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Necessary and Sufficient Conditions

First published Fri Aug 15, 2003

A handy tool in the search for precise definitions is the specification of necessary and/or sufficient conditions for the application of a term, the use of a concept, or the occurrence of some phenomenon or event. For example, without water and oxygen, there would be no human life; hence these things are necessary conditions for the existence of human beings. Cockneys, according to the traditional definition, are all and only those born within the sound of the Bow Bells. Hence birth within the specified area is both a necessary and a sufficient condition for being a Cockney.

Like other fundamental concepts, the concepts of necessary and sufficient conditions cannot be readily specified in other terms. This article shows how elusive the quest is for a definition of the terms "necessary" and "sufficient", indicating the existence of systematic ambiguity in the concepts of necessary and sufficient conditions. It also shows the connection between puzzles over this issue and troublesome issues surrounding the word "if" and its use in conditional sentences.

1. Philosophy and Conditions

An ambition of twentieth-century philosophy was to analyse and refine the definitions of significant terms — and the concepts expressed by them — in the hope of casting light on the tricky problems of, for example, truth, morality knowledge and existence that lay beyond the reach of scientific resolution. Central to this goal was specifying at least in part the conditions to be met for correct application of terms, or under which certain phenomena could truly be said to be present. Even now, philosophy's unique contribution to interdisciplinary studies of consciousness, the evolution of intelligence, the meaning of altruism, the nature of moral obligation, the scope of justice, the concept of pain, the theory of perception and so on still relies on its capacity to bring high degrees of conceptual exactness and rigour to arguments in these areas.

If memory is a capacity for tracking our own past experiences and witnessings then a necessary condition for Penelope remembering giving a lecture is that it occurred in the past. Contrariwise, that Penelope now remembers the lecture is sufficient for inferring that it was given in the past. What, then, is a necessary (or a sufficient) condition? This article shows that complete precision in answering this question is itself elusive. Although we can use the notion of necessary condition in defining what it is for something to be a sufficient condition (and vice versa), there is no straightforward way to give a precise and comprehensive account of the meaning of the term "necessary (or sufficient) condition" itself. Wittgenstein's warnings against premature theorising and overgeneralising, and his insight that many everyday terms pick out families, should mandate caution over expecting a complete and unambiguous specification of what constitutes a necessary, or a sufficient, condition.

2. The Standard Theory: Truth-functions and Symmetry

The front door is locked. In order to open it (in a normal, non-violent way) and get into the house, I must first use my key. A necessary condition of opening the door, without violence, then, is to use the key. So it seems true that

(i) If I opened the door, I used the key.

Can we use the truth-functional understanding of "if" to propose that the consequent of any conditional (in (i), the consequent is "I used the key") specifies a necessary condition for the truth of the antecedent (in (i), "I opened the door")? Many logic and critical thinking texts use just such an approach, and for convenience I call it "the standard theory" (see Blumberg 1976, pp. 133 - 4, Hintikka and Bachman 1991, p. 328 for examples of this approach).

The standard theory makes use of the fact that in classical logic, the truth-function "p ⊃ q" ("If p, q") is false only when p is true and q is false. The relation between "p" and "q" in this case is often referred to as material implication. On this account of "if p, q", if the conditional "p ⊃ q" is true, and p holds, then q also holds; likewise if q fails to be true, then p must also fail of truth (if the conditional as a whole is to be true). The standard theory thus claims that when the conditional "p ⊃ q" is true the truth of the consequent, "q", is necessary for the truth of the antecedent, "p", and the truth of the antecedent is in turn sufficient for the truth of the consequent. This relation between necessary and sufficient conditions matches the the formal equivalence between a conditional formula and its contrapositive ("~q ⊃ ~p" is the contrapositive of "p ⊃ q". Descending from talk of truth of statements to speaking about states of affairs, we can equally correctly say, on the standard theory, that using the key was necessary for opening the door.

There appears to be an important symmetry between the two kinds of conditions: B's being a necessary condition of A is equivalent to A's being a sufficient condition of B (and vice versa). So it seems that any truth-functional conditional sentence states both a sufficient and a necessary one as well. Suppose that if Nellie is an elephant, then she has a trunk. Being an elephant is a sufficient condition of her having a trunk; having a trunk in turn is a necessary condition of Nellie's being an elephant. Indeed, the claim about the necessary condition is simply another way of putting the claim about the sufficient condition, just as the contrapositive of a formula is logically equivalent to the original formula.

