conduct first acquire true moral worth” (1785/1949, Sec. 1, parag. 12). But egoism maintains that all human motivation is ultimately self-interested, and thus people can't act “from duty” in the way that Kant urged. Thus if egoism is true, Kant's account would entail that no conduct has “true moral worth.”[23]

Additionally, if egoism is true, it would appear to impose a strong constraint on how a moral theory can answer the venerable question “Why should I be moral?” since, as Hobbes clearly saw, the answer will have to ground the motivation to be moral in the agent's self-interest. It is easy to find philosophers suggesting that altruism is required for morality or that egoism is incompatible with morality — and easier still to find philosophers who claim that other philosophers think this. Here are a few examples culled from a standard reference work that happened to be close at hand.

“Moral behavior is, at the most general level, altruistic behavior, motivated by the desire to promote not only our own welfare but the welfare of others.” (Rachels 2000: 81)
“[O]ne central assumption motivating ethical theory in the Analytic tradition is that the function of ethics is to combat the inherent egoism or selfishness of individuals. Indeed, many thinkers define the basic goal of morality as ‘selflessness’ or ‘altruism’.” (Schroeder 2000: 396)
“Philosophers since Socrates worried that humans might be capable of acting only to promote their own self-interest. But if that is all we can do, then it seems morality is impossible.” (LaFollette 2000: 5)

While the egoism/altruism debate has historically been of great philosophical interest, the issue centrally concerns psychological questions about the nature of human motivation, so it's no surprise that psychologists have done a great deal of empirical research aimed at determining which view is correct.

Before considering the empirical literature, we must be clear on what the debate is about. As we've already intimated, while advocates of altruism and of egoism agree that people often help others, they disagree about why they do this. Defenders of altruism insist that, sometimes at least, people are motivated by an ultimate desire for the well-being of another person, while defenders of egoism maintain that all ultimate desires are self-interested. This formulation invites questions about (1) what it is for a behavior to be motivated by an ultimate desire, and (2) the distinction between desires that are self-interested and desires that are for the well-being of others.

Although the second question will need to be considered in any comprehensive treatment, some rough and ready examples of the distinction will suffice here.[24] Desires to save someone else's life, to alleviate someone else's suffering, or to make someone else happy are paradigm cases of desires for the well-being of others, while desires to experience pleasure, get rich, and become famous are typical examples of self-interested desires. The self-interested desires to experience pleasure and to avoid pain have played an especially prominent role in the debate, since one version of egoism, often called hedonism, maintains that these are our only ultimate desires.

The first question, regarding ultimate desires, is the crucial one for our present purposes, and requires a fuller exposition; it can be usefully explicated with the help of a familiar account of practical reasoning.[25] On this account, practical reasoning is a causal process via which a desire and a belief give rise to or sustain another desire. This second desire can then join forces with another belief to generate a third desire, and so on. Sometimes this process will lead to a desire to perform a relatively simple or “basic” action, and that desire, in turn, will cause the agent to perform the basic action without the intervention of any further desires. Desires produced or sustained by this process of practical reasoning are instrumental desires — the agent has them because she thinks that satisfying them will lead to something else that she desires. But not all desires can be instrumental desires. If we are to avoid circularity or an infinite regress there must be some desires that are not produced because the agent thinks that satisfying them will facilitate satisfying some other desire. These desires that are not produced or sustained by practical reasoning are the agent's ultimate desires, and the objects of ultimate desires are desired for their own sake. A behavior is motivated by a specific ultimate desire when that desire is part of the practical reasoning process that leads to the behavior.

5.2 Altruism and Evolution

Readers familiar with some of the popular literature on the evolution of morality that has appeared in the last few decades might suspect that recent work in evolutionary biology has resolved the debate between egoists and altruists. For some readers — and some writers — seem to interpret evolutionary theory as showing that altruism is biologically impossible. If altruistic organisms were somehow to emerge, this literature sometimes suggests, they would lose the competition for survival and reproduction to their selfish conspecifics, and they would quickly become extinct. On this view, the appearance of altruism is simply an illusion. In the memorable words of biologist Michael Ghiselin (1974: 247) “Scratch an ‘altruist’ and watch a ‘hypocrite’ bleed.” But as Sober and Wilson (1998) have argued with great clarity, there is no simple connection between evolutionary theory and the philosophical debate between egoism and altruism.

This is because the concept of altruism that is important in evolutionary theory is quite different from the concept of altruism invoked in the philosophical debate. For biologists, an organism behaves altruistically if and only if the behavior in question reduces its own fitness while increasing the fitness of one or more other organisms. Roughly speaking, an organism's fitness is a measure of how many descendants it will have.[26] As Sober and Wilson note, on this evolutionary account of altruism, an organism can be altruistic even if it does not have a mind capable of having beliefs and desires. Thus there can be no easy inference from biological altruism to psychological altruism. Nor does the inference go in the opposite direction. To make the point, Sober and Wilson (Ch. 10) note that natural selection might well equip humans or other sophisticated organisms with ultimate desires to foster the welfare of their offspring under certain circumstances. Organisms with these ultimate desires would be psychological altruists, though the behavior that the desires gave rise to would typically not be evolutionarily altruistic, since by helping their offspring organisms typically are increasing their own fitness.

