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First published Fri Feb 8, 2008

Parmenides of Elea, active in the earlier part of the 5th c. BCE., authored a difficult metaphysical poem that has earned him a reputation as early Greek philosophy's most profound and challenging thinker. His philosophical stance has typically been understood as at once extremely paradoxical and yet crucial for the broader development of Greek natural philosophy and metaphysics. He has been seen as a metaphysical monist (of one stripe or another) who so challenged the naïve cosmological theories of his predecessors that his major successors among the Presocratics were all driven to develop more sophisticated physical theories in response to his arguments. The difficulties involved in the interpretation of his poem have resulted in disagreement about many fundamental questions concerning his philosophical views, such as: whether he actually was a monist and, if so, what kind of monist he was; whether his system reflects a critical attitude toward earlier thinkers such as the Milesians, Pythagoreans, and Heraclitus, or whether he was motivated simply by more strictly logical concerns, such as the paradox of negative existentials that Bertrand Russell detected at the heart of his thought; whether he considered the world of our everyday awareness, with its vast population of entities changing and affecting one another in all manner of ways, to be simply an illusion, and thus whether the lengthy cosmological portion of his poem represented a genuine attempt to understand this world at all. This entry aims to provide an overview of Parmenides' work and of some of the major interpretive approaches advanced over the past few decades. It concludes by suggesting that understanding his thought and his place in the development of early Greek philosophy requires taking due account of the fundamental modal distinctions that he was the first to articulate and explore with any precision.

1. Life and Writings

The dramatic occasion of Plato's dialogue, Parmenides, is a fictionalized visit to Athens by the eminent Parmenides and his younger associate, Zeno, to attend the festival of the Great Panathenaea. Plato describes Parmenides as about sixty-five years old and Socrates, with whom he converses in the first part of the dialogue, as “quite young then,” which is normally taken to mean about twenty. Given that Socrates was a little past seventy when executed by the Athenians in 399 BCE, one can infer from this description that Parmenides was born about 515 BCE He would thus appear to have been active during the early to mid-fifth century BCE Speusippus, Plato's successor as head of the Academy, is said to have reported in his On Philosophers that Parmenides established the laws for the citizens of his native Elea, one of the Greek colonies along southern Italy's Tyrrhenian coast (Speus. fr. 3 Tarán ap. D.L. 9.23; cf. Plu. Col. 1126A), though Elea was founded some 30 years before Parmenides' birth. The ancient historiographic tradition naturally associates Parmenides with thinkers such as Xenophanes and the Pythagoreans active in Magna Graecia, the Greek-speaking regions of southern Italy, whom he may well have encountered. A 1st c. CE portrait head of Parmenides was discovered at Castellamare della Bruca (ancient Elea) in the 1960's with an inscription—“Parmeneides, son of Pyres, Ouliadês, Natural Philosopher”—that associates him with a cult of Apollo Oulios or Apollo the Healer.

According to Diogenes Laertius, Parmenides composed only a single work (D.L. 1.16). This was a metaphysical and cosmological poem composed in the traditional epic medium of hexameter verse. The title “On Nature” under which it was transmitted is probably not authentic. The poem originally extended to perhaps eight hundred verses, roughly one hundred and sixty of which have survived as “fragments” that vary in length from a single word (fr. 15a: “water-rooted,” describing the earth) to the sixty-two verses of fragment 8. That any portion of his poem survives is due entirely to the fact that later ancient authors, beginning with Plato, for one reason or another felt the need to quote some portion of it in the course of their own writings. Sextus Empiricus quotes thirty of the thirty-two verses of fragment 1 (the opening Proem of the poem), though apparently from some sort of Hellenistic digest rather than from an actual manuscript copy, for his quotation of fr. 1.1-30 continues uninterruptedly with five and a half verses from fragments 7 and 8. The Alexandrian Neoplatonist Simplicius (6th c. CE) appears to have possessed a good copy of the work, from which he quoted extensively in his commentaries on Aristotle's Physics and De Caelo. He introduces his lengthy quotation of fr. 8.1-52 as follows: “Even if one might think it pedantic, I would gladly transcribe in this commentary the verses of Parmenides on the one being, which aren't numerous, both as evidence for what I have said and because of the scarcity of Parmenides' treatise.” Thanks to Simplicius' lengthy transcription, we appear to have entire Parmenides' major metaphysical argument demonstrating the attributes of “What Is” (to eon) or “true reality” (alêtheia).

We are much less well informed about the cosmology Parmenides expounded in the latter part of the poem and so must supplement the primary evidence of the fragments with testimonia, that is, with various reports or paraphrases of his theories that we also find in later authors. (A number of these testimonia are collected among the fifty-four “A-Fragmente” in the Parmenides section of Diels and Kranz's Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker. A more comprehensive collection of testimonia is to be found in Coxon 1986, 95-155.) As always when dealing with an ancient philosopher whose work has not survived entire, one must take into account how the philosophical and other concerns of later authors thanks to whom we know what we do of Parmenides' original poem are likely to have shaped the transmission of the extant fragments and testimonia. Certainly the partial and imperfect preservation of his poem is one factor that complicates understanding of his thought.

2. Overview of Parmenides' Poem

2.1 The Proem

Parmenides' poem began with a proem describing a journey he figuratively once made to the abode of a goddess. He described how he was conveyed on “the far-fabled path of the divinity” (fr. 1.3) in a chariot by a team of mares and how the maiden daughters of Helios, the sun-god, led the way. These maidens take Parmenides to whence they themselves have come, to “the halls of Night” (fr. 1.9), before which stand “the gates of the paths of night and day” (fr. 1.11). The maidens gently persuade Justice, guardian of these gates, to open them so that Parmenides himself may pass through to the abode within. Parmenides thus describes how the goddess who dwells there welcomed him upon his arrival:

And the goddess received me kindly, and in her hand she took/ my right hand, and she spoke and addressed me thus:/ “O young man, accompanied by immortal charioteers/ [25] and mares who bear you as you arrive at our abode,/ welcome, since a fate by no means ill sent you ahead to travel/ this way (for surely it is far from the track of humans),/ but Right and Justice did.” (Fr. 1.1-28a)

Parmenides' proem is no epistemological allegory of enlightenment but a topographically specific description of a mystical journey to the halls of Night. In Hesiod, the “horrible dwelling of dark Night” (Th. 744) is where the goddesses Night and Day alternately reside as the other traverses the sky above the Earth. Both Parmenides' and Hesiod's conception of this place have their precedent in the Babylonian mythology of the sun god's abode. This abode also traditionally served as a place of judgment, and this fact tends to confirm that when Parmenides' goddess tells him that no ill fate has sent him ahead to this place (fr. 1.26-27a), she is indicating that he has miraculously reached the place to which travel the souls of the dead.

In the proem, then, Parmenides casts himself in the role of an initiate into the kind of mysteries that were during his day part of the religious milieu of Magna Graecia. The motif of the initiate is important, for it informs Parmenides' portrayal of himself as one whose encounter with a major divinity has yielded a special knowledge or wisdom. The divinity in this instance would seem to be Night herself: Parmenides goes to “the halls of Night” (fr. 1.9), and the goddess who greets him welcomes him to “our home” (fr. 1.25). The goddess Night serves as counselor to Zeus in some of the major Orphic cosmologies, including the Derveni cosmology. In the closely related Orphic Rhapsodies, Night instructs Zeus on how to preserve the unity produced by his absorption of all things into himself as he sets about initiating a new cosmogonic phase. It is thus appropriate that Night should be the source of Parmenides' revelation, for Parmenidean metaphysics is very much concerned with the principle of unity in the cosmos.

