Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Dec 4, 2008; substantive revision Tue May 19, 2009

“Panentheism” is a constructed word composed of the English equivalents of the Greek terms “pan”, meaning all, “en”, meaning in, and “theism”, meaning God. Panentheism understands God and the world to be inter-related with the world being in God and God being in the world. It offers an increasingly popular alternative to traditional theism and pantheism. Panentheism seeks to avoid both isolating God from the world as traditional theism often does and identifying God with the world as pantheism does. Traditional theistic systems emphasize the difference between God and the world while panentheism stresses God's active presence in the world. Pantheism emphasizes God's presence in the world but panentheism maintains the identity and significance of the non-divine. Anticipations of panentheistic understandings of God have occurred in both philosophical and theological writings throughout history (Hartshorne and Reese 1953; Cooper, 2006). However, a rich diversity of panentheistic understandings has developed in the past two centuries primarily in Christian traditions responding to scientific thought (Clayton and Peacocke 2004).

1. Terminology

Because “panentheism” developed as an alternative to traditional theological positions under the influence of German Idealism, Whiteheadian process philosophy, and current scientific thought, panentheists employ a variety of terms with meanings that have a specific context.

Theological terms as understood by panentheists:

1. Theism
Classical theism, or traditional theism: the understanding that ultimate reality is a being which is distinct from the world and any other reality. This distinction involves a separation between God and the world that makes any interaction between God and the world problematic.
2. Pantheism
A type of theism that rejects any separation between God and the world by stressing the identity of God and the world ontologically. This identity is expressed in different manifestations so distinctions can be made, but the distinctions are temporary. There is often a strong sense of necessity in God's creation of the world so that God as God must express deity in creation.
3. Transcendence
Generally, God's externality to the world so that God is unlimited by any other being or reality. Hegel and then Hartshorne understand transcendence as including all that is in order to avoid any reality external to God that limits God.
4. Immanence
God's presence and activity within the world. Panentheists assert that traditional theism limits its affirmation of God's immanence by understanding immanence as the presence of the transcendent supernatural Being within the natural realm. If God's presence and activity within the world as natural is an intervention of the supernatural within the natural, God is absent from the natural except in specific cases of intervention.
5. Kenosis
Divine emptying of infinite being or withdrawal of divine being.

Terms influenced by the German Idealism of Hegel and Schelling:

1. Dialectic
The presence of contradictory realities where the contradiction is overcome by including elements from each of the contradictory elements in a synthesis that is more than the combination of each member of the contradiction. Whitehead's understanding of God's redemption of evil by placing an evil event in the context of good events expresses a similar understanding although he is not as explicit as Hegel in understanding all of reality as a dialectical development.
2. Perichoresis
The ontological intermingling of the members of the Trinity so that the Father is part of the Son and the Spirit, the Son part of the Spirit and Father, and the Spirit part of the Father and Son. Moltmann utilizes this relationship to describe the presence of God in the world and the world in God.

Terms influenced by Whiteheadian process philosophy:

1. Internal and External Relations
Internal relations are relations that affect the being of the related beings. External relations do not change the basic nature or essence of a being. For panentheism, the relationship between God and the world is an internal relationship in that God affects the nature of the world and the world changes the nature of God. Classical theism affirms an external relationship between God and the world in that God responds to events in the world but those events do not change God's essence, necessary existence, or basic nature.
2. Dipolar
Refers especially to God as having two basic aspects. Schelling identified these aspects as necessary and contingent. Whitehead identified these aspects as God's primordial and consequent natures meaning God has an eternal nature and a responsive nature. Whitehead understands all reality to be dipolar in that each event includes both physical and mental aspects in opposition to a mind-body dualism. Hartshorne identifies these aspects as abstract and concrete.

