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Presocratic Philosophy

First published Sat Mar 10, 2007

The Presocratics were 6th and 5th century BCE Greek thinkers who introduced a new way of thinking about the world and the place of human beings in it. They were recognized in antiquity as the first philosophers and scientists of the Western tradition. This article is a general introduction to the most important Presocratic philosophers and the main themes of Presocratic thought. More detailed discussions can be found by consulting the articles on these philosophers (and related topics) in the SEP (listed below). The standard collection of texts for the Presocratics is that by H. Diels revised by W. Kranz (abbreviated as DK). In it, each thinker is assigned an identifying chapter number (e.g., Heraclitus is 22, Anaxagoras 59); then the reports from ancient authors about that thinker's life and thought are collected in a section of “testimonies” (A) and numbered in order, while the passages the editors take to be direct quotations are collected and numbered in a section of “fragments” (B). Alleged imitations in later authors are sometimes added in a section labeled C. Thus, each piece of text can be uniquely identified: DK 59B12.3 identifies line 3 of Anaxagoras fragment 12; DK 22A1 identifies testimonium 1 on Heraclitus.

1. Who Were the Presocratic Philosophers?

Our understanding of the Presocratics is complicated by the incomplete nature of our evidence. Most of them wrote at least one “book” (short pieces of prose writing, it seems, or, in some cases, poems of not great length), but no complete work survives. Instead, we are dependent on later philosophers, historians, and compilers of collections of ancient wisdom for disconnected quotations (fragments) and reports about their views (testimonia). In some cases, these sources had direct access to the works of the Presocratics, but in many others, the line is indirect and often depends on the work of Aristotle, Theophrastus, and other ancient philosophers who did have access. The sources for the fragments and testimonia made selective use of the material available to them, in accordance with their own special, and varied, interests in the early thinkers. (For analyses of the doxographic tradition, and the influence of Aristotle and Theophrastus on later sources, see Mansfeld 1999, Runia forthcoming, and Mansfeld and Runia 1997.) Although any account of a Presocratic thinker has to be a reconstruction, we should not be overly pessimistic about the possibility of reaching a historically responsible understanding of these early Greek thinkers.

Calling this group “Presocratic philosophers” raises certain difficulties. (The term was made current by Hermann Diels in the nineteenth century.) “Presocratic,” if taken strictly as a chronological term, is not quite accurate, for the last of them were contemporaneous with Socrates and even Plato. The term also may suggest that these thinkers are somehow inferior to Socrates and Plato, of interest only as their predecessors, and its suggestion of archaism may imply that philosophy only becomes interesting when we arrive at the classical period of Plato and Aristotle. Some scholars now deliberately avoid the term, but if we take it to refer to the early Greek thinkers who were not influenced by the views of Socrates, whether his predecessors or contemporaries, there is probably no harm in using it. (For discussions of the notion of Presocratic philosophy, see Long's introduction in Long 1999, Laks 2006, articles in Laks and Louguet 2002.)

A second problem lies in referring to these thinkers as philosophers. That is almost certainly not how they could have described themselves. While it is true that Heraclitus says that “those who are lovers of wisdom must be inquirers into many things” (22B35), the word he uses, philosophos, does not have the special sense that it acquires in the works of Plato and Aristotle, when the philosopher is contrasted with both the ordinary person and other experts, including the sophist (particularly in Plato), or in the resulting modern sense in which we can distinguish philosophy from physics or psychology; yet the Presocratics certainly saw themselves as set apart from the ordinary person and also from other thinkers (poets and historical writers, for example) who were their predecessors and contemporaries. As the fragment from Heraclitus shows, the early Greek philosophers thought of themselves as inquirers into many things, and the range of their inquiry was vast. They had views about the nature of the world, and these views encompass what we today call physics, chemistry, geology, meteorology, astronomy, embryology, and psychology (and other areas of natural inquiry), as well as theology, metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics. In the earliest of the Presocratics, the Milesians, it can indeed be difficult to discern the strictly philosophical aspects of the views in the evidence available to us. Nevertheless, despite the danger of misunderstanding and thus underestimating these thinkers on account of anachronism, there is an important sense in which it is quite reasonable to refer to them as philosophers. That sense is inherent in Aristotle's view (see, e.g., Met. I, Phys. I, De Anima I): these thinkers were his predecessors in a particular sort of inquiry, and even though Aristotle thinks that they were all, for one reason or another, unsuccessful and even amateurish, he sees in them a similarity such that he can trace a line of continuity of both subject and method from their work to his own. The questions that the early Greek philosophers asked, the sorts of answers that they gave, and the views that they had of their own inquiries were the foundation for the development of philosophy as it came to be defined in the work of Plato and Aristotle and their successors. Perhaps the fundamental characteristic is the commitment to explain the world of nature in terms of its own inherent principles.

