Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Nov 4, 2002

Egoism can be a descriptive or a normative position. Psychological egoism, the most famous descriptive position, claims that each person has but one ultimate aim: her own welfare. Normative forms of egoism make claims about what one ought to do, rather than describe what one does do. Ethical egoism claims that it is necessary and sufficient for an action to be morally right that it maximize one's self-interest. Rational egoism claims that it is necessary and sufficient for an action to be rational that it maximize one's self-interest.

1. Psychological Egoism

All forms of egoism require explication of “self-interest” (or “welfare” or “well-being”). There are two main theories. Preference or desire accounts identify self-interest with the satisfaction of one's desires. Often, and most plausibly, these desires are restricted to self-regarding desires. What makes a desire self-regarding is controversial, but there are clear cases and counter-cases: a desire for my own pleasure is self-regarding; a desire for the welfare of others is not. Objective accounts identify self-interest with the possession of states (such as virtue or knowledge) that are valued independently of whether they are desired. Hedonism, which identifies self-interest with pleasure, is either a preference or an objective account, according to whether what counts as pleasure is determined by one's desires.

Psychological egoism claims that each person has but one ultimate aim: her own welfare. This allows for action that fails to maximize perceived self-interest, but rules out the sort of behavior psychological egoists like to target -- such as altruistic behavior or motivation by thoughts of duty alone. It allows for weakness of will, since in weakness of will cases I am still aiming at my own welfare; I am weak in that I do not act as I aim. And it allows for aiming at things other than one's welfare, such as helping others, where these things are a means to one's welfare.

Psychological egoism is supported by our frequent observation of self-interested behavior. Apparently altruistic action is often revealed to be self-interested. And we typically motivate people by appealing to their self-interest (through, for example, punishments and rewards).

A common objection to psychological egoism, made famously by Joseph Butler, is that I must desire things other than my own welfare in order to get welfare. Say I derive welfare from playing hockey. Unless I desired, for its own sake, to play hockey, I would not derive welfare from playing. Or say I derive welfare from helping others. Unless I desired, for its own sake, that others do well, I would not derive welfare from helping them. Welfare results from my action, but cannot be the only aim of my action.

The psychological egoist can concede that I must have desires for particular things, such as playing hockey. But there is no need to concede that the satisfaction of these desires is not part of my welfare. My welfare might consist simply in the satisfaction of self-regarding desires. In the case of deriving welfare from helping others, the psychological egoist can again concede that I would not derive welfare without desiring some particular thing, but need not agree that what I desire for its own sake is that others do well. That I am the one who helps them may, for example, satisfy my self-regarding desire for power.

A bigger problem for psychological egoism is that some behavior does not seem to be explained by self-regarding desires. Say a soldier throws himself on a grenade to prevent others from being killed. It does not seem that the soldier is pursuing his perceived self-interest. It is plausible that, if asked, the soldier would have said that he threw himself on the grenade because he wanted to save the lives of others or because it was his duty. He would deny as ridiculous the claim that he acted in his self-interest.

The psychological egoist might reply that the soldier is lying or self-deceived. Perhaps he threw himself on the grenade because he could not bear to live with himself afterwards if he did not do so. He has a better life, in terms of welfare, by avoiding years of guilt. The main problem here is that while this is a possible account of some cases, there is no reason to think it covers all cases. Another problem is that guilt may presuppose that the soldier has a non-self-regarding desire for doing what he takes to be right.

The psychological egoist might reply that some such account must be right. After all, the soldier did what he most wanted to do, and so must have been pursuing his perceived self-interest. In one sense, this is true. If self-interest is identified with the satisfaction of all of one's preferences, then all intentional action is self-interested (at least if intentional actions are always explained by citing preferences, as most believe). Psychological egoism turns out to be trivially true. This would not content defenders of psychological egoism, however. They intend an empirical theory that, like other such theories, it is at least possible to refute by observation.