Terms related to current scientific thought:

1. Reductionism
The approach that explains all of reality in terms of one type of existence. Ordinarily reductionism is the position that all of reality can be explained by using only physical, sub-atomic, entities. Any reference to a higher being or cause results from a lack of information about the physical entities that are involved. Modern reductionism denies the existence of mental realities as a separate type of existence. Panentheism critiques reductionism as an oversimplification of reality and the experience of reality.
2. Supervenience
One reality arises out of another reality. For example, mental activity arises out of physical reality. While reductionistic understandings agree that supervenience occurs, reductionistic supervenience maintains that there are consistent principles that function in the same way at both levels. Panentheists generally understand supervenience to give rise to new principles that are effective at one level but not present at the simpler level.
3. Emergence
Describes the process involved in supervenience. Emergence occurs when a new property arises out of a combination of elements. The traditional example is that water emerges out of the combination of oxygen and hydrogen atoms in certain proportions. There are a variety of types of emergence that have been identified. In part-whole emergence, the whole is more than the total of all the parts (Corning 2002). Strong emergence understands evolution to produce new and ontologically distinct levels characterized by their own laws or regularities and causal forces. Weak emergence holds that the new level follows the fundamental causal processes of physics (Clayton 2004, 9). Strong emergence is also known as ontological emergence and weak as epistemological emergence.
4. Top-Down Causation
Involves more complex levels of objects or events affecting less complex elements. Causation is ordinarily understood as being from the bottom-up meaning from the simple to the complex. Physical elements cause other, often more complex, objects or events. A common example of top-down causation is the effect of thought upon a person's body. Scientists heatedly debate the possibility of top-down causation (Davies 2006).

Possible meanings of the “in” in panentheism:

1. Locative or Having a Special Meaning
“In” refers to a location in the sense of one location that is included in a broader location. For example, something may be located in a certain part of a certain room. Such a meaning is problematic in reference to God because of the common understanding that God is not limited by spatial categories. If spatial categories do not apply to God in ordinary usage, to say something is located in God becomes problematic and is either meaningless or has a special meaning.
2. Analogical Meaning
Because of the difficulties with understanding “in” as referring to a location in relation to God, “in” is most often understood by panentheists as an analogy conveying information by means of a comparison. There are a variety of analogies that panentheists have utilized.
3. Part/Whole Analogical Meaning
Take part in something that is greater and different from any and all the parts. The world is in God by participating in God through being and action.
4. Emergence Analogical Meaning
A specific part/whole analogy that indicates that being in something is to be at least a partial source for a more complex entity.
5. Mind/Body Analogical Meaning
The mind provides structure and direction to the organization of the organism of the body. The world is God's body in the sense that the world actualizes God and manifests God while being directed by God as different from the world. Many but not all panentheists utilize the mind/body analogy to describe the God/world relation in a manner that emphasizes the immanence of God without loss of God's transcendence.

2. History

Although Panentheism lacked a clear label in philosophical and religious reflection about God until Karl Krause's (1781–1832) creation of the term in the Eighteenth century (Gregersen 2004, 28), various advocates and critics of panentheism find evidence of incipient or implicit forms of panentheism present in religious thought as early as 1300 BCE. Hartshorne discovers the first indication of panentheistic themes in Ikhnaton (1375–1358 BCE), the Egyptian pharaoh often considered the first monotheist. In his poetic description of the sun god, Ikhnaton avoids both the separation of God from the world that will characterize theism and the identification of God with the world that will characterize pantheism (Hartshorne 1953, 29–30). Early Vedantic thought, as well as some modern Indian thought, implies panentheism in non-Advaita forms that understand non-dualism as inclusive of differences. Although there are texts referring to Brahman as contracted and identical to Brahman, other texts speak of Brahman as expanded. In these texts, the perfect includes and surpasses the total of imperfect things as an appropriation of the imperfect. Although not the dominant interpretation of the Upanishads, multiple intimations of panentheism are present in the Upanishads (Whittemore 1988, 33, 41–44). Hartshorne finds additional religious concepts of God that hold the unchanging and the changing together in a way that allows for the development and significance of the non-divine in Lao-Tse (fourth century BCE) and in the Judeo-Christian scriptures (1953, 32-38).

In philosophical reflection, Plato (427/428–348/347 BCE) plays an important role in the development of implicit panentheism although there is disagreement about the nature of that role. Hartshorne discovers in Plato resources for a dipolar understanding of God that includes both immutability and mutability. Hartshorne understands Plato's concept of the divine to include the Forms as pure and unchanging being and the World soul as changing and in motion. Although Hartshorne concludes that Plato never reconciled these two elements in his understanding of the divine, both aspects were present (1953, 54). Cooper, instead, thinks that Plato retained an essential distinction between the Good and the other beings that Plato called gods. Cooper bases traditional theism, and the development of philosophical theism, on the difference between the Good and any other beings in Plato's assertion of the difference between God and all other forms of existence. According to Cooper, Plotinus (204–270 CE) provided the basis for panentheism with his identification of God with the world. Plotinus' system described the physical world as an emanation of being from the One, which was beyond comprehension or description. In this sense then, Plotinus considered the world as part of the Ultimate (2006, 35–39).