By contrast, consider the 7th century BCE poem of Hesiod, his Theogony (genealogy of the gods). Hesiod tells the traditional story of the Olympian gods, beginning with Chaos, a vague divine primordial entity or condition. From Chaos, a sequence of gods is generated, often by sexual congress, but sometimes no particular cause is given. Each divine figure that arises is connected with a part of the physical universe, so his theogony is also a cosmogony (an account of the generation of the world). The divinities (and the associated parts of the world) come to be and struggle violently among themselves; finally Zeus triumphs and establishes and maintains an order of power among the others who remain. Hesiod's world is one in which the major divinities are individuals who behave like super-human beings (Gaia or earth, Ouranos or sky, Cronos — an unlocated regal power, Zeus); some of the others are personified characteristics (e.g., blame, want). For the Greeks, the fundamental properties of divinity are immortality and power, and each of Hesiod's characters has these properties (even though in the story some are defeated, and seem to be destroyed). Hesiod's story is like a vast Hollywood-style family history, with envy, rage, love, and lust all playing important parts in the coming-to-be of the world as we know it. The earliest rulers of the universe are violently overthrown by their offspring (Ouranos is overthrown by Cronos, Cronos by Zeus). Zeus insures his continued power by swallowing his first consort Metis (counsel or wisdom); by this he prevents the predicted birth of rivals and acquires her attribute of wisdom (Works and Days 886–900). In a second poem, Works and Days, Hesiod pays more attention to human beings, telling the story of earlier, greater creatures who died out or were destroyed by themselves or Zeus. Humans were created by Zeus, are under his power, and are subject to his judgment and to divine intervention for either good or ill. (A good discussion of the Hesiodic myths in relation to Presocratic philosophy can be found in McKirahan 1994.)

Hesiod's world, like Homer's, is one that is god-saturated, where the gods may intervene in all aspects of the world, from the weather to mundane particulars of human life, reaching into the natural world order from outside, in a way that humans must accept but cannot ultimately understand. The Presocratics reject this account, instead seeing the world as a kosmos, an ordered natural arrangement that is inherently intelligible and not subject to supra-natural intervention. A striking example is Xenophanes 21B32: “And she whom they call Iris, this too is by nature cloud / purple, red, and greeny yellow to behold.” Iris, the rainbow, traditional messenger of the gods, is after all, not supra-natural, not a sign from the gods on Olympus who are outside the natural world order; rather it is, in its essence, colored cloud.