2.2 The Ways of Inquiry

Immediately after welcoming Parmenides to her abode, the goddess describes as follows the content of the revelation he is about to receive:

You must needs learn all things,/ both the unshaken heart of well-rounded reality/ [30] and the notions of mortals, in which there is no genuine conviction./ Nonetheless these things too will you learn, how what they resolved/ had actually to be, all through all pervading. (Fr. 1.28b-32)

This programmatic announcement already indicates that the goddess' revelation will come in two major phases. The goddess provides some further instruction and admonition before commencing the first phase, the demonstration of the nature of what she here mysteriously calls “the unshaken heart of well-rounded reality” (fr. 1.29). She then follows this first phase of her revelation with what in the originally complete poem was a much longer account of the principles, origins, and operation of the cosmos and its constituents, from the heavens and the sun, moon, and stars right down to the earth and its population of living creatures, including humans themselves. This second phase, a cosmological account in the traditional Presocratic mold, is what she here refers to as “the notions of mortals, in which there is no genuine conviction” (fr. 1.30).

The governing motif of the goddess' revelation is that of the “ways of inquiry.” In the all-important fragment 2, she specifies two such ways:

Come now, I shall tell—and convey home the tale once you have heard—/just which ways of inquiry alone there are for thinking:/ the one, that [it] is and that [it] is not not to be,/ is the path of conviction, for it attends upon true reality,/ [5] but the other, that [it] is not and that [it] must not be,/ this, I tell you, is a path wholly without report:/ for neither could you apprehend what is not, for it is not to be accomplished,/ nor could you indicate it. (Fr. 2)

The second way of inquiry is here set aside virtually as soon as it is introduced. The goddess goes on to refer back to the first way of inquiry and then speaks of another way as characteristic of mortal inquiry:

It is necessary to say and to think that What Is is; for it is to be,/ but nothing it is not. These things I bid you ponder./ For I shall begin for you from this first way of inquiry,/ then yet again from that along which mortals who know nothing/ [5] wander two-headed: for haplessness in their/ breasts directs wandering thought. They are borne along/ deaf and blind at once, bedazzled, undiscriminating hordes,/ who have supposed that it is and is not the same/ and not the same; but the path of all these turns back on itself. (Fr. 6, supplementing the lacuna at the end of fr. 6.3 with arxô and taking s' earlier in the line as an elision of soi, as per Nehamas 1981, 103-5; cf. the similar proposal at Cordero 1984, ch. 3, expanding parts of Cordero 1979.)

Here the goddess again articulates the division of her revelation into the two major phases first announced at the end of fragment 1. Compare her subsequent pronouncement at the point of transition from the first phase's account of reality to the second phase's cosmology: “At this point I cease for you the trustworthy account and thought/ about true reality; from this point on mortal notions/ learn, listening to the deceptive order of my verses” (fr. 8.50-2).

Clearly, the goddess' account of “true reality” proceeds along the first way of inquiry introduced in fragment 2. Some have thought the cosmology proceeds along the second way of inquiry introduced at fr. 2.5, on the ground that the two ways introduced in fragment 2 appear to be presented as the only conceivable ways of inquiry. However, the way presented in fragment 6, as that along which wanders the thought of mortals “who have supposed that it is and is not the same and not the same” (fr. 6.7-8a), involves an intermingling of being and not-being altogether different from what one sees in the way of inquiry earlier specified as “that [it] is not and that [it] must not be” (fr. 2.5). Fragment 6 thus appears to be introducing a third and different way, one not to be identified with fragment 2's second way, which has already been set aside. The same mixture of being and non-being likewise features in the goddess' warning to Parmenides in fragment 7 not to allow his thought to proceed along the way typical of mortal inquiries: “…for this may never be made manageable, that things that are not are./ But you from this way of inquiry restrain your thought,/ and do not let habit born of much experience force you along this way,/ to employ aimless sight and echoing hearing/ [5] and tongue. But judge by reason the strife-filled critique/ I have delivered” (fr. 7). Some have thought that here the goddess's last directive signals that some argument, with identifiable premises and conclusion, has been presented in the preceding verses. She in fact appears to be indicating that her harsh criticism of the inapprehension of ordinary humans, resulting from their exclusive reliance on the senses, has been designed to keep Parmenides firmly planted on the first way of inquiry.

2.3 The Way of Conviction

The goddess begins her account of “true reality,” or what is to be discovered along this first path, as follows: “As yet a single tale of a way/ remains, that it is; and along this path markers are there/ very many, that What Is is ungenerated and deathless,/ whole and uniform, and still and perfect …” (fr. 8.1-4). What Is (to eon) has by this point become a name for what Parmenides will form a fuller conception of by following the goddess' directions. These now include the programmatic description here in fr. 8.3-4 of the attributes What Is will be shown to have in the ensuing arguments. Thanks primarily to Simplicius' transcription, we still possess in its entirety the portion of Parmenides' poem comprising the goddess' revelation of the nature of “true reality.” This account constitutes one of the philosophical tradition's earliest, most extensive, and most important stretches of metaphysical reasoning.

The arguments here proceed methodically in accordance with the program announced at fr. 8.3-4. The goddess begins by arguing, in fr. 8.5-21, that What Is must be “ungenerated and deathless”:

[5] … but not ever was it, nor yet will it be, since it is now together entire,/ single, continuous; for what birth will you seek of it?/ How, whence increased? From not being I shall not allow/ you to say or to think: for not to be said and not to be thought/ is it that it is not. And indeed what need could have aroused it/ [10] later rather than before, beginning from nothing, to grow?/ Thus it must either be altogether or not at all./ Nor ever from not being will the force of conviction allow/ something to come to be beyond it: on account of this neither to be born/ nor to die has Justice allowed it, having loosed its bonds,/ [15] but she holds it fast. And the decision about these matter lies in this:/ it is or it is not; but it has in fact been decided, just as is necessary,/ to leave the one unthought and nameless (for no true/ way is it), and <it has been decided> that the one that it is indeed is genuine./ And how could What Is be hereafter? And how might it have been?/ [20] For if it was, it is not, nor if ever it is going to be:/ thus generation is extinguished and destruction unheard of.

Fr. 8.5-6a, at the outset here, have often been taken as a declaration that What Is has some type of timeless existence. Given, hoever, that this verse and a half opens a chain of continuous argumentation, claiming that What Is does not come to be or pass away, these words are probably better understood as a declaration of What Is's uninterrupted existence.

Continuing on, in fr. 8.22-5 the goddess presents a much briefer argument for What Is's being “whole and uniform”: “Nor is it divided, since it is all alike;/ and it is not any more there, which would keep it from holding together,/ nor any worser, but it is all replete with What Is./ [25] Therefore it is all continuous: for What Is approaches What Is.” Then, at fr. 8.26-33, she argues that it is “still” or motionless:

And unmoved within the limits of great bonds/ it is unbeginning unending, since generation and destruction/ have wandered quite far away, and genuine conviction has expelled them./ And remaining the same, in the same place, and on its own, it rests,/ [30] and thus steadfast right there it remains; for powerful Necessity/ holds it in the bonds of a limit, which encloses it all around,/ wherefore it is right that What Is be not unfulfilled; for it is not lacking: if it were, it would lack everything.

Finally, at fr. 8.42-9 (which Ebert 1989 has shown originally followed immediately after fr. 8.33, verses 34-41 having suffered transposition from their original position following verse 52), the goddess concludes by arguing that What Is must be “perfect,” before transitioning to the second phase of her revelation:

But since there is a furthest limit, it is perfected/ from every side, like the bulk of a well-rounded globe,/ from the middle equal every way: for that it be neither any greater/ [45] nor any smaller in this place or in that is necessary;/ for neither is there non-being, which would stop it reaching/ to its like, nor is What Is such that it might be more than What Is/ here and less there. Since it is all inviolate,/ for it is equal to itself from every side, it extends uniformly in limits.