From Plato to Schelling (1775–1854 CE), various theologians and philosophers developed ideas that are similar to themes in contemporary panentheism. These ideas developed as expressions of traditional theism. Proclus (412–485 CE) and Pseudo-Dionysus (late Fifth to early Sixth century) drawing upon Plotinus developed perspectives that included the world in God and understood the relationship between God and the world as a dialectical relationship (Cooper 2006, 42–46). In the Middle Ages, the influence of Neoplatonism continued in the thought of Eriugena (815–877), Eckhart (1260–1328), Nicholas of Cusa (1401–1464), and Boehme (1575–1624). Although accused of pantheism by their contemporaries, their systems can be identified as panentheistic because they understood God in various ways as including the world rather than being the world and because they used a dialectical method. The dialectical method involved the generation of opposites and then the reconciliation of the opposition in God. This retained the distinct identity of God in God's influence of the world (Cooper 2006, 47–62). During the early modern period, Bruno (1548–1600) and Spinoza (1631–1677) responded to the dualism of traditional theism by emphasizing the relationship between God and the world to the point that the nature of any ontological distinction between God and the world became problematic. Later thinkers such as the Cambridge Platonists (Seventeenth century), Jonathan Edwards (1703–1758), and Friedrich Schleiermacher (1768–1834) thought of the world as in some way in God or a development from God. Although they did not stress the ontological distinction between God and the world, they did emphasize the responsive relationship that humans have to God. Human responsiveness assumed some degree of human initiative if not freedom, which indicates some distinction between God and humans. The assumption of some degree of human initiative was a reaction against the loss of freedom due to Spinoza's close identification between God and the world (Cooper 2006, 64–90).

The nineteenth and twentieth centuries saw the development of panentheism as a specific position regarding God's relationship to the world. The awareness of panentheism as an alternative to theism and pantheism developed out of a complex of approaches. Philosophical idealism and philosophical adaptation of the scientific concept of evolution provided the basic sources of the explicit position of panentheism. Idealistic understandings of God in the thought of Hegel (1770–1831) and Schelling who sought to unify reality by means of dialectic thought. Philosophical approaches applying the concept of development to God culminated in process philosophy's understanding of God being affected by the events of the world.

Schelling and Hegel sought to retain the close relationship between God and the world that Spinoza proposed without identifying God with the world. Their concept of God as developing in and through the world provided the means for accomplishing this. Prior to this time, God had been understood as unchanging and the world as changing to exist in God (Cooper 2006, 90). Schelling's understanding of God as personal provided the basis for the unity of the diversity in the world in a manner that was more open than Hegel's understanding. Schelling emphasized the freedom of the creatures in relation to the necessity of God's nature as love. This relationship resulted in a vitality and on-going development. Hartshorne classifies this as a dipolar understanding of God in that God is both necessary and developing (1953, 234). Cooper describes Schelling's thought as dynamic cooperative panentheism (2006, 95). Hegel found Schelling inadequate and sought a greater unity for the diversity. This led Hegel to a more comprehensive and consistent system still based upon change in God. God as well as nature is characterized by dialectical development. In his rejection of pantheism, Hegel understood the infinite as including the finite by absorbing the finite into its own fuller nature. This retained divine transcendence in the sense of the divine surpassing its parts although not separate from the parts (Whittemore 1960, 141–142). The divine transcendence provided unity through the development of the Absolute through history. Cooper describes Hegel's panentheism as dialectical historical panentheism (2006, 107). Karl Krause (1781–1832) in 1828 labeled Schelling's and Hegel's position as “panentheism” in order to emphasize its difference from Spinoza's identification of God with the world (Reese 2008, 1).