Calling the Presocratics philosophers also suggests that they share a certain outlook with one another; an outlook that is to be contrasted with that of other early Greek writers. Although scholars disagree about the extent of the divergence between the early Greek philosophers and their non-philosophical predecessors and contemporaries, it seems evident that Presocratic thought exhibits a significant difference not only in its understanding of the nature of the world, but also in its view of the sort of explanation of it that is possible. This is evident in Heraclitus. Although Heraclitus asserts that those who love wisdom must be inquirers into many things, inquiry alone is not sufficient. At 22B40 he rebukes four of his predecessors: “Much learning does not teach understanding; else it would have taught Hesiod and Pythagoras, and again Xenophanes and Hecataeus.” Heraclitus' implicit contrast is with himself; in 22B1 he suggests that he alone truly understands all things, because he grasps the account that enables him to “distinguish each thing in accordance with its nature” and say how it is. For Heraclitus there is an underlying principle that unites and explains everything. It is this that others have failed to see and understand. According to Heraclitus, the four have amassed a great deal of information — Hesiod was a traditional source of information about the gods, Pythagoras was renowned for his learning and especially views about how one ought to live, Xenophanes taught about the proper view of the gods and the natural world, Hecataeus was an early historian — but because they have failed to grasp the deeper significance of the facts available to them, their unconnected bits of knowledge do not constitute understanding. Just as the world is an ordered arrangement, so human knowledge of that world must be ordered in a certain way.

2. The Milesians

In his account of his predecessors' searches for “causes and principles” of the natural world and natural phenomena, Aristotle says that Thales of Miletus (a city in Ionia, on the west coast of what is now Turkey) was the first to engage in such inquiry. He seems to have lived around the beginning of the 6th c. BC. Aristotle mentions that some more ancient persons placed great importance on water (Metaphysics 983b27–33), like Thales himself, and then later raises the question of whether perhaps Hesiod was the first to look for a cause of motion and change (984b23ff.). These suggestions are rhetorical: Aristotle does not seriously imply that the poets he mentions are engaged in the same sort of inquiry as he thinks Thales was. Two other Greek thinkers from this very early period, Anaximander and Anaximenes, were also from Miletus, and although the ancient tradition that the three were related as master and pupil may not be correct, there are enough fundamental similarities in their views to justify treating them together.

The tradition claims that Thales predicted a solar eclipse in 585 BC (11A5), introduced geometry into Greece from Egypt (11A11), and produced some engineering marvels; Anaximander is reported to have invented the gnomon, that raised piece of a sundial whose shadow marks time (12A1), and to have been the first to draw a map of the inhabited world (12A6). Regardless of whether these reports are correct (and in the case of Thales' prediction they almost certainly are not), they indicate something important about the Milesians: their interests in measuring and explaining celestial and terrestrial phenomena were as strong as their concern with the more abstract inquiries into the causes and principles of substance and change that Aristotle attributes to them (Algra 1999, White forthcoming). They did not see the scientific and philosophical questions as belonging to separate disciplines, requiring distinct methods of inquiry. The assumptions and principles that we (along with Aristotle) see as constituting the philosophical foundations of their theories are, for the most part, implicit in the claims that they make. Nevertheless, it is legitimate to treat the Milesians as having philosophical views, even though no clear statements of these views or specific arguments for them can be found in the surviving fragments and testimonia.

Aristotle's comments do not sound as if they were based on first-hand knowledge of Thales' views, and the doxographical reports say that Thales did not write a book. Yet Aristotle is confident that Thales belongs, even if honorifically, to that group of thinkers that he calls “inquirers into nature” and distinguishes him from earlier poetical “myth-makers.” In Book I of the Metaphysics, Aristotle claims that the earliest of these, among whom he places the Milesians, explained things only in terms of their matter (Met. I.3 983b6–18). This claim is anachronistic in that it presupposes Aristotle's own novel view that a complete explanation must encompass four factors: what he called the formal, material, efficient, and final causes. Yet there is something in what Aristotle says. In his discussion, Aristotle links Thales' claim that the world rests on water with the view that water was the archē, or fundamental principle, and he adds that “that from which they come to be is a principle of all things” (983b24–25; 11A12). He suggests that Thales chose water because of its fundamental role in coming-to-be, nutrition, and growth, and claims that water is the origin of the nature of moist things.