There is another way to show that the trivial version of psychological egoism is unsatisfactory. We ordinarily think there is a significant difference in selfishness between the soldier's action and that of another soldier who, say, pushes someone onto the grenade to avoid being blown up himself. We think the former is acting unselfishly while the latter is acting selfishly. According to the trivial version of psychological egoism, both soldiers are equally selfish, since both are doing what they most desire.

The psychological egoist might handle apparent cases of self-sacrifice, not by adopting the trivial version, but rather by claiming that facts about the self-interest of the agent explain all behavior. Perhaps as infants we have only self-regarding desires; we come to desire other things, such as doing our duty, by learning that these other things satisfy our self-regarding desires; in time, we pursue the other things for their own sakes.

Even if this picture of development is true, however, it does not defend psychological egoism, since it admits that we sometimes ultimately aim at things other than our welfare. An account of the origins of our non-self-regarding desires does not show that they are really self-regarding. The soldier's desire is to save others, not increase his own welfare, even if he would not have desired to save others unless saving others was, in the past, connected to increasing his welfare.

The psychological egoist must argue that we do not come to pursue things other than our welfare for their own sakes. In principle, it seems possible to show this by showing that non-self-regarding desires do not continue for long once their connection to our welfare is broken. However, evidence for this dependence claim has not been forthcoming.

Faced with these difficulties, the psychological egoist might move to what Gregory Kavka 1986 64-80 calls “predominant egoism:” we act unselfishly only rarely, and then typically where the sacrifice is small and the gain to others is large or where those benefiting are friends, family, or favorite causes. Predominant egoism is not troubled by the soldier counter-example, since it allows exceptions; it is not trivial; and it is empirically plausible.

2. Ethical Egoism

Ethical egoism claims that it is necessary and sufficient for an action to be morally right that it maximize one's self-interest. (There are possibilities other than maximization. One might, for example, claim that one ought to achieve a certain level of welfare, but that there is no requirement to achieve more. Ethical egoism might also apply to things other than acts, such as rules or character traits. Since these variants are uncommon, and the arguments for and against them are largely the same as those concerning the standard version, I set them aside.)

One issue concerns how much ethical egoism differs in content from standard moral theories. It might appear that it differs a great deal. After all, moral theories such as Kantianism, utilitarianism, and common-sense morality require that an agent give weight to the interests of others. They sometimes require uncompensated sacrifices, particularly when the loss to the agent is small and the gain to others is large. (Say the cost to me of saving a drowning person is getting my shirtsleeve wet.) Ethical egoists can reply, however, that egoism generates many of the same duties to others. The argument runs as follows. Each person needs the cooperation of others to obtain goods such as defense or friendship. If I act as if I give no weight to others, others will not cooperate with me. If, say, I break my promises whenever it is in my direct self-interest to do so, others will not accept my promises, and may even attack me. I do best, then, by acting as if others have weight (provided they act as if I have weight in return).

It is unlikely that this argument proves that ethical egoism generates all of the standard duties to others. For the argument depends on the ability of others to cooperate with me or attack me should I fail to cooperate. In dealings with others who lack these abilities, the egoist has no reason to cooperate. The duties to others found in standard moral theories are not conditional in this way. I do not, for example, escape a duty to save a drowning person, when I can easily do so, just because the drowning person (or anyone watching) happens never to be able to offer fruitful cooperation or retaliation.

The divergence between ethical egoism and standard moral theories appears in other ways.

First, the ethical egoist will rank as most important duties that bring her the highest payoff. Standard moral theories determine importance at least in part by considering the payoff to those helped. What brings the highest payoff to me is not necessarily what brings the highest payoff to those helped. I might, for example, profit more from helping the local Opera society refurbish its hall than I would from giving to famine relief in Africa, but standard moral theories would rank famine relief as more important than Opera hall improvements.