As Darwin's theory of evolution introduced history into the conceptualization of biology, Samuel Alexander (1859–1938), Henri Bergson (1859–1941), and C. Lloyd Morgan (1852–1936) introduced development into the ways in which all of physical reality was conceptualized. They then worked out positions that in a variety of ways understood God and the world as growing in relationship to each other. Although Hartshorne's classification of “panentheism” did not include Alexander in the category of “panentheism,” only occasionally mentioned Bergson, and made no reference to Morgan, Whitehead referred to all three of these thinkers positively. Although it may be too strong to claim that they influenced Whitehead (Emmett 1992), they did provide the background for Whitehead's and then Hartshorne's systematic development of process philosophy as an expression of panentheism. Hartshorne popularized the modern use of the term “panentheism” and considered Whitehead to be the outstanding panentheist (Hartshorne 1953, 273). Although Hartshorne made several modifications to Whitehead's understanding of God, the basic structures of Whitehead's thought were continued in Hartshorne's further development of Whitehead's philosophy (Ford 1973; Cobb,1965). God, for process philosophy, is necessary for any actual world. Without God, the world would be nothing more than a static, unchanging existence radically different from the actual world of experience. God as both eternal and temporal provides possibilities that call the world to change and develop. God as eternal provides an actual source of those possibilities. However, if God is only eternal, the possibilities would be unrelated to the actual world as it presently exists. Thus, Whitehead and Hartshorne understand the world to be present in God in order for the possibilities that lead to development to be related to the world (Hartshorne 1953, 273). The implication of God's inclusion of the world is that God is present to the world and the world influences God. Although the presence of the world in God could be understood as a form of pantheism, process philosophy avoids collapsing the world into God or God into the world by maintaining a distinction between God and the world. This distinction is manifest in the eternality of God and the temporality of the world. It is also apparent in the freedom of the events in the world. Although God presents possibilities to the events in the world, each event “decides” how it will actualize those possibilities. The freedom of each event, the absence of divine determination, provides a way for process thought to avoid God being the cause of evil or containing evil as evil. Since God includes the events of the world, God will include the evil as well as the good that occurs in the world and this evil will affect God since the world affects God's actualization. But, because God does not determine the response of each event to the possibilities that God presents, any event may reject God's purpose of good through the intensification of experience and actualize a less intense experience. God does take this less intense, evil, experience into God's self, but redeems that evil by means of relating it to the ways in which good has been actualized. Thus, God saves what can be saved from the world rather than simply including each event in isolation from other events (Cooper 2006, 174, 180).

3. Contemporary Expressions

Although the majority of the contemporary development of panentheism involves scientists and protestant theologians or philosophers, there are also feminist thinkers and thinkers in the Roman Catholic tradition, the Orthodox tradition, and religions other than Christianity who are articulating a form of panentheism. Protestant theologians who have contributed to the contemporary forms of panentheism have continued the German Idealist tradition or the tradition of process philosophy.

Utilizing resources from the tradition of German Idealism, Jürgen Moltmann developed a form of panentheism in his early work, The Crucified God 1974 (1972 for the German original), where he said that the suffering and renewal of all humanity are taken into the life of the Triune God. He explicated his understanding of panentheism more fully in The Trinity and the Kingdom 1981. Theological concerns motivate Moltmann's concept of panentheism. Panentheism avoids the arbitrary concept of creation held by traditional theism and the loss of creaturely freedom that occurs in Christian pantheism (Cooper 2006, 248). Moltmann understands panentheism to involve both God in the world and the world in God. The relationship between God and the world is like the relationship among the members of the Trinity in that it involves relationships and communities (Molnar 1990, 674). Moltmann uses the concept of perichoresis to describe this relationship of mutual interpenetration. By using the concept of perichoresis, Moltmann moves away from a Hegelian understanding of the trinity as a dialectical development in history (Cooper 2006, 251). The relationship between God and the world develops because of God's nature as love that seeks the other and the free response of the other (Molnar 1990, 677). Moltmann does not consider creation necessary for God nor the result of any inner divine compulsion. But creation is the result of God's essential activity as love rather than the result of God's self-determination (Molnar, 1990,679). This creation occurs in a process of interaction between nothingness and creativity, contraction and expansion, in God. Because there is no “outside” of God due to God's infinity, God must withdraw in order for creation to exist. Kenosis, or God's self-emptying, occurs in creation as well as in the incarnation. The nothing in the doctrine of “creation from nothing” is the primordial result of God's contraction of God's essential infinity (Cooper, 2006, 247). Moltmann finds that panentheism as mutual interpenetration preserves unity and difference in a variety of differences in kind such as God and human being, person and nature, and the spiritual and the sensuous (Moltmann, 1996, 307).