Aristotle's general assertion about the first thinkers who gave accounts of nature (and his specific discussion of Thales' reliance on water as a first principle) brings out a difficulty in interpreting the early Presocratics. According to Aristotle's general account, the Presocratics claimed that there was a single enduring material stuff that is both the origin of all things and their continuing nature. Thus, on this view, when Thales says that the first principle is water, he should be understood as claiming both that the original state of things was water and that even now (despite appearances), everything is really water in some state or another. The change from the original state to the present one involves changes in the material stuff such that although it may not now appear to be water everywhere (but seems to be airier or earthier than water in its usual state, or its original one), there is no transformation of water into a different kind of stuff (air or earth, for instance). Yet, when Aristotle comes to give what details he can of Thales' view, he suggests only that for Thales, water was the first principle because everything comes from water. Water, then, was perhaps the original state of things for Thales, and water is a necessary condition for everything that is generated naturally, but Aristotle's summary of Thales' view does not imply that Thales claimed that water endures through whatever changes have occurred since the original state, and now just has some new or additional properties. Thales may well have thought that certain characteristics of the original water persisted: in particular its capacity for motion (which must have been innate in order to generate the changes from the original state). This is suggested by Thales' reported claims that the lodestone (with its magnetic properties) and amber (which when rubbed exhibits powers of attraction through static electricity) have souls and that all things are full of gods. Aristotle surmises that Thales identified soul (that which makes a thing alive and thus capable of motion) with something in the whole universe, and so supposed that everything was full of gods (11A22)—water, or soul, being a divine natural principle. Certainly the claim that the lodestone has soul suggests this account. Given that the analysis of change (both qualitative and substantial) in terms of a substratum that gains and loses properties is Aristotelian (although perhaps foreshadowed in Plato), it is not surprising that the earlier views were unclear on this issue, and it is probable that the Milesian view did not distinguish the notions of an original matter and an enduring underlying stuff.

The reports about Thales show him employing a certain kind of explanation: ultimately the explanation of why things are as they are is grounded in water as the basic stuff of the universe and the changes that it undergoes through its own inherent nature. In this, Thales marks a radical change from all other previous sorts of accounts of the world (both Greek and non-Greek). Like the other Presocratics, Thales sees nature as a complete and self-ordering system, and sees no reason to call on divine intervention from outside the natural world to supplement his account—water itself may be divine, but it is not something that intervenes in the natural world from outside. While the evidence for Thales' naturalistic account is circumstantial, this attitude can be directly verified for Anaximander.

In the one fragment that can be securely attributed to Anaximander (although the extent of the implied quotation is uncertain), he emphasizes the orderly nature of the universe, and indicates that the order is internal rather than imposed from outside. Simplicius, a 6th c. CE commentator on Aristotle's Physics, writes:

Of those who say that [the first principle] is one and moving and indefinite, Anaximander, son of Praxiades, a Milesian who became successor and pupil to Thales, said that the indefinite (to apeiron) is both principle (archē) and element (stoicheion) of the things that are, and he was the first to introduce this name of the principle. He says that it is neither water nor any other of the so-called elements, but some other indefinite (apeiron) nature, from which come to be all the heavens and the worlds in them; and the things from which is the coming-to-be for the things that exist are also those into which is their passing-away, in accordance with what must be. For they give penalty (dikê) and recompense to one another for their injustice (adikia) in accordance with the ordering of time—speaking of them in rather poetical terms. It is clear that having seen the change of the four elements into each other, he did not think it fit to make some one of these underlying subject, but something else, apart from these. (Simplicius, Commentary on Aristotle's Physics 24, lines 13ff. = 12A9 and B1)[1]

Thus, there is an original indefinite stuff, from which all the heavens and the worlds in them come to be. This claim probably means that the original state of the universe was an indefinitely large mass of stuff that was also indefinite in its character.[2] This stuff then gave rise through its own inherent power to the ingredients that themselves constitute the world as we perceive it.