It is also possible to use "only if" to identify a necessary condition: we can say that Jonah was swallowed by a whale only if he was swallowed by a mammal, for if a creature is not a mammal, it is not a whale. The standard theory usually maintains that "If p, q" and "p only if q" are equivalent ways of expressing the truth-functional "p ⊃ q". Equivalent to (i) above, on this account, is the sentence "I opened the door only if I used the key" — a perfectly natural way of indicating that use of the key was necessary for opening the door.

The account of necessary and sufficient conditions just outlined is particularly apposite in dealing with logical, conceptual and definitional conditions. The hook operator ("⊃") captures much of what is meant by reference to necessary and sufficient conditions in such contexts. For example, from the truth of a conjunction, it can be inferred that each component is true (if "p and q" is true, then "p" is true and "q" is true). Suppose, then, that it is true that it is both raining and sunny. This is a sufficient condition for "it is raining" to be true. That it is raining is — contrariwise — a necessary condition for it being true that it is both raining and sunny. Likewise, as we have seen, if the concept of memory is the concept of a faculty for tracking actual past events, the fact that an event is now in the past is a necessary condition of my presently recollecting it. If water is chemically defined as a liquid constituted mainly of H2O, then if a glass contains water, it contains mainly H2O. That the glass contains H2O is a necessary condition of its containing water.

Serious problems arise, however, if we try to extend the standard theory to wider ranges of cases. Even in application to definitional and conceptual matters, the standard theory has some counter-intuitive consequences. Given any two true sentences A and B, the conditional "If A, then B" is true. For example, provided it is true that the sun is made of gas and also true that elephants have four legs, then the truth-functional conditional "If elephants have four legs, then the sun is made of gas" is also true. However, the gaseous nature of the sun would not normally be regarded as a conceptually, or even contingently, necessary condition of the quadripedality of elephants. Indeed, according to the standard theory, any truth will be a necessary condition for the truth of every statement whatsoever, and any falsehood will be a sufficient condition for the truth of any statement we care to consider.

These odd results would not arise in some non-classical logics where it is required that premisses be relevant to the conclusions drawn from them, and that the antecendents of true conditionals are likewise relevant to the consequents. Even in those versions of relevance logic which avoid some of these odd results, it is difficult to avoid all paradoxes of implication. For example, a contradiction (a statement of the form "p and not p") will be a sufficient condition for the truth of any statement unless the semantics for the logic in question allow the inclusion of inconsistent worlds (for more details, see logic: relevance).

Such oddities are not the only problem faced by the challenge of giving a general account of necessary and sufficient conditions. Were it the case that "if" in English always expressed some uniform kind of condition, then we might hope to model its behaviour by means of an operator definable in some formal system. But if conditional sentences are ambiguous, and if different kinds of conditions are expressed by the word "if", it would be wise to uncover these before engaging in attempts to formalize and systematize the concepts of necessary and sufficient. Such an ambiguity is revealed by further investigation. In particular, two central claims of the standard theory do not survive exposure to a range of examples that are rather different from the conceptual and definitional ones that best conform to the standard theory. These claims are, first, that there is a symmetry between necessary and sufficient conditions, and, second, that "if p, q" and "p only if q" are equivalent ways of saying the same thing. As will be shown in the next section, neither of these claims is generally defensible. In fact, there are curious asymmetries affecting conditions and the conditional statements which express them.

3. Further Problems for the Standard Theory

Several linguists and philosophers have long been sceptical of the truth-functional analysis of the conditional. Accepting that analysis makes it appear both that there is a symmetry between necessary and sufficient conditions, and also that "if p, q" sentences can always be paraphrased by "p only if q" ones. However, neither of these latter claims matches either the most natural understanding of necessary (and sufficient) conditions, or the behaviour of "if" (and "only if") in English. Consider, for example, the following case (drawn from McCawley 1993, p. 317):

(ii) If you touch me, I'll scream

While in the case of the door, using the key was necessary for opening it, no parallel claim seems to work for (ii): in the natural reading of this statement, my screaming is not necessary for your touching me. McCawley claims that the "if"-clause in a standard English statement gives the condition — whether epistemic, temporal or causal — for the truth of the "then"-clause. The natural interpretation of (ii) is that my screaming depends on your touching me. To take my screaming as a necessary condition for your touching me seems to get the dependencies back to front.