Though this argument shows that evolutionary theorists have no reason to deny that organisms can be psychological altruists, some authors have suggested that evolutionary theory only permits psychological altruism in very limited domains. The reasoning goes as follows. There are only two ways that a disposition to engage in behavior that helps other organisms but lowers one's own chance of survival and reproduction can evolve. One of these is the case in which the recipients of help are one's own offspring, or other close kin. Kin selection theory, pioneered by W.D. Hamilton (1963, 1964a, 1964b) makes it clear that, under appropriate circumstances, genes leading to costly helping behavior will tend to spread throughout a population, provided that the recipients of the help are relatives, since this sort of helping behavior increases the number of copies of those genes that will be found in future generations. The other way in which a disposition to help can evolve requires that episodes of helping behavior are part of a longer term reciprocal strategy in which the organism that is the beneficiary of helping behavior is disposed to help its benefactor on some subsequent occasion. Building on ideas first set out in Trivers' (1971) classic paper on “reciprocal altruism,” Axelrod and Hamilton (1981) described a simple “tit-for-tat” strategy, in which an organism helps on the first appropriate opportunity and then helps on subsequent opportunities if and only if the partner helped on the previous appropriate opportunity. They showed that tit-for-tat would be favored by natural selection over many other strategies, including a purely selfish strategy of never offering help but always accepting it. Since psychological altruism will lead to helping behavior, it is argued, psychological altruism can evolve only when a disposition to helping behavior can. So it is biologically possible for organisms to have ultimate desires to help their kin, and to help non-kin with whom they engage in ongoing reciprocal altruism. But apart from these special cases, psychological altruism can't evolve.

Versions of this influential line of thought can be found in many places (Nesse 1990; Wright 1994: Chs. 8 & 9; Rachels 1990: Ch. 4). However, we think there is good reason to be very skeptical about the crucial premise, which maintains that dispositions to helping behavior can only evolve via kin selection or reciprocal altruism. It has long been recognized that various sorts of group selection, in which one group of individuals leaves more descendants than another group, can lead to the evolution of helping behavior. Until recently though, the reigning orthodoxy in evolutionary biology has been that the conditions under which group selection can act are so unlikely to occur in natural breeding populations that it is unlikely to have played a substantial role in human evolution. This view has been boldly challenged by Sober and Wilson (1998), and while their views are very controversial, we think that the extent to which group selection played a role in human evolution is very much an open question. Much less controversially, Boyd and Richerson (1992) have developed models demonstrating that helping behavior (and, indeed, just about any sort of behavior) can evolve if informal punishment is meted out to individuals who do not help in circumstances when they are expected to. More recently, Sripada (forthcoming) has argued that ultimate desires for the well-being of others could evolve via a rather different route. There are many situations in which people are better off if they act in a coordinated way, but where no specific way of acting is best. In these situations several different “coordination equilibria” may be equally adaptive. To deal with this problem, Sripada argues, natural selection may well have led to the evolution of a psychological mechanism that generates ultimate desires to adhere to locally prevailing customs or practices. And since some of those locally prevailing customs may require helping others, some of the ultimate desires produced by that psychological mechanism might well be psychologically altruistic. If Boyd and Richerson and Sripada are right, and we believe they are, then evolutionary theory gives us no reason to suppose that psychological altruism must be restricted to kin and individuals involved in reciprocal exchanges. So, contrary to the presumption that evolutionary biology has resolved the debate between egoists and altruists in favor of egoism, it appears that evolutionary theory has nothing to offer that will enable us to make progress in that debate.[27] Since that debate turns on the nature of human motivation, perhaps experimental psychology can move the debate forward.

5.3 Psychology

The psychological literature relevant to the egoism vs. altruism debate is vast;[28] in the interests of a tolerable brevity, we will focus on the work of Daniel Batson and associates, who have done some of the most influential and philosophically sophisticated work in this area. Batson, along with many other researchers, begins by borrowing an idea that has deep roots in philosophical discussions of altruism. Though the details and the terminology differ significantly from author to author, the core idea is that altruism is often the product of an emotional response to the distress of another person. Aquinas (1270/1917, II-II, 30, 3), for example, maintains that “mercy is the heartfelt sympathy for another's distress, impelling us to succour him if we can”. And Adam Smith (1759/1853, I, I, 1. 1) tells us that “pity or compassion [is] the emotion we feel for the misery of others, when we either see it, or are made to conceive it in a very lively manner” and these emotions “interest [man] in the fortunes of others, and render their happiness necessary to him, though he derives nothing from it except the pleasure of seeing it.” Batson (1991: 58) labels this response “empathy” which he characterizes as “an other-oriented emotional reaction to seeing someone suffer,” and terms the traditional idea that empathy leads to altruism the “empathy-altruism hypothesis.” On Batson's account (1991: 86), empathy “includes feeling sympathetic, compassionate, warm, softhearted, tender, and the like, and according the empathy-altruism hypothesis, it evokes altruistic motivation”. Batson (1991: 117) contrasts empathy to a cluster of affective responses he calls “personal distress” which is “made up of more self-oriented feelings such as upset, alarm, anxiety, and distress.”

If the philosophical tradition that suggests the empathy-altruism hypothesis is on the right track, and Batson believes it is, we would predict that when people feel empathy they will desire to help those who evoke the emotion, and thus they will be more inclined to engage in helping behavior than people who do not feel empathy. This does not mean that people will always engage in helping behavior when they feel empathy, since people typically have various and conflicting desires, and not all conflicts are resolved in favor of empathy's urgings. Nor does it mean that when people feel little or no empathy they will not engage in helping behavior, since the desire to help can also be produced by a variety of processes in which empathy plays no role. But we should expect that typically people feeling empathy will be more likely to help than people who aren't feeling empathy, and the stronger the empathy the more likely it is that they will engage in helping behavior.