A testimony about Anaximander from Pseudo-Plutarch (12A10) says that “Something productive of hot and cold was separated off from the eternal at the genesis of this world and from this a sphere of flame grew around the air around the earth like the bark around a tree.” Neither the cause nor the precise process of separation is explained, but it is probable that Anaximander would have thought of the original source of change as part of the character of the indefinite itself. The passage from Simplicius shows that Anaximander does not think that the eternal indefinite stuff gives rise directly to the cosmos as we know it. Rather, the apeiron somehow generates the opposites hot and cold. Hot and cold are themselves stuffs with powers; and it is the actions of these stuffs/powers that produce the things that come to be in our world. The opposites act on, dominate, and contain each other, producing a regulated structure; thus things pass away into those things from which they came to be. It is this structured arrangement that Anaximander refers to when he speaks of justice and reparation. Over the course of time, the cycles of the seasons, the rotations of the heavens, and other sorts of cyclical change (including coming-to-be and passing-away) are regulated and thus form a system. This system, ruled by the justice of the ordering of time is in sharp contrast with the chaotic and capricious world of the personified Greek gods who interfere in the workings of the heavens and in the affairs of human beings (Kahn 1985a, Vlastos 1947, Guthrie 1962).

The pattern that can be seen in Thales and Anaximander of an original basic stuff giving rise to the phenomena of the cosmos continues in the views of the third of the Milesians, Anaximenes. He replaces Anaximander's apeiron with air, thus eliminating the first stage of the coming-to-be of the cosmos (the something productive of hot and cold). Rather, he returns to an originating stuff more like Thales' water. In 13A5, Aristotle's associate Theophrastus, quoted by Simplicius, speculates that Anaximenes chose air because he agreed that a basic principle must be neutral (as Anaximander's apeiron is) but not so lacking in properties that it seems to be nothing at all. Air can apparently take on various properties of color, temperature, humidity, motion, taste, and smell. Moreover, according to Theophrastus, Anaximenes explicitly states the natural mechanism for change; it is the condensation and rarefaction of air that naturally determine the particular characters of the things produced from the originating stuff. Rarified, air becomes fire; more and more condensed, it becomes progressively wind, cloud, water, earth, and finally stones. “The rest,” says Theophrastus, “come to be from these.” Plutarch says that condensation and rarefaction are connected with cooling and heating, and he gives the example of breath (13B1). Releasing air from the mouth with compressed lips produces cool air (as in cooling soup by blowing on it), but relaxed lips produce warm air (as when one blows on cold hands to warm them up).

Does the original stuff persist through the changes that it undergoes in the generating processes? Aristotle's account suggests that it does, that Anaximenes, for instance, would have thought that stone was really air, although in an altered state, just as we might say that ice is really water, cooled to a point where it goes from a liquid to a solid state. Because the water does not cease to be water when it is cooled and becomes ice, it can return to a liquid when heated and then become a gas when more heat is applied. On this view, the Milesians were material monists, committed to the reality of a single material stuff that undergoes many alterations but persists through the changes (Barnes 1979, Guthrie 1962). Yet there are reasons to doubt that this was actually the Milesian view. It presumes that the early Greek thinkers anticipated Aristotle's general theory that change requires enduring underlying substances that gain and lose properties. The earliest Greeks thought more in terms of powers (Vlastos 1947, Heidel 1906), and the problem of what a substance is was yet to be addressed. Clearly the Milesians were interested in the original stuff from which the world was formed (Anaximander and Anaximenes are explicit about transformations of such an eternal original stuff), but the view that this endured as a single substratum may not have been theirs. Rather, it has been suggested by Graham (1997 and 2006) that the Milesians were not, in Aristotle's sense, material monists. On this view, the original substance is transformed into other substances. Anaximenes, for instance, may have thought that the change from air to water does not involve the persistence of air as any sort of substratum. There is no special role that air plays in the theory except that it is first in analysis of the law-like cyclical changes that produce various substances (Graham 2006, ch. 4). Such an interpretation suggests how different the Milesian conception of the world is from our own, or even from Aristotle's.