Utilizing process philosophy, David Ray Griffin assumes that scientific understandings of the world are crucial and recognizes the implications of scientific understanding for theology. However, his concept of panentheism builds on the principles of process philosophy rather than scientific concepts directly. Griffin traces modern atheism to the combination of understanding perception as exclusively based on physical sensations, accepting a naturalistic explanation of reality, and identifying matter as the only reality. But, the emergence of mind challenges the adequacy of this contemporary worldview (2004, 40–41). He claims that the traditional supernaturalistic form of theism with its emphasis upon the divine will does not provide an adequate alternative to the atheism of the late modern worldview because God becomes the source of evil. Griffin argues that traditional theism makes God the source of evil because God's will establishes the general principles of the universe (2004, 37). Process panentheism provides a way to avoid the problems of both traditional theism and materialistic naturalism (2004, 42). Griffin substitutes panexperientialism for materialism and a doctrine of perception that bases sensory perception on a non-sensory mode of perception in order to explain both the mind-body interaction and the God-world interaction. God is numerically distinct from the world but is ontologically the same avoiding dualism and supernaturalism. God and events in the world interact through non-sensory perception (2004, 44-45). Through this interaction, God can influence but not determine the world, and the world can influence God's concrete states without changing God's essence. Process panentheism recognizes two aspects of the divine, an abstract and unchanging essence and a concrete state that involves change. Through this dipolar concept, God both influences and is influenced by the world (2004, 43–44). Griffin understands God as essentially the soul of the universe although distinct from the world. The idea of God as the soul of the world stresses the intimacy and direct relationship of God's relationship to the world, not the emergence of the soul from the world (2004, 44). Relationality is part of the divine essence, but this does not mean that this specific world is necessary to God. This world came into existence from relative nothingness. This relative nothingness was a chaos that lacked any individual that sustained specific characteristics over time. However, even in the chaos prior to the creation of this world, events had some degree of self-determination and causal influence upon subsequent events. These fundamental causal principles along with God exist naturally since these causal principles are inherent in things that exist including the nature of God. The principles cannot be broken because such an interruption would be a violation of God's nature. An important implication of the two basic causal principles, a degree of self-determination and causal influence, is that God influences but does not determine other events (2004, 43). Griffin's understanding of naturalism allows for divine action that is formally the same in all events. But this divine action can occur in a variable manner so that some acts are especially revelatory of the divine character and purpose (2004, 45).

Much of the contemporary discussion and development of panentheism occurs in the context of the science and religion discussion. In that discussion, Arthur Peacocke and Paul Davies have made important contributions as scientists interested in, and knowledgeable about, religion. Peacocke has developed his understanding of panentheism beginning in 1979 and continuing through works in 2001, 2004, and 2006. Peacocke begins with the shift in the scientific understanding of the world from a mechanism to the current understandings of the world as a unity composed of complex systems in a hierarchy of different levels. These emergent levels do not become different types of reality but instead compose a unity that can be understood naturally as an emergentist monism. At the same time, the different levels of complexity cannot be reduced to an explanation of one type or level of complexity. The creative dynamic of the emergence of complexity in hierarchies is immanent in the world rather than external to the world (Peacocke 2004, 137–142). Similarly, Paul Davies describes the universe by talking about complexity and higher levels of organization in which participant observers bring about a more precise order (2007). Again, the organization, which makes life possible, is an internal, or natural, order rather than an order imposed from outside of the universe (Davies 2004). Peacocke draws upon this contemporary scientific understanding of the universe to think about the relationship between God and the natural world. He rejects any understanding of God as external to nature whether it is a traditional theistic understanding where God intervenes in the natural world or a deistic understanding where God initiates the natural world but does not continue to be active in the world. For Peacocke, God continuously creates through the processes of the natural order. God's active involvement is not an additional, external influence upon events. However, God is not identified with the natural processes, which are the action of God as Creator (Peacocke 2004, 143–144). Peacocke identifies his understanding of God's relation to the world as panentheism because of its rejection of dualism and external interactions by God in favor of God always working from inside the universe. At the same time, God transcends the universe because God is infinitely more than the universe. This panentheistic model combines a stronger emphasis upon God's immanence with God's ultimate transcendence over the universe by using a model of personal agency (Peacocke 2004, 147–151). Davies also refers to his understanding of the role of laws in nature as panentheism rather than deism because God chose laws that give a co-creative role to nature (2004, 104).