A similar asymmetry arises in the case of the door. While opening the door depended, temporally and causally, on using the key first, it would be wrong to think that using the key depended, either temporally or causally, on opening the door. So what kind of condition does the antecedent state? To get clear on this, we can consider a baffling pair of conditional sentences (a modification of Sanford 1989, 175 - 6):

(iii) If he learns to play, I'll buy Lambert a cello
(iv) Lambert learns to play only if I buy him a cello

While (iii) states a condition under which I buy Lambert a cello (presumably he first learns by using one borrowed from a friend, or hired, or ... etc.), (iv) states a necessary condition of Lambert learning to play the instrument in the first place (there may be others too). Notice that the statements are not equivalent in meaning, even though the standard textbook treatment treats "if p, q" as just another way of saying "p only if q". Indeed, if we take them together, the statements leave poor old Lambert with no prospect of ever getting the cello from me. If (iv) were equivalent to (iii), combining the two statements would not lead to an impasse like this.

But how else can we formulate (iii) in terms of "only if"? A natural, English equivalent is surprisingly hard to formulate. Perhaps it would be something like:

(v) Lambert has learned to play the cello only if I have bought him one

where the auxiliary ("has"/"have") has been introduced to try to keep dependencies in order. Yet (v) is not quite right, for it can be read as implying that Lambert's success is dependent on my having first bought him a cello — something that is certainly not implied in (iii). A still better (but not completely satisfactory) version requires further adjustment of the auxiliary, say:

(vi) Lambert will have learned to play the cello only if I have bought him one

This time, it is not so easy to read (vi) as implying that I bought Lambert a cello before he learned to play. These changes in the auxiliary (sometimes described as changes in "tense") have led some writers to argue that conditionals in English may make implicit quantification across times (see, for example, von Fintel 1998). Assessment of this claim lies beyond the scope of the present article (see the entry on conditionals).

What this case does strongly suggest, however, is that different kinds of dependency are expressed by use of the conditional construction: (iv) is not equivalent to (iii) because the necessary condition in (iii) (that I buy Lambert a cello) provides what we might call a reason for thinking that Lambert has learned to play the cello. By contrast, the very same condition — that I buy Lambert a cello — appears to fulfil a different function according to (iv) (namely that I first have to buy him a cello before he learns to play). In the following section, different kinds of conditions are distinguished. That we are able to make such distinctions suggests the existence of a systematic ambiguity in the concepts of necessary (and sufficient) condition.

If there is indeed an ambiguity in these concepts, then we cannot give unqualified endorsement to the thesis that A is a sufficient condition for B if and only if B is a necessary condition for A (and vice versa). According to the standard theory, this latter should be a quite uncontroversial proposition. After all, it seems quite natural — as von Wright pointed out (von Wright 1974, 7) — to regard the notions of necessary condition and sufficient condition as themselves being interdefinable:

A is a sufficient condition of B =df the absence of A is a necessary condition of the absence of B
B is a necessary condition of A =df the absence of B is a sufficient condition of the absence of A

In what follows, I show that in one perfectly good sense, there is often a lack of symmetry in the behaviour of necessary and sufficient conditions. The reason for this is that the conditions being expressed are not of the same kind. In another perfectly good sense, there is a symmetry between the two kinds of conditions, in that each licenses an inference of a particular kind. Since not all uses of "if" in English state a uniform kind of condition, there is no general conclusion that can safely be drawn about symmetry, or lack of it, between necessary and sufficient conditions. Nor will it be right to claim that sentences like "if p, q" are generally paraphrasable as "p only if q".