Second, the cooperation argument cannot be extended to justify extremely large sacrifices, such as the soldier falling on the grenade, that standard moral theories rank either as most important or supererogatory. The cooperation argument depends on a short-term loss (such as keeping a promise that it is inconvenient to keep) being recompensed by a long-term gain (such as being trusted in future promises). Where the immediate loss is one's life (or irreplaceable features such as one's sight), there is no long-term gain, and so no egoist argument for the sacrifice.

An ethical egoist might reply by taking the cooperation argument further. Perhaps I cannot get the benefits of cooperation without converting to some non-egoist moral theory. That is, it is not enough that I act as if others have weight; I must really give them weight. I could still count as an egoist, in the sense that I have adopted the non-egoist theory on egoist grounds.

One problem is that it seems unlikely that I can get the benefits of cooperation only by conversion. Provided I act as if others have weight for long enough, others will take me as giving them weight, and so cooperate, whether I really give them weight or not. In many situations, others will neither have the ability to see my true motivation nor care about it.

Another problem is that conversion can be costly. I might be required by my non-egoist morality to make a sacrifice for which I cannot be compensated (or pass up a gain so large that passing it up will not be compensated for). Since I have converted from egoism, I can no longer reject making the sacrifice or passing up the gain on the ground that it will not pay. It is safer, and seemingly feasible, to remain an egoist while cooperating in most cases. If so, ethical egoism and standard moralities will diverge in some cases. (For discussion of the cooperation argument, see Frank 1988; Gauthier 1986 ch. 6; Kavka 1984 and 1986 pt. II; Sidgwick 1981 II.V.)

There is another way to try to show that ethical egoism and standard moral theories do not differ much. One might hold one particular objective theory of self-interest, according to which my welfare lies in possessing the virtues required by standard moral theories. This requires an argument to show that this particular objective theory gives the right account of self-interest. It also faces a worry for any objective theory: objective theories seem implausible as accounts of welfare. If, say, all my preferences favor my ignoring the plight of others, and these preferences do not rest on false beliefs about issues such as the likelihood of receiving help, it seems implausible (and objectionably paternalistic) to claim that “really” my welfare lies in helping others. I may have a duty to help others, and the world might be better if I helped others, but it does not follow that I am better off by helping others. (For a more optimistic verdict on this strategy, noting its roots in Socrates, Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, and the British Idealists, see Brink 1997.)

Of course the divergence between ethical egoism and standard moral theories need not bother an ethical egoist. An ethical egoist sees egoism as superior to other moral theories. Whether it is superior depends on the strength of the arguments for it. Two arguments are popular.

First, one might argue for a moral theory, as one argues for a scientific theory, by showing that it best fits the evidence. In the case of moral theories, the evidence is usually taken to be our most confident common-sense moral judgments. Egoism fits many of these, such as the requirements of cooperation in ordinary cases. It fits some judgments better than utilitarianism does. For example, it allows one to keep some good, such as a job, for oneself, even if giving the good to someone else would help him slightly more, and it captures the intuition that I need not let others exploit me. The problem is that, as the discussion of the cooperation argument shows, it also fails to fit some of the confident moral judgments we make.

Second, one might argue for a moral theory by showing that it is dictated by non-moral considerations -- in particular, by facts about motivation. It is commonly held that moral judgments must be practical, or capable of motivating those who make them. If psychological egoism were true, this would restrict moral judgments to those made by egoism. Other moral judgments would be excluded since it would be impossible to motivate anyone to follow them.

One problem with this argument is that psychological egoism seems false. Replacing psychological with predominant egoism loses the key claim that it is impossible to motivate anyone to make an uncompensated sacrifice.

The ethical egoist might reply that, if predominant egoism is true, ethical egoism may require less deviation from our ordinary actions than any standard moral theory. But fit with motivation is hardly decisive; any normative theory, including ethical egoism, is intended to guide and criticize our choices, rather than simply endorse whatever we do. When I make an imprudent choice, this does not count against ethical egoism, and in favor of a theory recommending imprudence.