In order to put this claim to empirical test, it is important to have ways of inducing empathy in the laboratory, and there is a substantial body of literature suggesting how this can be done. For example, Stotland (1969) showed that subjects who were instructed to imagine how a specified person (often called “the target”) felt when undergoing what subjects believed to be a painful medical procedure reported stronger feelings of empathy and showed greater physiological arousal than subjects who were instructed to watch the target person's movements. Relatedly, Krebs (1975) demonstrated that subjects who observe someone similar to themselves undergo painful experiences show more physiological arousal, report identifying with the target more strongly, and report feeling worse while waiting for the painful stimulus to begin than do subjects who observe the same painful experiences administered to someone who is not similar to themselves. Krebs also showed that subjects are more willing to help at some personal cost when the sufferer is similar to themselves. Batson (1991: 82-87) interprets these findings as indicating that people are more inclined to feel empathy for those they believe to be similar to themselves, and thus that empathy can often be evoked by providing a person with evidence that she and a target person are similar.

To make the case that empathy leads to helping behavior, Batson relies in part on work by others, including the Krebs (1975) study just cited and a study by Dovidio et al. (1990) in which Stotland's technique for manipulating empathy by instructing subjects to take the perspective of the person in distress was used to induce empathy for a young woman, with subjects focusing on one of two quite different problems that the young woman faced. When given an opportunity to help the young woman, subjects in whom empathy had been evoked were more likely to help than subjects in a low empathy condition, and the increase in helping was specific to the problem that had evoked the empathy. Many of Batson's own experiments, some of which we'll describe below, also support the contention that both spontaneously evoked empathy and empathy engendering experimental manipulations increase the likelihood of helping behavior. Another important source of support for the link between empathy and helping behavior is a meta-analysis of a large body of experimental literature by Eisenberg and Miller (1987) which found positive correlations between empathy and prosocial behavior in studies using a variety of techniques to assess empathy. On the basis of these and other findings, Batson (1991: 95) argues that “there is indeed an empathy-helping relationship; feeling empathy for a person in need increases the likelihood of helping to relieve that need.”

It might be thought that establishing a causal link between empathy and helping behavior would be bad news for egoism. But, as Batson makes clear, the fact that empathy leads to helping behavior does not resolve the dispute between egoism and altruism, since it does not address the nature of the motivation for the helping behavior that empathy evokes. One possibility is that empathy does indeed cause a genuinely altruistic desire to help — an ultimate desire for the well being of the sufferer. But there are also a variety of egoistic routes by which empathy might lead to helping behavior. Perhaps the most obvious of these is that empathy might simply be (or cause) an unpleasant experience, and that people are motivated to help because they believe this is the best way to stop the unpleasant experience that is caused by someone else's distress. Quite a different family of egoistic possibilities focus on the rewards to be expected for helping and/or the punishments to be expected for withholding assistance. If people believe that others will reward or sanction them for helping or failing to help in certain circumstances, and if the feeling of empathy marks those cases in which social sanctions or rewards are most likely, then we would expect people to be more helpful when they feel empathy, even if their ultimate motivation is purely egoistic. A variation on this theme focuses on rewards or punishments that are self-administered. If people believe that helping may make them feel good, or that failing to help may make them feel bad, and that these feelings will be most likely to occur in cases where they feel empathy, then once again we would expect people who empathize to be more helpful, though their motives may be not at all altruistic.

For more than twenty-five years, Batson and his collaborators have systematically explored these options. Their strategy is to design experiments in which the altruistic explanation of the link between empathy and helping can be compared to one or another specific egoistic explanation. Reviewing all of these experiments would require far more space than we have.[29] Instead we'll focus on two clusters of experiments that illustrate the potential philosophical rewards of designing and interpreting experiments in this area, as well as some of the difficulties of the project.

5.4 The Social Punishment Hypothesis

One of the more popular egoist alternatives to the empathy-altruism hypothesis is the idea that people engage in helping behavior because they fear that other people will punish them if they do not. If I don't help, the agent is supposed to worry, people will be angry or they will think badly of me, and this may have negative effects on how they treat me in the future. As it stands, this egoist hypothesis can't explain the fact that empathy increases the likelihood of helping, but a more sophisticated version is easy to construct by adding the assumption that people think social sanctions for not helping are more likely when the target engenders empathy.

To test this hypothesis — which Batson calls the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis — against the empathy-altruism hypothesis, Batson and his associates (Fultz et al. 1986) designed an experiment in which they manipulated both the level of empathy that subjects felt for the target and the likelihood that anyone would know whether or not the subject had opted to help a person in need. Others can form a negative evaluation of your decision not to help only if they know the choice you are facing and the decision you have made; if your decision is secret, you need have no fear of social sanctions. Thus the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis predicts that subjects who exhibit high empathy on a given occasion will be more likely to help when they believe others will know if they fail to do so. On the empathy-altruism hypothesis, by contrast, high empathy subjects are motivated by an ultimate desire to help, and thus their helping levels should be high whether or not others would know if they decided not to help. In the low empathy condition, both hypotheses predict that levels of helping will be low. These predictions are summarized in Tables 1 and 2.

Table 1: Predictions About the Amount of Helping On the
Socially Administered Empathy-Specific Punishment Hypothesis

Potential for Negative
Social Evaluation
Low High
High Low High
Low Low Low

Table 2: Predictions About the Amount of Helping
On the Empathy-Altruism Hypothesis

Potential for Negative
Social Evaluation
Low High
High Low High
Low Low High

Subjects in the experiment were told that they were participating in an impression formation study, and that they had been randomly assigned to the role of “listener” in which they would read confidential notes from another student participant, the “communicator.” They were given two notes from Janet Arnold, an out-of-state freshman who reveals that she is very lonely and hoping to find a friend. After completing a form on which subjects indicated their impressions of Janet and their emotional responses to her note, they were presented with an unexpected opportunity to befriend Janet by volunteering to take part in a study of long-term relationships involving an initial meeting with Janet and periodic phone interviews about the development of their friendship. Participants who were willing to help were asked how much time they were willing to spend with Janet during the next month.