4. Inferences, Reasons for Thinking, and Reasons Why

Are the following two statements equivalent? (see Wertheimer 1968, 363 - 4):

(vii) The occurrence of a sea battle tomorrow is a necessary and sufficient condition for the truth, today, of "There will be a sea battle tomorrow"
(viii) The truth, today, of "There will be a sea battle tomorrow" is a necessary and sufficient condition for the occurrence of a sea battle tomorrow

Sanford argues that while (vii) is sensible, (viii) "has things backward" (Sanford 1989, 176 - 7). However, we must proceed with caution over this. Sanford writes: "the statement about the battle, if true, is true because of the occurrence of the battle. The battle does not occur because of the truth of the statement" (ibid.) What he probably means is that the occurrence of the battle explains the truth of the statement, rather than explanation being the other way around. Of course, people sometimes do undertake actions just to ensure that what they had formerly said turns out to be true; so there will be cases where the truth of a statement explains the occurrence of an event. But this seems an unlikely reading of the sea battle case.

Now let S be the sentence "There will be a sea battle tomorrow". Surely if S is true today, it is correct to infer that a sea battle will occur tomorrow. That is, even though the truth of the sentence does not explain the occurrence of the battle, the fact that it is true licenses the inference to the occurrence of the event. Ascending to the purely formal mode (in Carnap's sense), we can make the point by explicitly limiting inference relations to ones that hold among sentences or other items than can bear truth values. It is perfectly proper to infer from the truth of S today that some other sentence is true tomorrow, such as "there is a sea battle today". Since "there is a sea battle today" is true tomorrow if and only if there is a sea battle tomorrow, then we can infer from the fact that S is true today that a sea battle will occur tomorrow.

The considerations just given do not deny the absence of explanatory symmetry in cases (vii) and (viii). But lack of explanatory symmetry does not block inferential dependencies as we have just noted. There is an (inferential) sense in which the truth of S is both a necessary and sufficient condition for inferring the occurrence of the sea battle. However, there is an (explanatory) sense in which the occurrence of the sea battle is necessary and sufficient for explaining the truth of S. It would appear then that whether there is a symmetry or not in cases like (vii) and (viii) depends very much on the sense in which the notions of necessary and sufficient conditions are being deployed.

Is it possible to generalize this finding? Returning to the door example, we see that the fact I used the key explains why I was able to open the door without force. That I opened the door without force gives a ground for inferring that I used the key. Think of a further example from McCawley:

(ix) If John wins the race, we will celebrate

John's winning the race is a sufficient condition for us having a celebration, and his winning the race is the reason why we will be celebrating. Our celebration, however, is not likely to be the reason why he wins the race. In what sense then is the celebration a necessary condition of John's winning the race? Again, there is a ground for inferring: that we don't celebrate is a ground for inferring that John didn't win the race. English "tense" usage is sensitive to the asymmetry uncovered here, in the way noted in the previous section. The natural way of writing the contrapositive of (ix) is not the literal "If we will not celebrate, then John does not win the race", but rather something like:

(x) If we don't celebrate, John didn't win the race, or
(xi) If we aren't celebrating, John hasn't won the race, or even
(xii) If we don't celebrate, John can't have won the race

It is perhaps no more odd to encounter a gap between inferential symmetry and explanatory asymmetry in the case of conditionals than in the case of logical and mathematical equations in general. For example, Newton's classical identity, f = ma, can be rewritten in equivalent forms such as a = f/m or f/a = m. These all state just the same thing, from an algebraic point of view. Now let us suppose that force is a measure of what brings a particle to a certain state. Then we would say that while force causes acceleration, the ratio f/a does not cause, or explain, mass, even though it does determine it (see the Epilogue of Pearl 2000 for a non-technical attempt at tackling the representation of causal intervention by new algebraic notations).

There seem to be at least three different relations we can distinguish in connection with conditional statements, each of which may bear on questions of necessity and sufficiency. First is the implication relation symbolised by the hook operator, "⊃" or perhaps some relevant implication operator. An operator like hook captures some inferential relations as already noted. For example, we saw that from the truth of a conjunction, it can be inferred that each component is true (from "p and q", we can infer that "p" is true and that "q" is true). Hook, or a relevant implication operator, seems to capture one of the relations encountered in the sea battle case, which can be thought of as holding paradigmatically between bearers of truth values, but can be loosely thought of in terms of states of affairs. For this relation, we are able to maintain the standard theory's symmetry thesis.