2.4 The Way of Mortals

We have decidedly less complete evidence for the revelation's second phase, Parmenides' cosmology. The direct evidence provided by the last lines of fragment 8 (50-64) and by the other fragments plausibly assigned to this portion of the poem (frs. 9 through 19) originally accounted for perhaps only ten percent of the cosmology's original length. Since a number of these fragments are programmatic, we still have a good idea of some of the major subjects it treated. From the end of fragments 8 and fragments 9 through 15a we know that these included accounts of the cosmos' two basic principles, light and night, and then of the origin, nature, and behavior of the heavens and their inhabitants, including the stars, sun, moon, the Milky Way, and the earth itself. Witness the programmatic remarks of fragments 10 and 11:

You will know the aither's nature, and in the aither all the/ signs, and the unseen works of the pure torch/ of the brilliant sun, and from whence they came to be,/ and you will learn the wandering works of the round-eyed moon/ [5] and its nature, and you will know too the surrounding heaven,/ both whence it grew and how Necessity directing it bound it/ to furnish the limits of the stars. (Fr. 10)

…how the earth and sun and moon/ and the shared aither and the heavenly milk and Olympos/ outermost and the hot might of the stars began/ to come to be. (Fr. 11)

A few fragments, including one known only via Latin translation, show that Parmenides also dealt with the physiology of reproduction (frs. 17-18) and with human thought (fr. 16). Fortunately, the sketchy picture of the cosmology furnished by the fragments is significantly improved by the testimonia. The impression given by the fragments of the range of subjects is confirmed by both Simplicius, who comments after quoting fr. 11 that Parmenides' account of the genesis of things extended down to the parts of animals (Simp. in Cael. 559.26-7), and likewise by Plutarch's judgment that Parmenides' cosmology has so much to say about the earth, heaven, sun, moon, and stars, right down to the genesis of human beings, that it omits none of the major subjects typically treated by ancient natural philosophers (Plu. Col. 1114B-C). A particularly important testimonium in the doxographer Aëtius paraphrases, explicates, and supplements fr. 12 in ways that give us a better picture of the structure of Parmenides' cosmos (Aët. 2.7.1 = 28A37a Diels-Kranz). Likewise, Theophrastus' comments on fragment 16 at De Sensibus 1-4 appear to provide more information about Parmenides' views on cognition. The ancient testimonia tend to confirm that Parmenides sought to explain an incredibly wide range of natural phenomena, including especially the origins and specific behaviors of both the heavenly bodies and the terrestrial population. One fundamental problem for developing a coherent view of Parmenides' philosophical achievement has been how to understand the relation between the two major phases of the goddess' revelation.

3. Some Principal Types of Interpretation

While Parmenides is generally recognized as having played a major role in the development of ancient Greek natural philosophy and metaphysics, fundamental disagreement persists about the upshot of his philosophy and thus about the precise nature of his influence. Sections 3.1 through 3.3 of what follows describe in brief outline the types of interpretation that have played the most prominent roles in the development of broader narratives for the history of early Greek philosophy. These sections do not purport to present a comprehensive taxonomy of modern interpretations, nor do they make any attempt to reference all the representatives and variants of the principal types of interpretation here described. They are not meant to be a history of modern Parmenides interpretation, as worthy and fascinating a topic as that is. Since some advocates of the interpretations outlined in sections 3.1 to 3.3 have claimed to find ancient authority for their views via selective appeal to certain facets of the ancient Parmenides reception, it will be worthwhile indicating what was in fact the prevailing view of Parmenides in antiquity. After doing so in section 3.4, the final section of this article will outline a type of interpretation that takes the prevailing ancient view more seriously while responding to at least one major problem it encounters in the fragments.

3.1 The Strict Monist Interpretation

A good many interpreters have taken the poem's first major phase as an argument for strict monism, or the paradoxical view that there exists exactly one thing, and for this lone entity's being totally unchanging and undifferentiated. On this view, Parmenides considers the world of our ordinary experience non-existent and our normal beliefs in the existence of change, plurality, and even, it seems, our own selves to be entirely deceptive. Although less common than it once was, this type of view still has its adherents and is probably familiar to many who have only a superficial acquaintance with Parmenides.

The strict monist interpretation is influentially represented in the first two volumes of W. K. C. Guthrie's A History of Greek Philosophy, where it is accorded a critical role in the development of early Greek natural philosophy from the purported material monism of the early Milesians to the pluralist physical theories of Empedocles, Anaxagoras, and the early atomists, Leucippus and Democritus. On Guthrie's strict monist reading, Parmenides' deduction of the nature of reality led him to conclude “that reality [is], and must be, a unity in the strictest sense and that any change in it [is] impossible” and therefore that “the world as perceived by the senses is unreal” (Guthrie 1965, 4-5). Finding reason and sensation to yield wildly contradictory views of reality, he presumed reason must be preferred and sensory evidence thereby rejected as altogether deceptive. Parmenides' strict monism, on Guthrie's view, took particular aim at the monistic material principles of Milesian cosmology:

[Parmenides] argues with devastating precision that once one has said that something is, one is debarred from saying that it was or will be, of attributing to it an origin or a dissolution in time, or any alteration or motion whatsoever. But this was just what the Milesians had done. They supposed that the world had not always existed in its present cosmic state. They derived it from one substance, which they asserted to have changed or moved in various ways—becoming hotter or colder, drier or wetter, rarer or denser—in order to produce the present world-order. (Guthrie 1965, 15-16)

A particular focus of Parmenides' criticism, on this view, was Anaximander's idea that the opposites are initially latent within the originative principle he called “the Boundless” (to apeiron) prior to being separated out from it: if these opposite characteristics existed prior to being separated out, then the Boundless was not a true unity, but if they did not exist prior to being separated out, then how could they possibly come into existence? It is thus illegitimate to suppose that everything came into being out of one thing (Guthrie 1962, 86-7). In addition to thus criticizing the theoretical viability of the monistic material principles of the early Milesian cosmologists, Parmenides also is supposed to have criticized the Milesian union of the material and moving cause in their principles by arguing that motion and change are impossible and inadmissible conceptions (Guthrie 1965, 5-6, 52).

As we have seen, Parmenides' insistence on the point that whatever is, is, and cannot ever not be leads him to be harshly critical of the ordinary run of mortals who rely on their senses in supposing that things are generated and undergo all manner of changes. Parmenides directs us to judge reality by reason and not to trust the senses. Reason, as deployed in the intricate, multi-staged deduction of fragment 8, reveals what attributes whatever is must possess: whatever is must be ungenerated and imperishable; one, continuous and indivisible; and motionless and altogether unchanging, such that past and future are meaningless for it. This is “all that can be said about what truly exists,” and reality is thus revealed as “something utterly different from the world in which each one of us supposes himself to live,” a world which is nothing but a “deceitful show” (Guthrie 1965, 51). Parmenides nonetheless proceeded in the second part of his poem to present an elaborate cosmology along traditional lines, thus presenting readers with the following crux: “Why should Parmenides take the trouble to narrate a detailed cosmogony when he has already proved that opposites cannot exist and there can be no cosmogony because plurality and change are inadmissible conceptions?” (Guthrie 1965, 5). Guthrie suggests that Parmenides is “doing his best for the sensible world…by giving as coherent an account of it as he can,” on the practical ground that our senses continue to deceive us about its existence: “His account of appearances will excel those of others. To ask ‘But if it is unreal, what is the point of trying to give an account of it at all?’ is to put a question that is not likely to have occurred to him” (Guthrie 1965, 5 and 52).

3.2 The Logical-Dialectical Interpretation

One problem with Guthrie's view of Parmenides is that the supposition that Parmenides' strict monism was developed as a critical reductio of Milesian material monism sits uncomfortably with the notion that he actually embraced this wildly counter-intuitive metaphysical position. There is the same type of tension in the outmoded proposals that Parmenides was targeting certain supposedly Pythagorean doctrines (a view developed in Raven 1948 and ensconced in Kirk and Raven 1957). Even as Guthrie was writing the first two volumes of his History, a shift was underway toward understanding Parmenides' arguments as driven by strictly logical considerations rather than by any critical agenda with respect to the theories of his Ionian or Pythagorean predecessors. Here the watershed event was the publication of G. E. L. Owen's “Eleatic Questions” (Owen 1960). Owen found inspiration in Bertrand Russell for his positive interpretation of Parmenides' argument in fragment 2, the essential point of which Owen took to be that what can be talked or thought about exists.