3. Xenophanes of Colophon and Heraclitus of Ephesus

Living in the last years of the 6th c. and the beginning of the 5th, Xenophanes and Heraclitus continue the Milesian interest in the nature of the physical world, and both offer cosmological accounts; yet they go further than the Milesians not only through their focus on the human subject and the expanded range of their physical explanations, but by investigating the nature of inquiry itself. Both explore the possibility of human understanding and question its limits. Recent work on Xenophanes' epistemology and his cosmology has made much of his scientific work clearer and more impressive (Lesher 1992, Mourelatos forthcoming). He has, to a great extent, been rescued from his traditional status as a minor traveling poet-sage who railed against the glorification of athletes and made some interesting comments about the relativity of human conceptions of the gods. Instead, he has come to be seen as an original thinker in his own right who influenced later philosophers trying to distinguish the realms of the human and the divine, and exploring the possibility that human beings can gain knowledge and wisdom, i.e., take a god's eye view of things.

Xenophanes claims that all meteorological phenomena are clouds, colored, moving, incandescent: rainbow, St. Elmo's Fire, the sun, the moon. Clouds are fed by exhalations from the land and sea (mixtures of earth and water). The motions of earth and water, and hence of clouds, account for all the things we find around us. His explanations of meteorological and heavenly phenomena lead to a naturalistic science:

She whom they call Iris, this too is by nature (pephuke) cloud
purple, and red, and greeny-yellow to behold. (21B32)

Xenophanes says that the star-like phenomena seen when aboard ship, which some call the Dioscuri, are cloudlets, glimmering because of their kind of motion. (A39)

In the 1980's Alexander Mourelatos argued that Xenophanes employs an important new pattern of explanation: X is really Y, where Y reveals the true character of X. Xenophanes signals this by the use of pephuke in B32, and no doubt it was there in the original of A39 as well. Xenophanes thus provides an account of a phenomenon often taken to be a sign from the divine—Iris as the messenger; the Dioscuri (St. Elmo's fire) as comfort for sailors—that reduces it to a natural occurrence.

That meteorological phenomena are not divine is not all that Xenophanes has to say about the gods. He notes anthropomorphic tendencies in conceptions of the gods (B14: “Mortals suppose that the gods are born, and have their own dress, voice, and body;” B16: “Ethiopians say that their gods are snub-nosed and dark, Thracians, that theirs are grey-eyed and red-haired”). He also famously suggests that horses, oxen, and lions would have equine, bovine, and leonine gods (B15). Yet Xenophanes also makes positive claims about the nature of the divine, including the claim that there is a single greatest god:

One god greatest among gods and men,
Resembling mortals neither in body nor in thought.
… whole [he] sees, whole [he] thinks, and whole [he] hears,
but completely without toil he agitates all things by the
   thought of his mind.
… always he remains in the same (state), agitated not at all,
nor is it fitting that he come and go to different places at different times. (B23, 24, 25, 26)

While indifferent to the affairs of human beings, Xenophanes' divine being understands and controls a cosmos that is infused with divine thinking, understood, organized, and managed by divine intellection. Moreover, B18 suggests that Xenophanes is optimistic about the capacities of human intelligence:

Indeed not even from the beginning did the gods indicate all things to mortals, but, in time, inquiring, they discover better.

Having already removed the gods as bearers of knowledge to humans, denying that the divine takes an active interest in what mortals can or cannot know, Xenophanes asserts the conclusion to be drawn from his naturalistic interpretation of phenomena: the gods are not going to reveal anything to us; we are epistemologically autonomous and must rely on our own capacity for inquiry. That way, we “discover better,” as he says (see Lesher 1991). This is an optimistic conclusion, suggesting that human thought can mimic divine understanding, at least to some degree. Xenophanes' own practice seems consistent with the claims of B18; his own inquiries and explanations led him to unified explanations of terrestrial and celestial phenomena. Yet B34 suggests skepticism:

And of course the clear and certain truth no man has seen,
nor will there be anyone who knows about the gods and what I say about all things;
for even if, in the best case, he should chance to speak what is the case,
all the same, he himself does not know; but opinion is found over all.