Two further relations, however, are often implicated in reflections on necessary and sufficient conditions. To identify these, consider the different things that can be meant by saying

(xiii) If Lambert was present, it was a good seminar

One scenario in terms of which (xiii) can be understood is where Lambert is invariably a lively contributor to any seminar he attends. Moreover, his contributions are always insightful, hence guaranteeing an interesting time for all who attend. In this case, Lambert's presence was the reason why the seminar was good. A different scenario depicts Lambert as someone who has an almost unerring knack for spotting which seminars are going to be good, even though he himself is not always active in the discussion. Lambert's attendance at a seminar, according to this story, provides a reason for thinking that the seminar is going to be good. We might say that according to the first story, the seminar is good because Lambert is at it. On the second, it is the goodness of the seminar that explains Lambert's presence. Cases of this kind were first introduced in Wilson (1979). Notice that the hook (as understood in classical logic) does not capture the reason for thinking relation, for it permits any truth to be inferred from any other statement whatever.

The reason why and reason for thinking that conditions help to shed light on the asymmetries encountered earlier. That I opened the door is a reason for thinking that I used the key, not a reason why. That he learns to play the instrument is the reason why (in case (iii)) I will buy Lambert a cello, and that I buy him a cello is (in the same case) a reason for thinking that — but not a reason why — he has learned to play the instrument. Our celebrating is a reason for thinking that John has won the race in case (ix), but not a reason why.

Although there is sometimes a correlation between reasons why, on the one hand, and reasons for thinking, on the other, no generalisations about this can be safely made. If A is a sufficient reason why B occurs, then the occurrence of B will sometimes be a reason for thinking — but not a guarantee — that A has occurred. If A is a sufficient reason for thinking that B has occurred, then B will sometimes be a reason why — but not a guarantee that — A has occurred. Going back to our initial example, my opening the door without violence was a sufficient reason for thinking that I had used the key. That I used my key was not just a reason for thinking that I had opened the door, but one of the reasons why I was able to open the door. What is important, however, is that the "if" clause of a conditional may do any of three things described in the present section: (i) introduce a premiss from which the consequent follows in the way modelled by an operator like hook; (ii) state a reason why what is stated in the consequent is the case; (iii) state a reason for thinking that what is stated in the consequent is the case.

While it is possible to distinguish these different roles the "if" clause may play (there may be others too), it will not always be easy to isolate them in every case. The concept of explanation is not very helpful here, for we can explain a phenomenon by citing a reason for thinking it is the case, or by citing a reason why it is the case. Further problems arise when we consider the mathematical, physical or other laws that may be involved in the use of concepts (one locus classicus for this issue is Sellars 1948). For example, the truth of "that figure is a polygon" is sufficient for inferring "the sum of that figure's exterior angles is 360 degrees". From "the sum of the figure's exterior angles is not 360 degrees" we can infer "the figure is not a polygon". Such inferences are not logically trivial. Rather they depend on geometrical definitions and mathematical principles, and so this is a case of mathematically necessary and sufficient conditions. But in saying this, we open the way to acknowledging that mathematical results also give us at least a reason for thinking that because a figure is a polygon its exterior angles will sum to 360 degrees. We may even be able to think of contexts in which the fact that a figure is a polygon provides a reason why its exterior angles sum to 360 degrees.

In the theory of knowledge, it is generally held that if I know that p, then p is true. The truth of p is a necessary condition of knowing that p, according to such accounts. Again, in saying this we do not rule out claims stronger than simply saying that the truth of p follows from the fact that we know that p. That a belief is true — for example — may be (part of) a reason for thinking it constitutes knowledge. Other cases involve inferences licensed by physics, biology and the natural sciences — inferences that will involve causal or nomic conditions. Again there is need for care in determining whether reason why or reason for thinking relations are being stated. The increase of mean kinetic energy of its molecules does not just imply that the temperature of a gas is rising but also provides a reason why the temperature is increasing. However, if temperature is just one way of measuring mean molecular kinetic energy, then a change in temperature will be a reason for thinking that mean kinetic energy of molecules has changed, not a reason why it has changed.