Russell's treatment of Parmenides in his A History of Western Philosophy was conditioned by his own abiding concern with the problems of analysis posed by negative existential statements. The essence of Parmenides' argument, according to Russell, is as follows:

When you think, you think of something; when you use a name, it must be the name of something. Therefore both thought and language require objects outside themselves. And since you can think of a thing or speak of it at one time as well as another, whatever can be thought of or spoken of must exist at all times. Consequently there can be no change, since change consists in things coming into being or ceasing to be (Russell 1945, 49).

Here the unargued identification of the subject of Parmenides' discourse as “whatever can be thought of or spoken of” prefigures Owen's identification of it as “whatever can be thought and talked about,” with both deriving from fr. 2.7-8. There follows in Russell's History an exposition of the problems involved in speaking meaningfully about (currently) non-existent subjects, such as George Washington or Hamlet, after which Russell restates the first stage of Parmenides' argument as follows: “if a word can be used significantly it must mean something, not nothing, and therefore what the word means must in some sense exist” (Russell 1945, 50). So influential has Russell's understanding been, thanks in no small part to Owen's careful development of it, that it is not uncommon for the problem of negative existential statements to be referred to as “Parmenides' paradox.”

The arguments of fragment 8, on this view, are then understood as showing that what can be thought and talked about is, surprisingly, without variation in time and space, that is, absolutely one and unchanging. Owen adapted an image from Wittgenstein in characterizing these arguments, ones which “can only show the vacuousness of temporal and spatial distinctions by a proof which employs them,” as “a ladder which must be thrown away when one has climbed it” (Owen 1960, 67). Owen also vigorously opposed the assumption that “Parmenides wrote his poem in the broad tradition of Ionian and Italian cosmology,” arguing that Parmenides claims no measure of truth or reliability for the cosmogony in the latter part of his poem and that his own arguments in the “Truth” (i.e., the “Way of Conviction”) neither derive from this earlier tradition nor depict the cosmos as spherical in shape (Owen 1960, 48). On Owen's reading, not so very differently from Guthrie's, Parmenides' cosmology is “no more than a dialectical device,” that is, “the correct or the most plausible analysis of those presuppositions on which ordinary men, and not just theorists, seem to build their picture of the physical world,” these being “the existence of at least two irreducibly different things in a constant process of interaction,” whereas Parmenides' own arguments have by this point shown both the plurality and change this picture presupposes to be unacceptable (Owen 1960, 50 and 54-5).

Owen's view of Parmenidean metaphysics as driven by primarily logical concerns and of his cosmology as no more than a dialectical device would have a deep influence on the two most important surveys of Presocratic thought since Guthrie—Jonathan Barnes's The Presocratic Philosophers (19791, 19822) and Kirk, Raven, and Schofield's The Presocratic Philosophers (19832). While abandoning the idea that Parmenidean monism was a specific reaction to the theories of any of his predecessors, these two works continue to depict his impact on later Presocratic systems as decisive. On their Owenian line, the story becomes that the arguments of Parmenides and his Eleatic successors were meant to be generally destructive of all previous cosmological theorizing, in so far as they purported to show that the existence of change, time, and plurality cannot be naively presumed. Parmenides' arguments in fragment 8 effectively become, for advocates of this line, a generalized rather than a specific reductio of early Greek cosmological theorizing. Barnes, furthermore, responded to an objection that had been raised against Owen's identification of Parmenides' subject as whatever can be talked and thought about—namely, that this identification derives from the reason given at fr. 2.7-8 for rejecting the second path of inquiry, whereas an audience could not be expected to understand this to be the goddess' subject when she introduces the first two ways of inquiry in fr. 2.3 and 2.5. Barnes modified Owen's identification of Parmenides' subject so that it might be found in the immediate context, specifically in the implicit object of fr. 2.2's description of the paths as “ways of inquiry”; thus, according to Barnes, the first path “says that whatever we inquire into exists, and cannot not exist” (Barnes 1982, 163). Barnes's modified Owenian line has since been endorsed by prominent interpreters (including Schofield in Kirk, Raven, and Schofield 1983, 245; cf. Brown 1994, 217). Barnes also advanced the more heterodox proposal that Parmenides was not necessarily a monist at all, arguing that the fragments are compatible with the existence of a plurality of “Parmenidean Beings” (Barnes 1979, cf. Untersteiner 1955). While this proposal has had fewer adherents among other interpreters favoring the Russell-Owen line, it has been taken up by certain advocates of the next type of interpretation.

3.3 The Meta-Principle Interpretation

One influential alternative to interpretations of Parmenides as a strict monist, certainly among scholars working in America, has been that developed by Alexander Mourelatos in his 1970 monograph, The Route of Parmenides. (See Mourelatos 1979 for a succinct presentation of this alternative in response to perceived shortcomings in Owen's logical-dialectical reading.) Mourelatos saw Parmenides as utilizing a specialized, predicative sense of the verb “to be” in speaking of “what is”: this is used to reveal a thing's nature or essence. This sense of the verb, dubbed by Mourelatos “the ‘is' of speculative predication,” is supposed to feature in statements of the form, “X is Y,” where the predicate “belongs essentially to, or is a necessary condition for, the subject” and thus gives X's reality, essence, nature, or true constitution (Mourelatos 1970, 56-60). Alexander Nehamas would likewise propose that Parmenides employs “is” in the very strong sense of “is what it is to be,” so that his concern is with “things which are F in the strong sense of being what it is to be F” (Nehamas 1981, 107; although Nehamas cites Owen as well as Mourelatos as an influence, Owen himself took Parmenides' use of the verb “to be” in “what is” as existential [see Owen 1960, 94]). On the resulting type of interpretation, the first major phase of Parmenides' poem provides a higher-order account of what the fundamental entities of any ontology would have to be like: they would have to be F, for some F, in this specially strong way. As such, it is not an account of what there is (namely, one thing, the only one that exists) but, rather, of whatever is in the manner required to be an ontologically fundamental entity—a thing that is F, for some F, in an essential way. Thus Nehamas has more recently written:

the “signposts” along the way of Being which Parmenides describes in B 8 [may be taken] as adverbs that characterize a particular and very restrictive way of being. The signposts then tell us what conditions must be met if a subject is to be something in the appropriate way, if it is to be really something, and thus be a real subject. And to be really something, F, is to be F—B 8 tells us—ungenerably and imperishably, wholly, only and indivisibly, unchangingly, perfectly and completely. … Parmenides uses “being” to express a very strong notion, which Aristotle eventually was to capture with his concept of “what it is to be.” To say of something that it is F is to say that F constitutes its nature (Nehamas 2002, 50).

A variant of the meta-principle interpretation, one that also draws upon Barnes's suggestion that nothing in the “Truth” precludes there being a plurality of Parmenidean Beings, has been developed by Patricia Curd. On her view, Parmenides was not a strict monist but, rather, a proponent of what she terms “predicational monism,” which she defines as “the claim that each thing that is can be only one thing; it can hold only the one predicate that indicates what it is, and must hold it in a particularly strong way. To be a genuine entity, a thing must be a predicational unity, with a single account of what it is; but it need not be the case that there exists only one such thing. Rather, the thing itself must be a unified whole. If it is, say, F, it must be all, only, and completely F. On predicational monism, a numerical plurality of such one-beings (as we might call them) is possible” (Curd 1998, 66).