To manipulate empathy, Batson and his associates used the Stotland technique. Subjects assigned to the low-empathy condition were instructed to “Read the information in the communicator's notes carefully, trying to be as objective as possible. Try to focus on the techniques used to get the communicator's message across.” Subjects assigned to the high-empathy condition were instructed to “Read the information in the communicator's notes carefully, trying to take the perspective of the individual writing the notes. Try to imagine how this individual feels about what he or she writes” (1991: 132).

Four steps were taken to manipulate the perceived potential for negative social evaluation. In the low-potential condition (1991: 132):

  1. Subjects were told that they would be the only person ever to read the communicator's notes, and the notes were delivered in a sealed envelope.
  2. Subjects were assured that the questionnaires reporting their reactions to Janet's note would be anonymous.
  3. Subjects' responses to the invitation to participate in the long-term relationship study were returned to the professor in a sealed envelope, so no one would know if they did not want to help Janet. (Since they believed the professor had not read Janet's note, they could be expected to surmise that he would not know that Janet needed a friend.)
  4. In the letter inviting them to participate in the relationship study, subjects were told that Janet would be contacted “only if you want a meeting; if you do not, then we will not contact the communicator and he or she will not know that you were ever asked about actually meeting.”

In the high-potential condition (1991: 133):

  1. Subjects were told that the experimenter would read the communicator's notes. Also, the experimenter would collect the questionnaire when the subject completed it and would compare the content of the notes with the impressions the subject formed.
  2. No envelope was provided for their response to the invitation to participate in the long-term relationship study, so subjects could infer that the experimenter would know about Janet's need for a friend, about their emotional reaction to Janet, and would also know whether or not they had agreed to help Janet.
  3. Subjects were told that Janet would know if they decided not to help.

As Batson notes, procedures in the high-potential condition “were designed to highlight the possibility of negative social evaluation if the participant decided not to volunteer to spend time with Janet.”

Table 3: Amount of Help Offered Janet
(Fultz et al. 1986, Study 2)

Potential for Negative
Social Evaluation
Low High
High 0.67 1.71
Low 1.29 2.44

The results, given in Table 3, indicate that the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis did not fare well. On the basis of this experiment and a similar experiment in which empathy for Janet was not manipulated but was measured by self-report, Batson concludes that the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis is not consistent with the experimental facts.

Contrary to what the social-evaluation version of the empathy-specific punishment hypothesis predicted, eliminating anticipated negative social evaluation in these two studies did not eliminate the empathy-helping relationship. Rather than high empathy leading to more help only under high social evaluation, it led to more helping under both low and high social evaluation. This pattern of results is not consistent with what would be expected if empathically aroused individuals are egoistically motivated to avoid looking bad in the eyes of others; it is quite consistent with what would be expected if empathy evokes altruistic motivation to reduce the victim's need (Batson 1991: 134).

Though two experiments hardly make a conclusive case, we are inclined to agree with Batson that these studies make the socially administered empathy-specific punishment hypothesis look significantly less plausible than the empathy-altruism hypothesis. So one popular egoist hypothesis has been dealt a serious blow: high empathy subjects were more likely to help whether or not they could expect their behavior to be socially scrutinized. At least in some circumstances, empathy appears to facilitate helping independently of the threat of social sanction.

5.5 The Aversive-Arousal Reduction Hypothesis

Another popular egoistic strategy for explaining the link between empathy and helping behavior is the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, which maintains that the empathy evoked by witnessing someone in need is an unpleasant or aversive experience, and that helping is motivated by the desire to diminish that aversive experience. If this is right, Batson maintains, people in a high empathy condition will sometimes have two quite different ways of reducing the aversive experience — they can help the person in need or they can simply leave. Which strategy a person adopts will depend, in part, on how difficult or costly it is to depart the scene. If escape is easy, people will be more likely to take that option, while if leaving is more difficult people will be more likely to help, since that is a less costly way of ending the aversive experience. If, on the other hand, the empathy-altruism hypothesis is correct and empathy leads to genuinely altruistic motivation, we would expect people in a high empathy condition to help whether escape is easy or hard, since only helping will satisfy an altruistic desire. Altruism and egoism both allow that even in the absence of empathy, an emotionally disturbing need situation will produce feelings of personal distress, thus they would both predict that people in a low empathy condition will be more inclined to help when escape is difficult, and less inclined when escape is easy. Batson summarizes these predictions in Tables 4 and 5 (Batson 1991: 111).

Table 4: Predictions from the Aversive-Arousal Reduction
Hypothesis for the Rate of Helping in an Escape X Empathy Design

Escape Empathy
Low High
Easy Low Low
Difficult High High/Very High

Table 5: Predictions from the Empathy-Altruism Hypothesis
for the Rate of Helping in an Escape X Empathy Design

Escape Empathy
Low High
Easy Low High
Difficult High High

To test these predictions, Batson and his associates conducted a total of six experiments. In one of these (experiment 1 in Batson et al. 1981), student subjects were required to watch, via what they believed to be closed circuit TV transmission — actually a scripted video recording — as another student subject, Elaine — actually a confederate —attempted to perform a task while receiving electric shocks at random intervals. Observer subjects were told that their task would be to form and report an impression of how Elaine performs under aversive conditions. On the tape, Elaine is clearly finding the shocks very uncomfortable, and after her second trail at doing the task, she explains to Martha, the assistant administering the shocks, that she is unusually sensitive to mild electric shocks because of a childhood trauma. Martha then suggests that perhaps the observer subject might be willing to help Elaine by taking her place, and the experimenter asks whether the subject is willing to do that. To manipulate ease of escape, some subjects were told that if they decide not to take Elaine's place, they will be required to watch eight additional trials, while other subjects were told that if they decide not to take Elaine's place they are free to go. To manipulate the level of empathy that subjects feel for Elaine, subjects were given a copy of a personal values and interests questionnaire, allegedly filled out by Elaine, in order to help them form an impression of her performance. In the high empathy condition, Elaine's values and interests were very similar to the subject's (which had been determined in a screening session several weeks before), while in the low empathy condition, they were very different. The results, given in Table 6, clearly exhibit the pattern predicted by the empathy-altruism hypothesis, not the pattern predicted by the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis.