The argument has other problems. One could deny that morality must be practical in the required sense. Perhaps morality need not be practical at all: we do not always withdraw moral judgments when we learn that the agent could not be motivated to follow them. Or perhaps moral judgments must be capable of motivating not just anyone, but only idealized versions of ourselves, free from (say) irrationality. In this case, it is insufficient to describe how we are motivated; what is relevant is a description of how we would be motivated were we rational.

Finally, if I do not believe that some action is ultimately in my self-interest, it follows from psychological egoism that I cannot aim to do it. But say I am wrong: the action is in my self-interest. Ethical egoism then says that it is right for me to do something I cannot aim to do. It violates practicality just as any other moral theory does.

So far I have considered arguments for ethical egoism. There are two standard arguments against it.

The first is that ethical egoism is inconsistent in various ways. Say ethical egoism recommends that A and B both go a certain hockey game, since going to the game is in the self-interest of each. Unfortunately, only one seat remains. Ethical egoism, then, recommends an impossible state of affairs. Or say that I am A and an ethical egoist. I both claim that B ought to go to the game, since that is in her self-interest, and I do not want B to go to the game, since B's going to the game is against my self-interest.

Against the first inconsistency charge, the ethical egoist can reply that ethical egoism provides no neutral ranking of states of affairs. It recommends to A that A go to the game, and to B that B go to the game, but is silent on the value of A and B both attending the game.

Against the second inconsistency charge, the ethical egoist can claim that she morally recommends that B go to the game, although she desires that B not go. This is no more odd than claiming that my opponent in a game would be wise to adopt a particular strategy, while desiring that he not do so. True, the ethical egoist is unlikely to recommend ethical egoism to others, to blame others for violations of what ethical egoism requires, to justify herself to others on the basis of ethical egoism, or to express moral attitudes such as forgiveness and resentment. These publicity worries may disqualify ethical egoism as a moral theory, but do not show inconsistency.

The second standard argument against ethical egoism is just that: ethical egoism does not count as a moral theory. One might set various constraints on a theory's being a moral theory. Many of these constraints are met by ethical egoism -- the formal constraints, for example, that moral claims must be prescriptive and universalizable. Ethical egoism issues prescriptions – “do what maximizes your self-interest” -- and it issues the same prescriptions for people in relevantly similar situations. But other constraints are problematic for ethical egoism: perhaps a moral theory must sometimes require uncompensated sacrifices; or perhaps it must supply a single, neutral ranking of actions that each agent must follow in cases where interests conflict; or perhaps it must respect principles such as “that I ought to do x is a consideration in favor of others not preventing me from doing x;” or perhaps it must be able to be made public in the way, just noted, that ethical egoism cannot. (For sample discussions of these two objections, see Baier 1958 189-191; Campbell 1972; Frankena 1973 18-20; Kalin 1970; Moore 1903 96-105.)

The issue of what makes for a moral theory is contentious. An ethical egoist could challenge whatever constraint is deployed against her. But a neater reply is to move to rational egoism, which makes claims about what one has reason to do, ignoring the topic of what is morally right. This gets at what ethical egoists intend, while skirting the issue of constraints on moral theories. After all, few if any ethical egoists think of egoism as giving the correct content of morality, while also thinking that the rational thing to do is determined by some non-egoist consideration. One could then, if one wished, argue for ethical egoism from rational egoism and the plausible claim that the best moral theory must tell me what I have most reason to do.

3. Rational Egoism

Rational egoism claims that it is necessary and sufficient for an action to be rational that it maximize one's self-interest. (As with ethical egoism, there are variants which drop maximization or evaluate rules or character traits rather than actions. There are also variants which make the maximization of self-interest necessary but not sufficient, or sufficient but not necessary, for an action to be rational. Again, I set these aside.)

Like ethical egoism, rational egoism needs arguments to support it. One might cite our most confident judgments about rational action and claim that rational egoism best fits these. The problem is that our most confident judgments about rational action seem to be captured by a different, extremely popular theory -- the instrumental theory of rationality. According to the instrumental theory, it is necessary and sufficient, for an action to be rational, that it maximize the satisfaction of one's preferences. Since psychological egoism seems false, it may be rational for me to make an uncompensated sacrifice for the sake of others, for this may be what, on balance, best satisfies my (strong, non-self-interested) preferences. This conflict with the instrumental theory is a major problem for rational egoism.