Mourelatos, Nehamas, and Curd all take Parmenides to be concerned with specifying in an abstract way what it is to be the nature or essence of a thing, rather than simply with specifying what there in fact is, as he is presumed to be doing on both the logical-dialectical and the more traditional strict monist readings. Since the meta-principle reading takes Parmenides' major argument in fragment 8 to be programmatic instead of merely paradoxical or destructive, it suggests a somewhat different narrative structure for the history early Greek philosophy, one where the so-called “post-Parmenidean pluralists”—Empedocles, Anaxagoras, and the early atomists, Leucippus and Democritus—were not reacting against Parmenides, but actually endorsing his requirements that what really is be ungenerated, imperishable, and absolutely changeless, when they conceived of the principles of their respective physical systems in these terms. The meta-principle reading has also seemed to re-open the possibility that Parmenides was engaged in critical reflection upon the principles of his predecessors' physical systems. (This possibility is thoroughly explored in Graham 2006.)

If the first phase of Parmenides' poem provides a higher-order description of the features that must belong to any proper physical principle, then one would naturally expect the ensuing cosmology to deploy principles that meet Parmenides' own requirements. The goddess describes the cosmology, however, as an account of “the beliefs of mortals, in which there is no genuine conviction” (fr. 1.30, cf. fr. 8.50-2) and commences this part of her revelation by describing how mortals have wandered astray by picking out two forms, light and night, to serve as the basis for an account of the cosmos' origin and operation (fr. 8.53-9). Advocates of the meta-principle reading here face a dilemma. On the one hand, they cannot plausibly maintain that the cosmology is what their overall interpretation would lead one to expect, namely Parmenides' own effort at developing a cosmology in accordance with his own strictures upon what the principles of such an account must be like. The cosmological principles light and night do not in fact conform to those strictures (pace Graham 2006, 170-1). But then why should Parmenides have bothered to present a fundamentally flawed or “near-correct” cosmology, founded upon principles that fail to satisfy the very requirements he himself has supposedly specified? Curd responds to this problem by falling back to the position that the poem's cosmology is not really Parmenides' own but one targeted against the use of opposites in previous cosmological theories (Curd 1998, ch. 3).

The presence of the cosmology in Parmenides' poem continues to be problematic for advocates of the meta-principle interpretation. just as it is for advocates of the other major types of interpretation discussed thus far. Guthrie views the cosmology as Parmenides' best attempt at giving an account of the sensible world, given that we will continue to be deceived into thinking it exists despite his arguments to the contrary. Not only is this an unstable interpretive position, it imputes confusion to Parmenides rather than acknowledge its own difficulties. It is hardly more satisfying to be told by Owen that Parmenides' cosmology has a purpose that is “wholly dialectical”:

Parmenides set himself to give the correct or the most plausible analysis of those presuppositions on which ordinary men, and not just theorists, seem to build their picture of the physical world. … Whittled down to their simplest and most economical they can be seen still to require the existence of at least two irreducibly different things in a constant process of interaction; and both the plurality and the process have now, on Parmenides' view, been proven absurd. (Owen 1960, 54-5; cf. Long 1963 for a more detailed development of this line.)

Although they repeat the essentials of Owen's view, Kirk, Raven, and Schofield finally acknowledge that the presence of the elaborate cosmology remains problematic for this line of interpretation: “Why [the cosmology] was included in the poem remains a mystery: the goddess seeks to save the phenomena so far as is possible, but she knows and tells us that the project is impossible” (Kirk, Raven, and Schofield 1983, 262, after advancing the Owenian line on the cosmology's dialectical character at 254-6). While the meta-principle interpretation raises the expectation, which fails to be met, that the principles of Parmenides' own cosmology in the poem will conform to the requirements he has supposedly specified earlier in the poem, the strict monist and logical-dialectical interpretations leave even some of their own advocates wondering why Parmenides devoted the bulk of his poem to an account of things his own reasoning is supposed to have shown do not exist.

3.4 The Aspectual Interpretation Prevailing in Antiquity

The idea that Parmenides' arguments so problematized the phenomenon of change as to make developing an adequate theoretical account of it the central preoccupation of subsequent Presocratic natural philosophers is a commonplace of modern historical narratives. Unfortunately, this notion has no real ancient authority. Aristotle's account at Physics 1.8.191a23-33 of the wrong turn he claims earlier natural philosophers took in trying to understand the principles of change has often been thought to legitimate this view, given the Eleatic-sounding argument it records. But Aristotle mentions Parmenides nowhere in the passage, and his complaint is in fact broadly directed against all the early Greek philosophers whose views he has been surveying previously in the book. This is the complaint that they naively adopted the view that no fundamental entity or substance comes to be or perishes, the result being that they are unable to account for, because they disavow, substantial change, which is the very phenomenon Aristotle is most interested in explaining. Aristotle actually understands Parmenides' thesis that what is is one (hen to on) and not subject to generation and change as belonging, not to natural philosophy, but to first philosophy or metaphysics (Cael. 3.1.298b14-24; cf. Metaph. 1.5.986b14-18, Ph. 1.2.184a25-b12).

In the complex treatment of Parmenides in Physics 1.2-3, Aristotle introduces Parmenides together with Melissus as representing the position, within the Gorgianic doxographical schema structuring his own examination of earlier archê-theories, that there is a single and unchanging archê or principle (Ph. 1.2.184b15-16). Aristotle recognizes, however, that this grouping obscures very real differences between the two thinkers' views. According to Aristotle, Melissus held that everything is a single, i.e. continuous or indivisible, and unlimited quantity (or extension). Parmenides, on Aristotle's reconstruction, recognized only a use of “being” indicating what something is in respect of its substance or essence; he accordingly supposed that everything that is is substance, and he supposed everything to be one in the sense that the account of the essence of everything is identical. Furthermore, on Aristotle's view of Parmenides, whatever might differentiate what is cannot do so with respect to its essence but only accidentally. But no accident of what just is can belong to its essence, and since Parmenides admits only a use of “being” indicating what something is in respect of its substance or essence, no differentiating accident of what is can be said to be. Such is the thrust of Aristotle's reconstruction of Parmenides' reasoning at Physics 1.3.186a34-b4 and, likewise, of his summary allusion to this passage at Metaphysics 1.5.986b28-31.

The only point, in fact, where Aristotle's representation of Parmenides in Metaphysics 1.5 appears to differ from the major treatment in Physics 1.2-3 is in following up this summary with the qualification that, being compelled to go with the phenomena, and supposing that what is is one with respect to the account (sc. of its essence) but plural with respect to perception, he posited a duality of principles as the basis for his account of the phenomena (986b27-34, reading to on hen men at 986b31, as per Alexander of Aphrodisias's paraphrase). This is only a superficial difference, given how at Physics 1.5.188a19-22 Aristotle points to the Parmenidean duality of principles to support his thesis that all his predecessors had made the opposites principles, including those who maintained that everything is one and unchanging. Nonetheless, the representation of Parmenides' position in Metaphysics 1.5, according to which what is is one with respect to the account of its essence but plural with respect to perception, is more indulgent than the reconstruction of Parmenides' reasoning in Physics 1.3 in that it allows for a differentiated aspect of what is. By allowing that what is may be differentiated with respect to its phenomenal qualities, Aristotle seems to have recognized at some level the mistake in assuming that Parmenides' failure to distinguish explicitly among the senses of “being” entails that he could only have employed the term in one sense.

Despite the assimilation of Melissus and Parmenides under the rubric inherited from Gorgias, Aristotle recognized that grouping the two figures together under this convenient label obscured fundamental differences in their positions. The fact is that “monism” does not denote a unique metaphysical position but a family of positions. Among its species are strict monism or the thesis that just one thing exists, which is the position that Melissus advocated and that no serious metaphysician should want to adopt. More familiar species include both numerical and generic substance monism, according to which, respectively, there is a single substance or a single kind of substance. Aristotle seems ultimately to have inclined toward attributing this first type of “generous” monism to Parmenides. In viewing Parmenides as a generous monist, whose position allowed for the existence of other entities, rather than as a “strict” monist holding that only one thing exists, Aristotle is in accord with the majority view of Parmenides in antiquity.