Philip Clayton begins with contemporary scientific understandings of the world and combines them with theological concepts drawn from a variety of sources including process theology. He describes God's relationship with the world as an internal rather than an external relationship. Understanding God's relationship as internal to the world recognizes the validity of modern scientific understandings that do not require any external source in order to account for the order in the world. At the same time, God's internal presence provides the order and regularity that the world manifests (2001, 208–210). Clayton agrees that the world is in God and God is in the world. Panentheism, according to him, affirms the interdependence of God and the world (2004b, 83). This affirmation became possible as a result of the rejection of substantialistic language, which excludes all other beings from any one being. Rejection of substantialistic language thus allows for the interaction of beings. Clayton cites Hegel's recognition that the logic of the infinite requires the inclusion of the finite in the infinite and points towards the presence of the world in God (Clayton 2004b, 78–79). Clayton, along with Joseph Bracken (1974; 2004), identifies his understanding of panentheism as Trinitarian and kenotic (Clayton 2005, 255). It is Trinitarian because the world participates in God in a manner analogous to the way that members of the trinity participate in each other although the world is not and does not become God. God freely decides to limit God's infinite power in an act of kenosis in order to allow for the existence of non-divine reality. The divine kenotic decision results in the actuality of the world that is taken into God. But, for Clayton, God's inclusion of finite being as actual is contingent upon God's decision rather than necessary to God's essence (2003, 214). Clayton affirms creation from nothing as a description of creaturely existence prior to God's decision. The involvement of the world in an internal relationship with God does not completely constitute the divine being for Clayton. Instead, God is both primordial, or eternal, and responsive to the world. The world does constitute God's relational aspect but not the totality of God (2005, 250–254). The best way to describe the interdependence between God and the world for Clayton is through the concept of emergence. Emergence may be explanatory, epistemological, or ontological. Ontological understandings of emergence, which Clayton supports, hold that 1) reality is made up one type of being, physical existence, rather than two or more types of being but this physicality does not mean that only physical objects exist because, 2) properties emerge in objects from the potentiality of an object that cannot be previously identified in the object's parts or structure, 3) the emergence of new properties give rise to distinct levels of causal relations, which leads to 4) downward causation of the emergent level upon prior levels (2006a, 2–4). Emergence recognizes that change is important to the nature of the world and challenges static views of God (Clayton 2006b, 320).

4. Criticisms and Responses

In spite of more than one hundred years of development, panentheism continues to grow and change. Much of this growth has taken place as a result of advances in science. Another impetus for change has been criticisms raised by the major alternatives to panentheistic understandings of the God-world relation. As an effort to find a middle ground between thinking of God as external to the world and thinking of God as identical to the world, panentheism is challenged by those who find that any lessening of the emphasis upon divine transcendence to be inadequate and by those who find some form of pantheism more adequate than any distinction between God and the world. Finally, the variety of the versions of pantheism have led to an active internal critique by the various versions.

Both pantheists and scientists working with naturalist assumptions criticize panentheism for its metaphysical claim that there is a being above or other than the natural world. At times, this criticism has been made by claiming that a thorough-going naturalism does not need a transcendent, individualized reality. Corrington describes the development of his thought as a growing awareness that panentheism unnecessarily introduces a being above nature as well as in nature (2002, 49). Drees expresses a similar criticism by arguing that all contemporary explanations of human agency, including non-reductionist explanations, are naturalistic and do not require any reference to a higher being. For panentheists to claim that divine agency is analogous to human agency fails both to recognize that human agency requires no additional source or cause and to explain how a divine source of being could act in the realm of physical and mental processes (1999). Frankenberry makes this objection more specific. Panentheism offers a more complex relationship between God and the world than is necessary. This unnecessary complexity is revealed by the problems that panentheism has with the logic of the freedom of parts in wholistic relations, the possibility of the body-soul analogy relapsing into gender inflected ideas of the soul as the male principle, the problem with simultaneity of events in the divine experience in relation to the principle of the relativity of time, the necessity of the everlasting nature of value, and finally the use of the ontological argument to establish the necessity of the abstract pole of the divine nature (1993, 36–39). Gillett points out the scientific difficulty with panentheism. Panentheism lacks an explanation for a causal efficacy higher than the causal efficacy realized by microphysical causation (2003, 19). Generally, panentheists respond to these criticisms by affirming the inadequacy both scientifically and metaphysically of any type of reductionistic naturalism. Such a naturalism whether articulated in scientific categories or religious categories fails to recognize the emergence of levels of complexity in nature. The emergence of higher levels of organization that cannot be completely explained in terms of lower levels renders non-differentiated accounts of being inadequate. Panentheists often argue that the emergence of higher levels of order makes possible downward causation. Davies describes the difficulties in coming to a clear description of downward causation and concludes that the complexity of systems open to the environment makes room for downward causation but has not yet provided an explanation of how downward causation works (2006, 48).