Whether this is global or limited skepticism is controversial (Lesher 1992 and 1994 argues for a limited interpretation). Xenophanes stresses the difficulty of coming to certainty, particularly about things beyond our direct experience.

Famously obscure, accused by Plato of incoherence and by Aristotle of denying the law of non-contradiction, Heraclitus writes in an aphoristic style, his apparently paradoxical claims presenting difficulties to any interpreter. Nevertheless, he raises important questions about knowledge and the nature of the world. The opening of Heraclitus' book refers to a “logos which holds forever.”[3] There is disagreement about exactly what Heraclitus meant by using the term logos, but it is clear from 22B1 and B2 as well as B50 and other fragments that he refers to an objective law-like principle that governs the cosmos, and which it is possible (but difficult) for humans to come to understand. There is a single order that directs all things (“all things are one” B50); this order is divine, and is sometimes connected by humans with the traditional gods (it is “both unwilling and willing to be called by the name of Zeus” B32). Just as Zeus, in the traditional view, controls from Olympus with a thunderbolt, so this single ordered system steers and controls the whole cosmos from within. The sign of the unchanging order of the eternal system is fire—just as fire is always changing and always the same, so with the logos that embodies the order and rules all things.

The plan or order that steers the cosmos is, itself, a rational order. This means not only that it is non-capricious and so intelligible (in the sense that humans can, at least in principle, come to understand it), it is also an intelligent system: there is an intelligent plan at work, if only in the sense of the cosmos working itself out in accordance with rational principles.[4] Consider B114:

Those who would speak with understanding must ground themselves firmly in that which is common to all, just as a city does in its law, and even more firmly! For all human laws are nourished by one law, the divine; for it rules as far at it wishes and suffices for all, and is still more than enough.

Heraclitus is claiming not just that human prescriptive law must harmonize with divine law, but also that divine law encompasses both the particular laws of men and the universal laws of the cosmos itself. The cosmos itself is an intelligent, eternal (and hence divine) system that orders and regulates itself in an intelligent way: the logos is the account of this self-regulation. We can come to grasp and understand at least part of this divine system. This is not merely because we ourselves are part of (contained in) the system, but because we have, through our capacity for intelligent thinking, the power to grasp the system as a whole, through knowing the logos. How this grasping is supposed to work is tantalizingly obscure.

Heraclitus regards the order of cosmos as like a language that can be read or heard and understood by those who are attuned to it. That language is not just the physical evidence around us (“Eyes and ears are bad witnesses to those with barbarian souls” B107); the sheer accumulation of information is not the same as wisdom (see the rebuke in 22B40, quoted above). Although the evidence of the senses is important (see the fragments on direct experience vs. hearsay), careful and thoughtful inquiry is also necessary. Those who are lovers of wisdom must be good inquirers into many things (B35; also B101: “I enquired into myself”), and must be able to grasp how the phenomena are signs or evidence of the larger order; as Heraclitus notes in B125, “nature is accustomed to hide itself,” and the evidence must be carefully interpreted. That evidence is the interplay of opposing states and forces, which Heraclitus points to by claims about the unity of opposites and the roles of strife in human life as well as in the cosmos. There are fragments that proclaim the unity or identity of opposites: the road up and down are one and the same (B60), the path of writing is both straight and crooked (B59), sea water is very pure and very foul (B61). The famous river fragments (B49a, B12, B91a) question the identity of things over time, while a number of fragments point to the relativity of value judgments (B9, B82, B102). Anaximander's system of just reciprocity ordered by time is replaced by a system governed by war: “It is right to know that war is common and justice strife, and that all things come to be through strife and are so ordained” (B80). The changes and alterations that constitute the processes of the cosmos are regular and capable of being understood by one who can speak the language of the logos and thus interpret properly. Although the evidence is confusing, it points to the deeper regularities that constitute the cosmos, just as Heraclitus' own remarks can seem obscure yet point to the truth. Heraclitus surely has his own message (and his delivery of it) in mind in B93, “The lord whose oracle is at Delphi neither speaks nor conceals, but gives a sign.”