As mentioned at the start of the article, the specification of necessary and sufficient conditions has traditionally been part of the philosopher's business of analysis of terms, concepts and phenomena. Philosophical investigations of knowledge, truth, consciousness, memory, justice, altruism and a host of other matters do not aim at stating explanatory relations, but rather at identifying and developing conceptual ones (see Jackson 1998 for a detailed account of conceptual analysis). Philosophical analyses do not generally give conditions that provide reasons why or reasons for thinking that. Nor do dictionary definitions. That Nellie is an elephant is not a (or the) reason why she is an animal, any more than that a figure is a square is a reason why it has four sides. Rather, elephants are one kind of animal, and squares are one kind of four-sided figure. To specify the necessary conditions for the truth of the sentence "that figure is a square" is to specify a number of conditions including "that figure has four sides", "that figure is on a plane", and "that figure is closed". If any one of these latter conditions is false, then the sentence "that figure is a square" is also false. Conversely, the truth of "that figure is a square" is a sufficient condition for the truth of "that figure is closed". The inferential relations in this case are modelled — albeit inadequately, as noted earlier — by an operator like hook.

Now consider our previous example — that of memory. That Penelope remembers something — according to a standard account of memory — means (among other things) that the thing remembered was in the past, and that some previous episode involving Penelope plays an appropriate causal role her present recall of the thing in question. It would be a mistake to infer from the causal role of some past episode in Penelope's current remembering, that the definition of memory itself involves conditions that are explanatory in the reason why sense. That Penelope now remembers some event is not a reason why it is in the past. Conversely, that an event is not in past, is not a reason why Penelope does not remember it. Rather, philosophical treatments of memory seek for conditions that are a priori constitutive of the truth of such sentences as "Penelope remembers doing X". The uncovering of such conditions does not explain Penelope's now remembering things, but rather provides insight into whether, and how, "remember" is to be defined. Reason why and reason for thinking that conditions do not play a role in this part of the philosopher's enterprise. A formalized account of these two relations still waits development.

Finally, it should be noted that not all conditional sentences primarily aim at giving necessary and/or sufficient conditions. A common case involves what might be called silly or jocular conditionals. A friend of Lys mistakenly refers to "Plato's Critique of Pure Reason" and Lys remarks, "If Plato wrote the Critique of Pure Reason, then I'm Aristotle". Rather than specifying conditions, Lys is engaging in a form of reductio argument. Since it is obvious that she is not Aristotle, her joke invites the listener to infer (by contraposition) that Plato did not write the Critique of Pure Reason.

5. Modest Conclusion

Given the different roles for "if" just identified, it is hardly surprising that generalisations about necessary and/or sufficient conditions are hard to formulate. Suppose, for example, someone tries to state a sufficient condition for a seminar being good in a context where the speaker and all the listeners share the view that Lambert's presence is a reason why seminars would be good. In this case, Lambert's presence might be said to be a sufficient condition of the seminar being good in the sense that his presence is a reason why it is good. Now, is there a similar sense in which the goodness of the seminar is a necessary condition of Lambert's presence? The negative answer to this question is already evident from the earlier discussion. If we follow von Wright's proposal, mentioned above, we get the following result: that the seminar is not good is a sufficient condition of Lambert not being present. But this cannot plausibly be read as a sufficient condition in anything like the sense of a reason why. At most, the fact of the seminar not being a good one may be a reason for thinking that Lambert was not at it. So how can we tell, in general, what kind of condition is being expressed in an "if" sentence? As noted in the case of the sea battle, when rewriting in the formal mode captures the sense of what is being said, and when the formulations "if p, q" and "p only if q" seem idiomatically equivalent, then an inferential interpretation will be in order, von Wright's equivalences will hold, and the material conditional may well give a reasonable account of such cases.

As already noted, even the inferential use of "if" is not always associated primarily with the business of stating necessary and sufficient conditions. This observation, together with the cases and distinctions introduced in the present article, show the need for caution when we move from natural language conditionals to analysis of them in terms of necesssary and sufficient conditions, and also the need for caution in modelling the latter conditions by means of logical operators. Instead, we have to recognize that there are several kinds of conditionals, and several kinds of conditions. So although we can — and do — sometimes use conditional statements to express necessary and sufficient conditions, and can explicate necessary and sufficient conditions by analysis of some of the roles of "if" in natural language conditionals, this does not give us as much as we might hope for. In particular, there seems to be no general formal scheme for translating between conditionals as used in natural language and the statement of any one particular type of condition, or vice versa.


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Related Entries

conditionals | conditionals: counterfactual | logic: classical | logic: modal | logic: relevance


I am grateful to Richard Borthwick, Laurence Goldstein, Fred Kroon, Y.S. Lo and Edward Zalta for their generous help and advice relating to this entry.