That some in antiquity viewed Parmenides as a strict monist is evident from Plutarch's report of the Epicurean Colotes' treatment of Parmenides in his treatise, That One Cannot Live According to the Doctrines of Other Philosophers. Colotes' main claim appears to have been that Parmenides prevents us from living by maintaining that “the universe is one” (hen to pan), which tag Colotes apparently took to mean that Parmenides denied the existence of fire and water and, indeed, “the inhabited cities in Europe and Asia”; he may also have claimed that if one accepts Parmenides' thesis, there will be nothing to prevent one from walking off a precipice, since on his view there are no such things (Plut. Col. 1114B). In short, as Plutarch reports, Colotes said that “Parmenides abolishes everything by hypothesizing that being is one” (1114D). Plutarch himself, however, takes strong issue with Colotes' view, charging him with imputing to Parmenides “disgraceful sophisms” (1113F) and with deliberate misconstrual (1114D). Plutarch explains that Parmenides was in fact the first to distinguish between the mutable objects of sensation and the unchanging character of the intelligible: “Parmenides…abolishes neither nature. Instead, assigning to each what is appropriate, he places the intelligible in the class of what is one and being—calling it 'being' in so far as it is eternal and imperishable, and 'one' because of its likeness unto itself and its not admitting differentiation—while he locates the perceptible among what is disordered and changing” (1114D). Plutarch insists that Parmenides' distinction between what really is and things which are what they are at one time, or in one context, but not another should not be misconstrued as an abolition of the latter class of entities: “how could he have let perception and doxa remain without leaving what is apprehended by perception and doxa?” (1114E-F). Plutarch's discussion of Parmenides in Against Colotes is particularly significant in that it is a substantial discussion of the relation between his account of Being and his cosmology by an ancient author later than Aristotle that is not overtly influenced by Aristotle's own discussions. In many ways it anticipates the Neoplatonic interpretation, represented in Simplicius, according to which, broadly speaking, the two accounts delivered by Parmenides' goddess describe two levels of reality, the immutable intelligible realm and the plural and changing sensible realm (see especially Simplicius's commentary on Arist. Cael. 3.1.298b14-24; cf. Procl. in Ti. 1.345.18-24).

Later Platonists naturally understood Parmenides as thus anticipating Plato, for Plato himself seems to have adopted a “Platonist” understanding of this philosopher whose influence on his philosophy was every bit as profound as that of Socrates and the Pythagoreans. Aristotle attributes to both Parmenides and Plato the recognition that knowledge requires as its objects certain natures or entities not susceptible to change—to Parmenides in De Caelo 3.1, and to Plato, in remarkably similar language, in Metaphysics 13.4. The arguments at the end of Republic 5 that confirm Aristotle's attribution of this line of reasoning to Plato are in fact suffused with echoes of Parmenides. Plato likewise has his fictionalized Parmenides present something very close to this line of argument in the dialogue bearing his name: “if someone will not admit that there are general kinds of entities…and will not specify some form for each individual thing, he will have nowhere to turn his intellect, since he does not admit that there is a character for each of the things that are that is always the same, and in this manner he will destroy the possibility of discourse altogether” (Prm. 135b5-c2). The Platonic “natures” Aristotle has in mind are clearly the Forms that Plato himself is prone to describing in language that echoes the attributes of Parmenidean Being, most notably at Symposium 210e-211b and Phaedo 78d and 80b. That Plato's Forms are made to look like a plurality of Parmenidean Beings might seem to supply Platonic authority for the meta-principle interpretation. This would be a rash conclusion, however, for Plato consistently represents Parmenides as a monist in later dialogues (see, e.g., Prm. 128a8-b1, d1, Tht. 180e2-4, 183e3-4, Sph. 242d6, 244b6). Determining just what type of monism Plato means to attribute to Parmenides in these dialogues ultimately requires plunging into the intricacies of the examination of Parmenides' thesis in the latter part of the Parmenides.

There Plato's understanding of Parmenides is best reflected in the exploration of his thesis in the Second Deduction. There the One is shown to have a number of properties that reflect those Parmenides himself attributed to Being in the course of fr. 8: that it is in itself and the same as itself, that it is at rest, that it is like itself, that it is in contact with itself, etc. In the Second Deduction, all these properties prove to belong to the One in virtue of its own nature and in relation to itself. This deduction also shows that the One has apparently contrary attributes, though these prove to belong to it in other aspects, that is, not in virtue of its own nature and/or not in relation to itself. Plato would have found a model for his complex account of the various and seemingly conflicting properties of the One in the two majors phases of Parmenides' poem, if he, too, subscribed to an “aspectual” interpretation of Parmenides, according to which the Way of Conviction describes the cosmos in its intelligible aspect qua being, while allowing that this description is compatible with an alternate description of this self-same entity as a world system comprised of differentiated and changing objects. These two perspectives are notably reflected, respectively, in the Timaeus's descriptions of the intelligible living creature and of the visible cosmos modelled upon it, both of which are suffused with echoes of Parmenides (see especially Ti. 30d2, 31a7-b3, 32c5-33a2, 33b4-6, d2-3, 34a3-4, b1-2, and 92c6-9).

That Aristotle also viewed the two major phases of Parmenides' poem as dual accounts of the same entity in different aspects is perhaps most apparent in his characterization of Parmenides, in the course of the discussion at Metaphysics 1.5.986b27-34, as having supposed that “what is is one in account but plural with respect to perception.” Theophrastus likewise seems to have adopted such a line. Alexander of Aphrodisias quotes him as having written the following of Parmenides in the first book of his On the Natural Philosophers:

Coming after this man [sc. Xenophanes], Parmenides of Elea, son of Pyres, went along both paths. For he both declares that the universe is eternal and also attempts to explain the generation of the things that are, though without taking the same view of them both, but supposing that in accordance with truth the universe is one and ungenerated and spherical in shape, while in accordance with the view of the multitude, and with a view to explaining the generation of things as they appear to us, making the principles two, fire and earth, the one as matter and the other as cause and agent (Alex.Aphr. in Metaph. 31.7-16; cf. Simp. in Ph. 25.15-16, D.L. 9.21-2).

Many of Theophrastus's points here can be traced back to Aristotle, including the identification of Parmenides' elemental light and night as, respectively, fire functioning as an efficient principle and earth functioning as a material principle (cf. Arist. Ph. 1.5.188a20-2, GC 1.3.318b6-7, 2.3.330b13-14, Metaph. 1.5.986b28-987a2). The passage on the whole suggests that, like Plato and Aristotle, Theophrastus understood Parmenides as furnishing dual accounts of the universe, first in its intelligible and then in its phenomenal aspects.

While it would be going too far to claim that Plato, Aristotle, Theophrastus, and the ancient thinkers who follow their broad view of Parmenides as a generous monist got Parmenides right on all points, nonetheless the impulse toward “correcting” (or just ignoring) the ancient evidence for Presocratic thought has in this case gone too far. Both Plato and Aristotle understood Parmenides as perhaps the first to have developed the idea that apprehension of what is unchanging is of a different order epistemologically than apprehension of things subject to change. More fundamentally, Plato and Aristotle both came to understand Parmenides as a type of generous monist whose conception of what is belongs more to theology or first philosophy than to natural science. This involved understanding Parmenides' cosmology as his own account of the world in so far as it is subject to change. It also involved understanding the first part of Parmenides' poem as metaphysical, in the proper Aristotelian sense of being concerned with what is not subject to change and enjoys a non-dependent existence. Most importantly, both Plato and Aristotle recognized that a distinction between the fundamental modalities or ways of being was central to Parmenides' system. None of these major points is tainted by the kind of obvious anachronism that rightly makes one suspicious, for instance, about Aristotle's identification of Parmenides' light and night with the elements fire and earth. None of these broad points, in other words, involves Plato or Aristotle viewing Parmenides through the distortive lens of their own concepetual apparatus. The next section will outline the view of Parmenides' philosophical achievement that results from attending to his modal distinctions and to the epistemological distinctions he builds upon them.