Table 6: Proportion of Subjects Agreeing to Take Shocks
for Elaine (Batson, et al., 1981, Experiment 1)

Escape Empathy
Low High
Easy 0.18 0.91
Difficult 0.64 0.82

In additional experiments, Batson and his associates used four different techniques to create the low- and high-empathy conditions, two techniques for manipulating ease of escape, and two different need situations (Batson et al. 1981; Toi & Batson 1982; Batson et al. 1983). The results in all of these experiments exhibited the same pattern. Intriguingly, in another experiment, Batson and colleagues attempted to break the pattern by telling the subjects that the shock level they would have to endure was the highest of four options, “clearly painful but not harmful.” They reasoned that, under these circumstances, even if high empathy subjects had an ultimate desire to help, this desire might well be overridden by the desire to avoid a series of very painful shocks. As expected, the pattern of results in this experiment fit the pattern in Table 4.

These are impressive findings. Over and over again, in well designed and carefully conducted experiments, Batson and his associates have produced results which are clearly compatible with the predictions of the empathy-altruism hypothesis, as set out in Table 5, and clearly incompatible with what Batson maintains are the predictions of the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, as set out in Table 4. Even the “clearly painful shock” experiment, which produced results in the pattern of Table 4, are comfortable compatible with the empathy-altruism hypothesis since, as we noted earlier, the empathy-altruism hypothesis allows that high empathy subjects may have desires that are stronger than their ultimate desire to help the target, and the desire to avoid a painful electric shock is a very plausible candidate. In light of these results, it is very tempting to suppose that this series of experiments represents a major advance in the egoism vs. altruism debate. No thoughtful observer would conclude that these experiments show that altruism is true, since, as Batson (1991, 127) himself emphasizes, there are many other egoistic alternatives to the empathy-altruism hypothesis. But many might be inclined to agree with Batson that taken together these experiments show that the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis “is almost certainly wrong.”

It would be gratifying to conclude that yet another venerable egoistic alternative to altruism is no longer a serious option. Unfortunately, we are not convinced, since we think defenders of the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis can accommodate all of Batson's findings. In arguing that Table 4 reflects the predictions made by the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, Batson must assume that escape will alleviate the aversive affect in both low & high empathy situations, and that subjects believe this (although the belief may not be readily available to introspection). Call this the out of sight, out of mind assumption.[30] Elaborating on an idea suggested by Shaun Nichols (2004a: 55), it might be proposed that although subjects do believe this when they have little empathy for the target, they do not believe it when they have high empathy for the target. Perhaps high empathy subjects believe that if they escape they will continue to be troubled by the thought or memory of the distressed target. Indeed, in cases where empathy is strong and is evoked by attachment, this is just what common sense would lead us to expect. Do you really believe that if your mother was in grave distress and you left without helping her you would not continue to be troubled by the knowledge that she was still in distress? We're guessing that you don't. But if people do not make the out of sight, out of mind assumption when they have high empathy for the target, then the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis predicts that high empathy subjects will be inclined to help in both easy and difficult escape conditions, since helping is the only effective strategy for reducing the aversive arousal. So in the upper right quadrant of Table 4, “Low” should be replaced by “High”. And when this is done, neither the findings reported in Table 6 nor the results of any of Batson's other experiments give us any reason to prefer the empathy-altruism hypothesis over the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis, since both hypotheses make the same predictions. It is, of course, an empirical question whether high empathy subjects make the out of sight, out of mind assumption, either consciously or unconsciously, and Batson might protect his argument from our critique by showing that high empathy subjects do make the assumption in experimental situations like those he has used. But until that is done, we think that the jury is still out on the aversive-arousal reduction hypothesis. The results that Batson reports do not show that it “is almost certainly wrong.”

In some summaries of his work, Batson maintains that his research program has resolved the age-old debate between egoists and altruists:

In study after study, with no clear exceptions, we find results conforming to the pattern predicted by the empathy-altruism hypothesis, the hypothesis that empathic emotion evokes altruistic motivation. At present, there is no egoistic explanation for the results of these studies…. Pending new evidence or a plausible new egoistic explanation for the existing evidence, the empathy-altruism hypothesis, however improbable, seems to be true. (Batson 1991: 174)

We cannot endorse this assessment. In our view, Batson and his collaborators have made important strides in moving the debate forward. They have formulated a sophisticated altruist hypothesis that can be tested against competing egoist hypotheses, and they have designed experiments which strongly suggest that some of those egoist hypothesis are false. But their work also illustrates how difficult it is to gather persuasive evidence against other plausible renderings of egoism. While some versions of egoism are on the ropes, the debate between egoism and altruism is still very much alive.

6. Moral Disagreement

Given that moral disagreement — about abortion, say, or capital punishment — so often seems intractable, is there any reason to think that moral problems admit objective resolutions? While this difficulty is long familiar, contemporary philosophical discussion was spurred by Mackie's (1977: 36-8) “argument from relativity” or, as it is called by later writers, the “argument from disagreement” (Brink 1989: 197; Loeb 1998). Such “radical” differences in moral judgment as are frequently observed, Mackie (1977: 36) argued, “make it difficult to treat those judgments as apprehensions of objective truths.”