The rational egoist might reply that the instrumental theory is equally a problem for any standard moral theory that claims to give an account of what one ought rationally, or all things considered, to do. If, for example, a utilitarian claims that I have most reason to give to charity, since that maximizes the general happiness, I could object that giving to charity cannot be rational given my particular preferences, which are for things other than the general happiness.

A different problem for rational egoism is that it appears arbitrary. Suppose I claim that I ought to maximize the welfare of blue-eyed people, but not of other people. Unless I can explain why blue-eyed people are to be preferred, my claim looks arbitrary, in the sense that I have given no reason for the different treatments. As a rational egoist, I claim that I ought to maximize the welfare of one person (myself). Unless I can explain why I should be preferred, my claim looks equally arbitrary.

One reply is to argue that non-arbitrary distinctions can be made by one's preferences. Say I like anchovies and hate broccoli. This makes my decision to buy anchovies rather than broccoli non-arbitrary. Similarly, my preference for my own welfare makes my concentration on my own welfare non-arbitrary.

There are two problems for this reply.

First, we do not always take preferences to establish non-arbitrary distinctions. If I defend favoring blue-eyed people simply by noting that I like blue-eyed people, without any justification for my liking, this seems unsatisfactory. The rational egoist must argue that hers is a case where preferences are decisive.

Second, if psychological egoism is false, I might lack a preference for my own welfare. It would follow that for me, a distinction between my welfare and that of others would be arbitrary, and the rational egoist claim that each ought to maximize his own welfare would be unjustified when applied to me. The proposal that preferences establish non-arbitrary distinctions supports the instrumental theory better than rational egoism.

Another reply to the arbitrariness worry is to claim that certain distinctions just are non-arbitrary. Which distinctions these are is revealed by looking at whether we ask for justifications of the relevance of the distinction. In the case of my maximizing of the welfare of the blue-eyed, we do ask for a justification; we do not take “because they're blue-eyed” as an adequate defense of a reason to give to the blue-eyed. In the case of my maximizing my own welfare, however, “because it will make me better off” may seem a reasonable justification; we do not quickly ask “why does that matter?”

Debate over rational egoism was revitalized by Parfit 1984 pts. II-III. Parfit gives two main arguments against rational egoism. Both focus on the rational egoist's attitude toward the future: the rational egoist holds that the time at which some good comes is by itself irrelevant, so that, for example, I ought to sacrifice a small present gain for a larger future gain.

First, one could challenge rational egoism, not only with the instrumental theory, but also with the “present-aim” theory of rationality. According to the present-aim theory, I have most reason to do what maximizes the satisfaction of my present desires. Even if all of these desires are self-regarding, the present-aim theory need not coincide with rational egoism. Suppose I know that in the future I will desire a good pension, but I do not now desire a good pension for myself in the future; I have different self-regarding desires. Suppose also that, looking back from the end of my life, I will have maximized my welfare by contributing now to the pension. Rational egoism requires that I contribute now. The present-aim theory does not. It claims that my reasons are relative not only to who has a desire -- me rather than someone else – but also to when the desire is held -- now rather than in the past or future. One reason the present-aim theory is important is that it shows there is a coherent, more minimal alternative to rational egoism. The rational egoist cannot argue that egoism is the most minimal theory, and that standard moral theories, by requiring more of people, require special, additional justification.

Second, Parfit argues for a theory of personal identity according to which what matters is (in part) the connections between my present mental states and the mental states of my future self. These connections take the form of persisting desires, character traits, and memories. Since these can decrease between my present and future selves, it is implausible to claim, as the rational egoist does, that I now should care equally about my present self and all my future selves.


Psychological Egoism

Ethical Egoism

Rational Egoism

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