3.5 The Modal Interpretation

Numerous interpreters have variously resisted the idea that Parmenides meant to deny the very existence of the world we experience. They have consequently advocated some more robust status for the cosmological portion of his poem. (See, e.g., Minar 1949, Woodbury 1958, Chalmers 1960, Clark 1969, Owens 1974, Robinson 1979, de Rijk 1983, and Finkelberg 1986, 1988, and 1999, and Hussey 1990.) Unfortunately, too many interpretations of this type deploy the terms “reality,” “phenomena,” and “appearance” so ambiguously that it can be difficult to tell whether they intend to attribute an objective or merely some subjective existence to the inhabitants of the “phenomenal” world. More positively, a number of these interpreters have recognized the important point that the two parts of the goddess' revelation are presented as having different epistemic status. (See also the proposal at Kahn 1969, 710 and n. 13, to identify Parmenides' subject in the Way of Conviction as “the object of knowing, what is or can be known.”) They have nonetheless failed to take proper account of the modal distinctions that define Parmenides' presentation of the ways of inquiry. In this omission they are not alone, of course, since none of the types of interpretation reviewed so far recognizes that Parmenides was the first philosopher rigorously to distinguish what must be, what must not be, and what is but need not be.

In the crucial fragment 2, the goddess says she will describe for Parmenides “which ways of inquiry alone there are for thinking” (fr. 2.2). The common understanding of this as tantamount to the only conceivable ways of inquiry has been one of the principal spurs for readings according to which only two, not three, paths feature in the poem, for it is natural to wonder how the goddess can present fragment 2's two paths as the only conceivable paths of inquiry and nonetheless in fragment 6 present still another path, that along which mortals are said to wander. Two-path interpretations respond to this apparent difficulty by identifying the path of mortal inquiry with fragment 2's second path (though implausibly so, as noted above, sect. 2.2). Parmenides' goddess in fact has good reason to distinguish the two ways of inquiry presented in fragment 2 from the way subsequently presented in fragment 6. The two ways of fragment 2, unlike the third way, are marked as ways “for thinking,” that is, for achieving the kind of thought that contrasts with the “wandering thought” the goddess later says is characteristic of mortals. The use of the Greek datival infinitive in the phrase, “there are for thinking” (eisi noêsai, fr. 2.2b; cf. Empedocles fr. 3.12 for the identical construction) distinguishes the two ways introduced in this fragment from the one subsequently introduced in fragment 6, as ways for thinking. That the goal is specifically thought that does not wander becomes clear when she subsequently presents the third way as one followed by “mortals who know nothing” (fr. 6.4), which leads to “wandering thought” (plagkton nöon, fr. 6.6). Comparison with fr. 8.34-6a's retrospective indication that “thought” or “thinking” (noêma, to noein), by which is apparently meant trustworthy thought (cf. fr. 8.50), has been a major goal of the inquiry suggests that a way for thinking is one along which this goal of attaining trustworthy thought might be achieved.

The two ways of inquiry that lead to thought that does not wander are: “that [it] is and that [it] is not not to be” (fr. 2.3)—i.e., “that [it] is and that [it] cannot not be”—and “that [it] is not and that [it] must not be” (fr. 2.5). Each verse appears to demarcate a distinct modality or way of being. One might find it natural to call these modalities, respectively, the modality of necessary being and the modality of necessary non-being or impossibility. Parmenides conceives of these modalities as ways of being or ways an entity might be rather than as logical properties. If one respects the organizing metaphor of the ways of inquiry, one can, even at this stage of the goddess' revelation, appreciate what it means for “that [it] is and that [it] cannot not be” to define a way of inquiry. This specification indicates that what Parmenides is looking for is what is and cannot not be—or, more simply, what must be. Pursuing this way of inquiry requires maintaining a constant focus on the modality of the object of his search as he tries to attain a fuller conception of what an entity that is and cannot not be, or that must be, must be like. To remain on this path Parmenides must resolutely reject any conception of the object of his search that proves incompatible with its mode of being, as the goddess reminds him at numerous points.

What one looks for along this path of inquiry is what is and cannot not be, or, more simply, what must be. It is therefore appropriate to think of the first path as the path of necessary being and of what lies along it as what is (what it is) necessarily. What is and cannot not be will be whatever is (what it is) actually throughout the history of this world. Likewise, what is not and must not be will be whatever is not (anything) actually at any moment in the world's history. There are of course other ways for things to be, but not, according to Parmenides, other ways for things to be such that apprehension of them will figure as thought that does not wander. The second way is introduced alongside the first because the modality of necessary non-being or impossibility specified in fr. 2.5 is just as constant and invariable as the modality of necessary being specified in fr. 2.3. Whatever thought there may be about what lies along this second way will be unwavering and, as such, will contrast with the wandering thought typical of mortals. Even if the effort to think about what lies along the second way ends (as it does) in a total failure of apprehension, this non-apprehension remains unwavering. Inquiry along the second way involves, first, keeping in mind that what one is looking for is not and must not be, and thereby trying to discover what an entity that is in this way must be like. It is immediately evident, though, what an entity that is not and must not be is like: nothing at all. The goddess warns Parmenides not to set out on the second way because there is no prospect of finding or forming any conception of what must not be. She thus tells Parmenides at fr. 2.6 that this is a path where nothing at all can be learned by inquiry.

Paying proper attention to the modal clauses in the goddess' specification of the first two ways of inquiry enables us to understand the last two verses of fragment 2 as making a sound philosophical point rather than committing a fallacy, however famous or interesting that fallacy might be. She says, again, at fr. 2.7-8:“neither could you apprehend what is not, for it is not to be accomplished,/ nor could you indicate it.” Here she is warning Parmenides against proceeding along the second way, and it should be clear that “what is not” (to mê on) is the goddess' way of referring to what is in the manner specified just two verses above: “that [it] is not and that [it] must not be” (fr. 2.5). She declares that Parmenides could neither know nor indicate “what is not” by way of explaining her assertion in the preceding verse that the second way is a way wholly without report. Thus here “what is not” (to mê on) serves as shorthand for “what is not and must not be.” (Given the awkwardness of having to deploy the phrase “what is not and must not be” whenever referring to what enjoys the second way's mode of being, one would expect Parmenides to have employed such a device even if he had written in prose.) Parmenides is making a sound philosophical point. One cannot, in fact, form any definite conception of what is not and must not be, and a fortiori one cannot indicate it in any way. (Try to picture a round square, or to point one out to someone else.) Parmenides has not fallen prey here to the purportedly paradoxical character of negative existential statements but makes a perfectly acceptable point about the inconceivability of what necessarily is not. Any philosopher with an interest in the relation between conceivability and possibility should be prepared to recognize in Parmenides' assertion that you could neither apprehend nor indicate what is not (and must not be) one of the earliest instances of a form of inference—that from inconceivability to impossibility—that continues to occupy a central position in metaphysical reasoning.

Before undertaking to guide Parmenides toward a fuller conception of what is and cannot not be, the goddess properly warns him away from a third possible path of inquiry in fragments 6 and 7, while at the same time reminding him of the imperative to think of what is in the manner specified in fr. 2.3 only as being (what it is). Fragment 6 begins with the goddess instructing Parmenides that it is necessary to say and think that “What Is” (to on) is, and that he is not to think of it as not being. (Here to on functions as a shorthand designation for what is and cannot not be, paralleling fr. 2.7's use of to mê on or “what is not” as shorthand for what is not and must not be.) This is the essential directive for following her guidance along the first path of inquiry. The goddess also indicates in this fragment that the second major phase of her revelation will proceed along the path typically pursued by mortals whose reliance upon sensation has yielded only wandering thought. She provides what amounts to a modal specification of this path of inquiry when she describes mortals as supposing “that it is and is not the same/ and not the same” (fr. 6.8-9a). The sense of this difficult clause seems to be that mortals mistakenly suppose that an object of genuine understanding may be subject to the variableness implicit in their conception of it as being and not being the same, and being and not being not the same. This is not to say that the things upon which ordinary humans have exclusively focused their attention, because of their reliance upon sensation, do not exist. It is merely to say that they do not enjoy the mode of necessary being required of an object of unwandering thought. The imagery in fr. 6.4-7 that paints mortals as wandering blind and helpless portrays them as having failed entirely to realize that there is something that must be and that this is available for them to apprehend if only they could awaken from their stupor. Even so, the goddess does not say that mortals have no apprehension. Thought that wanders is still thought.