Mackie supposed that his argument undermines moral realism, the view that, as Smith (1994: 9, cf. 13) puts it, “moral questions have correct answers, that the correct answers are made correct by objective moral facts … and … by engaging in moral argument, we can discover what these objective moral facts are.”[31] This notion of objectivity, as Smith recognizes, requires convergence in moral views — the right sort of argument, reflection and discussion is expected to result in very substantial moral agreement (Smith 1994: 6).[32]

While moral realists have often taken pretty optimistic positions on the extent of actual moral agreement (e. g., Sturgeon 1988: 229; Smith 1994: 188), there is no denying that there is an abundance of persistent moral disagreement; on many moral issues there is a striking failure of convergence even after protracted argument. Anti-realists like Mackie have a ready explanation for this phenomenon: Moral judgment is not objective in Smith's sense, and moral argument cannot be expected to accomplish what Smith and other realists think it can.[33] Conversely, the realist's task is to explain away failures of convergence; she must provide an explanation of the phenomena consistent with it being the case that moral judgment is objective and moral argument is rationally resolvable. A familiar realist strategy is to insist that the preponderance of actual moral disagreement is due to limitations of disputants or their circumstances, and insist that (very substantial, if not unanimous)[34] moral agreement would emerge in ideal conditions, when, for example, disputants are fully rational and fully informed of the relevant non-moral facts.

It is immediately evident that the relative merits of these competing explanations cannot be fairly determined without close discussion of the factors implicated in actual moral disagreements. Indeed, as acute commentators with both realist (Sturgeon 1988: 230) and anti-realist (Loeb 1998: 284) sympathies have noted, the argument from disagreement cannot be evaluated by a priori philosophical means alone; what's needed, as Loeb observes, is “a great deal of further empirical research into the circumstances and beliefs of various cultures.” This research is required not only to accurately assess the extent of actual disagreement, but also to determine why disagreement persists or dissolves. Only then can realists' attempts to “explain away” moral disagreement be fairly assessed.

Richard Brandt, who was a pioneer in the effort to integrate ethical theory and the social sciences, looked primarily to anthropology to help determine whether moral attitudes can be expected to converge under idealized circumstances. It is of course well known that anthropology includes a substantial body of work, such as the classic studies of Westermarck (1906) and Sumner (1934), detailing the radically divergent moral outlooks found in cultures around the world. But as Brandt (1959: 283-4) recognized, typical ethnographies do not support confident inferences about the convergence of attitudes under ideal conditions, in large measure because they often give limited guidance regarding how much of the moral disagreement can be traced to disagreement about factual matters that are not moral in nature, such as those having to do with religious or cosmological views.

With this sort of difficulty in mind, Brandt (1954) undertook his own anthropological study of Hopi peoples in the American southwest, and found issues for which there appeared to be serious moral disagreement between typical Hopi and white American attitudes that could not plausibly be attributed to differences in belief about nonmoral facts. [35] A notable example is the Hopi attitude toward animal suffering, an attitude that might be expected to disturb many non-Hopis:

[Hopi children] sometimes catch birds and make “pets” of them. They may be tied to a string, to be taken out and “played” with. This play is rough, and birds seldom survive long. [According to one informant:] “Sometimes they get tired and die. Nobody objects to this.” (Brandt 1954: 213)

Brandt (1959: 103) made a concerted effort to determine whether this difference in moral outlook could be traced to disagreement about nonmoral facts, but he could find no plausible explanation of this kind; his Hopi informants didn't believe that animals lack the capacity to feel pain, for example, nor did they have cosmological beliefs that would explain away the apparent cruelty of the practice, such as beliefs to the effect that animals are rewarded for martyrdom in the afterlife. The best explanation of the divergent moral judgments, Brandt (1954: 245, 284) concluded, is a “basic difference of attitude,” since “groups do sometimes make divergent appraisals when they have identical beliefs about the objects.”

Moody-Adams argues that little of philosophical import can be concluded from Brandt's — and indeed from much — ethnographic work. Deploying Gestalt psychology's doctrine of “situational meaning” (e.g., Dunker 1939), Moody Adams (1997: 34-43) contends that all institutions, utterances, and behaviors have meanings that are peculiar to their cultural milieu, so that we cannot be certain that participants in cross-cultural disagreements are talking about the same thing.[36] The problem of situational meaning, she (1997: 36) thinks, threatens “insuperable” methodological difficulty for those asserting the existence of intractable intercultural disagreement. Advocates of ethnographic projects will likely respond — not unreasonably, we think — that judicious observation and interview, such as that to which Brandt aspired, can motivate confident assessments of evaluative diversity. Suppose, however, that Moody-Adams is right, and the methodological difficulties are insurmountable. Now, there's an equitable distribution of the difficulty: If observation and interview are really as problematic as Moody-Adams suggests, neither the realists' nor the anti-realists' take on disagreement can be supported by appeal to empirical evidence. We do not think that such a stalemate obtains, because we think the implicated methodological pessimism excessive. Serious empirical work can, we think, tell us a lot about cultures — and the differences between them. The appropriate way of proceeding is with close attention to particular studies, and what they show and fail to show.

As Brandt (1959: 101-2) acknowledged, the anthropological literature of his day did not always provide as much information on the exact contours and origins of moral attitudes and beliefs as philosophers wondering about the prospects for convergence might like. However, social psychology and cognitive science have recently produced research which promises to further discussion; the closing decades of the twentieth century witnessed an explosion of “cultural psychology” investigating the cognitive and emotional processes of different cultures (Shweder and Bourne 1982; Markus and Kitayama 1991; Ellsworth 1994; Nisbett and Cohen 1996; Nisbett 1998, 2003; Kitayama and Markus 1999). Here we will focus on some cultural differences found close to (our) home, differences discovered by Nisbett and his colleagues while investigating regional patterns of violence in the American North and South. We argue that these findings support Brandt's pessimistic conclusions regarding the likelihood of convergence in moral judgment.