Traditional forms of theism critique panentheism from the opposite side. Rather than criticizing an unnecessary transcendence, traditional theism charges panentheism with an inadequate transcendence due to failing to distinguish God from the world. Grounds (1970), and later William Lane Craig (2006), give examples of this criticism. Grounds recognized that panentheists hold that God includes the world but is not identical to the world. Craig recognizes that Clayton claims that God is infinite. But Grounds describes Hartshorne's distinction between God and the world as a distinction that is not consistently held because Hartshorne includes accidents within God's nature. Grounds argues that according to Hartshorne God would cease to be if the world ceased to exist. Such a position lacks an adequate distinction between God and the world since God and the world are interdependent (Grounds, 1970, 154). Craig claims that Clayton cannot maintain God's infinity because making a distinction between God and the world requires a boundary between God and the world and such a boundary would limit God (Rowe 2007). The basic response of panentheists to the criticism that the distinction between God and the world cannot be maintained is the dipolar concept of God. In the dipolar understanding of God, the essence of God is different from the world because God is infinite and the world is finite; God is everlasting and the world is temporal. Griffin additionally affirms the numerical difference between God and the world even though there is no ontological difference of kind (2004, 44–45). Cooper recognizes that the panentheist does actually describe a distinction between God and the world but criticizes panentheism because it does not hold an unqualified distinction between God and the world. Panentheism lacks an ontological distinction between God and the world. An ontological distinction between God and the world makes it possible to identify and affirm God's saving presence. According to Cooper, if God's transcendence does not infinitely exceed God's immanence, God's presence, knowledge, and power are limited rather than complete, immediate, and unconditioned. Cooper recognizes that prioritizing divine transcendence raises the problem of evil but thinks that God's unlimited power provides hope that God will provide an ultimate solution to the problem of evil. The basic issue for traditional theism is that panentheism understands a balance between transcendence and immanence to involve the world influencing and affecting God. If God is affected by the world, then God is considered incapable of providing salvation (Cooper 2006, 322–328). Peacocke and Eastern Orthodox thinkers (Louth 2004, 184; Nesteruk 2004, 173–176; Ware 2004, 167) respond by affirming a weak form of emergence in which the world does not affect God. Clayton and Bracken respond by maintaining that the world does influence God but God's will, expressed through the decisions that God makes, protects God's ability to save (Clayton 2005). Moltmann describes God's essence as directing God's activity in order to maintain the reliability of God as love acting on behalf of creation. Moltmann does not find it necessary to protect divine freedom by giving it priority over divine love but rather understands freedom as acting according to the divine nature of love (Moltmann 1981, 98, 99). Cooper also criticizes panentheism for holding a concept of God that can save through the general processes of nature but not in any distinctive way. Vanhoozer's concern for divine freedom is based on a similar concern (1998, 250). But, Griffin's discussion of divine variable action does allow for specific and distinctive manifestations of divine love (2004, 45). Ultimately, the panentheist response is that God's nature as love directs God's actions bringing salvation. God's nature as love is the crucial aspect of divine action rather than a causal efficacy. The emphasis of traditional theism on divine will misses that the divine will is directed by divine love.

The varieties of panentheism participate in internal criticism. Clayton and Crain (2006) emphasize the dependence of the world upon God rather than the dependence of God upon the world although they maintain that God is influenced, and changed, by the world. They criticize understandings of God that limit God by making God subject to metaphysical principles. Griffin emphasizes the regularity provided by metaphysical principles. This regularity recognizes the order in reality that the reliability of God's love provides. Case-Winters calls for maintaining a balance between the distinction between God and the world and God's involvement with the world. Over-emphasis upon either side of the balance leads to positions that are philosophically and theologically inadequate (Case-Winters 2007, 125).


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emergent properties | feminist (interventions): philosophy of religion | Hartshorne, Charles | Japanese Philosophy: Kyoto School | monotheism | pantheism | religion: philosophy of | Schopenhauer, Arthur | Spinoza, Baruch | supervenience | theism: process