The goddess, however, reveals to Parmenides the possibility of achieving thought that does not wander or that is stable and unchanging, because its object itself is such. The third way of inquiry can never lead to this, and thus it is not presented by the goddess as a path of inquiry for thinking. It directs the inquirer's attention to things that are (what they are) only contingently or temporarily: they are and then again are not, or they are a certain way and then again are not that way. The problem with this path is not, as too many interpreters have understood it to be, that nothing exists to be discovered along this way. There are innumerably many things that are (and exist) in the manner specified at fr. 6.8-9a (and fr. 8.40-1). However, since their being is merely contingent, Parmenides thinks there can be no stable apprehension of them, no thoughts about them that remain steadfast and do not wander, and thus no true or reliable conviction. According to Parmenides, genuine conviction cannot be found by focusing one's attention on things that are subject to change. This is why he has the goddess repeatedly characterize the cosmology in the second phase of her revelation as deceptive or untrustworthy. The modal interpretation thus makes it relatively straightforward to understand the presence of the poem's cosmology. It is an account of the principles, origins, and operation of the world's mutable population. It is Parmenides' own account, the best he was able to provide, and one firmly in the tradition of Presocratic cosmology. At the same time, however, Parmenides supposed there was more to the world than all those things that have grown, now are, and will hereafter end (as he describes them in fragment 19). There is also what is (what it is) and cannot not be (what it is).

The first major phase of the goddess' revelation in fragment 8 is, on the modal interpretation, a meditation on the nature of what must be. The goddess leads Parmenides to form a conception of what whatever must be has to be like just in virtue of its modality. Appreciating that Parmenides is concerned with determining what can be inferred about the nature or character of What Is simply from its mode of being enables one to see that he is in fact entitled to the inferences he draws in the major deductions of fragment 8. Certainly what must be cannot have come to be, nor can it cease to be. Both possibilities are incompatible with its mode of being. Likewise, what must be cannot change in any respect, for this would involve its not being what it is, which is also incompatible with its mode of being, since what must be must be what it is. On the assumption, inevitable at the time, that it is a spatially extended or physical entity, certain other attributes can also be inferred. What must be must be free from any internal variation. Such variation would involve its being something or having a certain character in some place(s) while being something else or having another character in others, which is incompatible with the necessity of its (all) being what it is. For much the same reason, it must be free from variation at its extremity. Since the only solid that is uniform at its extremity is a sphere, what must be must be spherical.

It is difficult to see what more Parmenides could have inferred as to the character of what must be simply on the basis of its modality as a necessary being. In fact, the attributes of the main program have an underlying systematic character suggesting they are meant to exhaust the logical possibilities: What Is both must be (or exist), and it must be what it is, not only temporally but also spatially. For What Is to be (or exist) across times is for it to be ungenerated and deathless; and for it to be what it is across times is for it to be “still” or unchanging. For What Is to be (or exist) everywhere is for it to be whole. For it to be what it is at every place internally is for it to be uniform; and to be so everywhere at its extremity is for it to be “perfect” or “complete.” Taken together, the attributes shown to belong to what must be amount to a set of perfections: everlasting existence, immutability, the internal invariances of wholeness and uniformity, and the invariance at its extremity of being optimally shaped. What Is has thus proven to be not only a necessary but, in many ways, a perfect entity.

On the modal interpretation, Parmenides may be counted a “generous” monist. While he reasons that there is only one entity that must be, he also sees that there are manifold entities that are but need not be (what they are). Parmenides was a “generous” monist because the existence of what must be does not preclude the existence of all the things that are but need not be. There are at least two options for envisaging how this is supposed to be the case. Some who have understood Parmenides as a generous monist have adopted a view similar to Aristotle's. In Metaphysics 1.5, Aristotle remarks that Parmenides seems to have had a conception of formal unity (986b18-19), and he gives a compressed account of the reasoning by which he takes Parmenides to have arrived at such a conception (986b27-31). Then, as already noted, he adds the comment that Parmenides, being compelled to go with the phenomena, and supposing that what is is one with respect to the account (sc. of its essence) but plural with respect to perception, posited a duality of principles as the basis for his account of the phenomena (986b27-34). Thus, for Aristotle, Parmenides held that what is is one, in a strong and strict sense, but it is also many (in and for perception). A number of modern interpreters have also advocated some form of what amounts to the ancient “aspectual” view of the relation between the two phases of the goddess' revelation. (See Owens 1974 and Finkelberg 1999, who explicitly position their views as heirs to that at Arist. Metaph. 1.5.986b27-34.) Parmenides would certainly have been a generous monist if he envisioned What Is as consubstantial with the cosmos's perceptible and mutable population. But an apparently insurmountable difficulty for this response comes in the suggestive verses of fr. 4: “but behold things that, while absent, are steadfastly present to thought:/ for you will not cut off What Is from holding fast to What Is,/ neither dispersing everywhere every way in a world-order (kata kosmon)/ nor drawing together.”

It thus seems preferable to understand What Is as coterminous but not consubstantial with the perceptible cosmos: it is in exactly the same place where the perceptible cosmos is, but is a separate and distinct “substance.” (Note the parallels between fr. 8.30b-31 and fr. 10.5-7, as well as between fr. 8.24 and fr. 9.3.) On this view, What Is imperceptibly interpenetrates or runs through all things while yet maintaining its own identity distinct from theirs. Something like this seems to be how Anaxagoras envisioned the relation between Mind and the rest of the world's things: Mind, he says, “is now where also all the others are, in that which surrounds many things and in those which have accreted and in those which have separated out” (Anaxag. fr. 14). Parmenides' vision of the relation between What Is and the developed cosmos, as coterminous but not consubstantial, also has its analogue in Xenophanes' conception of the relation between his one greatest god and the cosmos, as well as in Empedocles' conception of the divinity that is the persistent aspect of the cosmos' perfectly unified condition, darting throughout the cosmos with its swift thought. Both appear to be coterminous but not consubstantial with the cosmos they penetrate.

Although What Is in Parmenides has its nearest analogue in these divine principles, Parmenides himself never in the extant fragments calls What Is divine or otherwise suggests that it is a god. Instead, he develops an exhaustive conception of what that which must be, must be like, by systematically pursuing the fundamental idea that what must be both must be or exist, and must be what it is, not only temporally but also spatially. Whatever other attributes it might have that cannot be understood to belong to it in one of these ways do not enter into Parmenides' conception of What Is. Thus it has none of the features of the religious tradition's heavenly gods that persist as attributes of Xenophanes' greatest god, despite resembling it in other respects. If Xenophanes can be seen as a founder of rational theology, then Parmenides' distinction among the principal modes of being and his derivation of the attributes that must belong to what must be, simply as such, qualify him to be seen as the founder of metaphysics or ontology as a domain of inquiry distinct from theology.


References to items prior to 1980 are much more selective than those to more recent items. For a nearly exhaustive and annotated listing of Parmenidean scholarship down to 1980, consult L. Paquet, M. Roussel, and Y. Lafrance, Les Présocratiques: Bibliographie analytique (1879-1980), vol. 2 (Montreal: Bellarmin/Paris: Les Belles Lettres, 1989): 19-104.

Primary Sources

The standard collection of the fragments of the Presocratics and sophists, together with testimonia pertaining to their lives and thought, remains:

The principal editions or other presentation of the fragments of Parmenides' poem and testimonia include:

Secondary Sources

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Related Entries

monism | Presocratic Philosophy | Xenophanes | Zeno of Elea


This entry draws substantially upon J. Palmer, Parmenides and Presocratic Philosophy (forthcoming), where the modal interpretation sketched here is developed and defended at much greater length.