The Nisbett group's research can be seen as applying the tools of cognitive social psychology to the “culture of honor,” a phenomenon that anthropologists have documented in a variety of groups around the world. Although these groups differ in many respects, they manifest important commonalties:

A key aspect of the culture of honor is the importance placed on the insult and the necessity to respond to it. An insult implies that the target is weak enough to be bullied. Since a reputation for strength is of the essence in the culture of honor, the individual who insults someone must be forced to retract; if the instigator refuses, he must be punished — with violence or even death. (Nisbett and Cohen 1996: 5)

According to Nisbett and Cohen (1996: 5-9), an important factor in the genesis of southern honor culture was the presence of a herding economy. Honor cultures are particularly likely to develop where resources are liable to theft, and where the state's coercive apparatus cannot be relied upon to prevent or punish thievery. These conditions often occur in relatively remote areas where herding is a main form of subsistence; the “portability” of herd animals makes them prone to theft. In areas where farming rather than herding dominates, cooperation among neighbors is more important, stronger government infrastructures are more common, and resources — like decidedly unportable farmland — are harder to steal. In such agrarian social economies, cultures of honor tend not to develop. The American South was originally settled primarily by peoples from remote areas of Britain. Since their homelands were generally unsuitable for farming, these peoples have historically been herders; when they emigrated from Britain to the American South, they initially sought out remote regions suitable for herding, and in such regions, the culture of honor flourished.

In the contemporary South, police and other government services are widely available and herding has all but disappeared as a way of life, but certain sorts of violence continue to be more common than they are in the North. Nisbett and Cohen (1996) maintain that patterns of violence in the South, as well as attitudes toward violence, insults, and affronts to honor, are best explained by the hypothesis that a culture of honor persists among contemporary white non-Hispanic southerners. In support of this hypothesis, they offer a compelling array of evidence, including:

Two experimental studies — one in the field, the other in the laboratory — are especially striking.

In the field study (Nisbett and Cohen 1996: 73-5), letters of inquiry were sent to hundreds of employers around the United States. The letters purported to be from a hardworking 27-year-old Michigan man who had a single blemish on his otherwise solid record. In one version, the “applicant” revealed that he had been convicted for manslaughter. The applicant explained that he had been in a fight with a man who confronted him in a bar and told onlookers that “he and my fiancée were sleeping together. He laughed at me to my face and asked me to step outside if I was man enough.” According to the letter, the applicant's nemesis was killed in the ensuing fray. In the other version of the letter, the applicant revealed that he had been convicted of motor vehicle theft, perpetrated at a time when he needed money for his family. Nisbett and his colleagues assessed 112 letters of response, and found that southern employers were significantly more likely to be cooperative and sympathetic in response to the manslaughter letter than were northern employers, while no regional differences were found in responses to the theft letter. One southern employer responded to the manslaughter letter as follows:

As for your problems of the past, anyone could probably be in the situation you were in. It was just an unfortunate incident that shouldn't be held against you. Your honesty shows that you are sincere…. I wish you the best of luck for your future. You have a positive attitude and a willingness to work. These are qualities that businesses look for in employees. Once you are settled, if you are near here, please stop in and see us. (Nisbett and Cohen 1996: 75)

No letters from northern employers were comparably sympathetic.

In the laboratory study (Nisbett and Cohen 1996: 45-8) subjects — white males from both northern and southern states attending the University of Michigan — were told that saliva samples would be collected to measure blood sugar as they performed various tasks. After an initial sample was collected, the unsuspecting subject walked down a narrow corridor where an experimental confederate was pretending to work on some filing. The confederate bumped the subject and, feigning annoyance, called him an “asshole.” A few minutes after the incident, saliva samples were collected and analyzed to determine the level of cortisol — a hormone associated with high levels of stress, anxiety and arousal, and testosterone — a hormone associated with aggression and dominance behavior. As Figure 1 indicates, southern subjects showed dramatic increases in cortisol and testosterone levels, while northerners exhibited much smaller changes.

Figure 1

The two studies just described suggest that southerners respond more strongly to insult than northerners, and take a more sympathetic view of others who do so, manifesting just the sort of attitudes that are supposed to typify honor cultures. We think that the data assembled by Nisbett and his colleagues make a persuasive case that a culture of honor persists in the American South. Apparently, this culture affects people's judgments, attitudes, emotion, behavior, and even their physiological responses. Additionally, there is evidence that child rearing practices play a significant role in passing the culture of honor on from one generation to the next, and also that relatively permissive laws regarding gun ownership, self-defense, and corporal punishment in the schools both reflect and reinforce southern honor culture (Nisbett and Cohen 1996: 60-63, 67-9). In short, it seems to us that the culture of honor is deeply entrenched in contemporary southern culture, despite the fact that many of the material and economic conditions giving rise to it no longer widely obtain.[37]

We believe that the North/South cultural differences adduced by Nisbett and colleagues support Brandt's conclusion that moral attitudes will often fail to converge, even under ideal conditions. The data should be especially troubling for the realist, for despite the differences that we have been recounting, contemporary northern and southern Americans might be expected to have rather more in common — from circumstance to language to belief to ideology — than do, say, Yanomamö and Parisians. So if there is little ground for expecting convergence in the case at hand, there is probably little ground in a good many others.

As we said at the outset, realists defending conjectures about convergence may attempt to explain away evaluative diversity by arguing that the diversity is to be attributed to shortcomings of discussants or their circumstances. If this strategy can be made good, moral realism may survive an empirically informed argument from disagreement: so much the worse for the instance of moral reflection and discussion in question, not so much the worse for the objectivity of morality. While we cannot here canvass all the varieties of this suggestion, we will briefly remark on some of the more common forms.

Impartiality. One strategy favored by moral realists concerned to explain away moral disagreement is to say that such disagreement stems from the distorting effects of individual interest (see Sturgeon 1988: 229-230); perhaps persistent disagreement doesn't so much betray deep features of moral argument and judgment as it does the doggedness with which individuals pursue their perceived advantage. For instance, seemingly moral disputes over the distribution of wealth may be due to perceptions — perhaps mostly inchoate — of individual and class interests rather than to principled disagreement about justice; persisting moral disagreement in such circumstances fails the impartiality condition, and is therefore untroubling to the moral realist. But it is rather implausible to suggest that North/South disagreements as to when violence is justified will fail the impartiality condition. There is no reason to think that southerners would be unwilling to universalize their judgments across relevantly similar individuals in relevantly similar circumstances, as indeed Nisbett and Cohen's “letter study” suggests. One can advocate a violent honor code without going in for special pleading.[38] We do not intend to denigrate southern values; our point is that while there may be good reasons for criticizing the honor-bound southerner, it is not obvious that the reason can be failure of impartiality, if impartiality is (roughly) to be understood along the lines of a willingness to universalize one's moral judgments.

Full and vivid awareness of relevant nonmoral facts. Moral realists have argued that moral disagreements very often derive from disagreement about nonmoral issues. According to Boyd (1988: 213; cf. Brink 1989: 202-3; Sturgeon 1988: 229), “careful philosophical examination will reveal … that agreement on nonmoral issues would eliminate almost all disagreement about the sorts of moral issues which arise in ordinary moral practice.” Is this a plausible conjecture for the data we have just considered? We find it hard to imagine what agreement on nonmoral facts could do the trick, for we can readily imagine that northerners and southerners might be in full agreement on the relevant nonmoral facts in the cases described. Members of both groups would presumably agree that the job applicant was cuckolded, for example, or that calling someone an “asshole” is an insult. We think it much more plausible to suppose that the disagreement resides in differing and deeply entrenched evaluative attitudes regarding appropriate responses to cuckolding, challenge, and insult.

Savvy philosophical readers will be quick to observe that terms like “challenge” and “insult” look like “thick” ethical terms, where the evaluative and descriptive are commingled (see Williams 1985: 128-30); therefore, it is very difficult to say what the extent of the factual disagreement is. But this is of little help for the expedient under consideration, since the disagreement-in-nonmoral-fact response apparently requires that one can disentangle factual and moral disagreement.

It is of course possible that full and vivid awareness of the nonmoral facts might motivate the sort of change in southern attitudes envisaged by the (at least the northern) moral realist. Were southerners to become vividly aware that their culture of honor was implicated in violence, they might be moved to change their moral outlook. (We take this way of putting the example to be the most natural one, but nothing philosophical turns on it. If you like, substitute the possibility of northerners endorsing honor values after exposure to the facts.) On the other hand, southerners might insist that the values of honor should be nurtured even at the cost of promoting violence; the motto “death before dishonor,” after all, has a long and honorable history. The burden of argument, we think, lies with the realist who asserts — culture and history notwithstanding — that southerners would change their mind if vividly aware of the pertinent facts.

Freedom from Abnormality. Realists may contend that much moral disagreement may result from failures of rationality on the part of discussants (Brink 1989: 199-200). Obviously, disagreement stemming from cognitive impairments is no embarrassment for moral realism; at the limit, that a disagreement persists when some or all disputing parties are quite insane shows nothing deep about morality. But it doesn't seem plausible that southerners' more lenient attitudes towards certain forms of violence are readily attributed to widespread cognitive disability. Of course, this is an empirical issue, but we don't know of any evidence suggesting that southerners suffer some cognitive impairment that prevents them from understanding demographic and attitudinal factors in the genesis of violence, or any other matter of fact. What is needed to press home a charge of irrationality is evidence of cognitive impairment independent of the attitudinal differences, and further evidence that this impairment is implicated in adherence to the disputed values. In this instance, as in many others, we have difficulty seeing how charges of abnormality or irrationality can be made without one side begging the question against the other.

We are inclined to think that Nisbett and colleagues' work represents a potent counterexample to any theory maintaining that rational argument tends to convergence on important moral issues; the evidence suggests that the North/South differences in attitudes towards violence and honor might well persist even under the sort of ideal conditions we have considered. Admittedly, our conclusions must be tentative. On the philosophical side, we have not considered every plausible strategy for “explaining away” moral disagreement and grounding expectations of convergence.[39] On the empirical side, we have reported on but a few studies, and those we do consider here, like any empirical work, might be criticized on either conceptual or methodological grounds.[40] Finally, we should make clear what we are not claiming: we do not take our conclusions here — even if fairly earned — to be a “refutation” of all versions of moral realism, since there are versions of moral realism that do not require convergence (Bloomfield 2001; Shafer-Landau 2003). Rather, we hope to have given an idea of the empirical work philosophers must encounter, if they are to make defensible conjectures regarding moral disagreement.

7. Conclusion

Progress in ethical theorizing often requires progress on difficult psychological questions about how human beings can be expected to function in moral contexts. It is no surprise, then, that moral psychology is a central area of inquiry in philosophical ethics. It should also come as no surprise that empirical research, such as that conducted in psychology departments, may substantially abet such inquiry. Nor then, should it surprise that research in moral psychology has become methodologically pluralistic, exploiting the resources of, and endeavoring to contribute to, various disciplines. Here, we have illustrated how such interdisciplinary inquiry may proceed with regard to central problems in philosophical ethics. We depart with the hope that we have begun to chart the lines of further progress.


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egoism | ethics: virtue | moral realism | practical reason | reasoning: moral