4. Parmenides of Elea

Parmenides (born ca. 510 BCE in the Greek colony of Elea in southern Italy, south of Naples) explores the nature of philosophical inquiry, concentrating less on knowledge or understanding (although he has views about these) than on what can be understood. Xenophanes identified genuine knowledge with the grasping of the sure and certain truth and claimed that “no man has seen” it (21B34); Heraclitus has asserted that divine nature, not human, has right understanding (22B78). Parmenides argues that human thought can reach genuine knowledge or understanding, and that there can be certain marks or signs that act as guarantees that the goal of knowledge has been reached. A fundamental part of Parmenides' claim is that what must be (cannot not-be, as Parmenides puts it) is more knowable than what is merely contingent (what may or may not be), which can be the object only of belief.

Parmenides gives us a poem in Homeric hexameters, narrating the journey of a young man (a kouros, in Greek) who is taken to meet a goddess who promises to teach him “all things” (28B1). The content of the story the goddess tells is not the knowledge that will allow humans, by having it, to know. Rather, the goddess gives the kouros the tools to acquire that knowledge himself:

It is right that you learn all things,
Both the unshaking heart of well-persuasive truth,
and the beliefs of mortals, in which there is no true trust.
But nevertheless, you shall learn these things too, how it were right that the things that seem be reliably, being indeed the whole of things. (B1.28–32)

The goddess does not provide a list of true propositions, as a body of knowledge for him to acquire, and false ones to be avoided. Rather, in teaching the kouros how to evaluate claims about what-is, the goddess gives him the power to know all, by testing and evaluation, accepting or rejecting claims about the ultimate nature of things—that being what, and all that, is capable of being known. For Parmenides, the mark of what is known is that it is something that genuinely is, with no taint of what-is-not. That is why, for him, it not only is, but must be and cannot not-be. He sets this out in the key passages of B2 and B3:[5]

Come now, and I will tell you, and you, hearing, preserve the story,
the only routes of inquiry there are for thinking;
the one that it is and that it cannot not be
is the path of Persuasion (for it attends upon truth)
the other, that it is not and that it is right that it not be,
this I point out to you is a path wholly inscrutable
for you could not know what is not (for it is not to be accomplished)
nor could you point it out… For the same thing is for thinking and for being.

The routes are methods of inquiry: keeping on the correct route will bring one to what-is, the real object of thought and understanding. Although what the goddess tells the kouros has divine sanction (hers), that is not why he should accept it. Rather, the truth she tells reveals a mark of its own truth: it is testable by reason or thought itself. In B7 the goddess warns that we must control our thought in the face of the ever-present seductions of sense-experience:

For never shall this be forced through: that things that are not are;
but restrain your thought from this route of inquiry,
nor let much-experienced habit force you along this path,
to ply an aimless eye and resounding ear
and tongue, but judge by logos the much-battled testing
spoken by me.

The kouros himself can reach a decision or determination of the truth solely through use of his logos. Logos here means reasoning. It is probably not reason as a faculty that Parmenides intends here, but the reasoning aspect of noos, the capacity for thought in general. In any case, the test (restated at B8.15–16), is “is or is not?” – this is not just the question of non-contradiction (which would give us coherence), but whether or not the claim that something is entails, on further examination, the actual reality of what-is-not.

The arguments of B8 demonstrate how what-is must be, and in applying these arguments as tests against any suggested basic entity in the Presocratic search for ultimate causes or principles, the kouros can determine whether or not a proposed theory is acceptable. For Parmenides noos is not itself an infallible capacity. One can think well or badly; correct thinking is that which takes the correct route and so reaches what-is. The mortals on the incorrect route are thinking, but their thoughts have no real object (none that is real in the appropriate way), and so cannot be completed or perfected by reaching the truth. In B8 Parmenides sets out the criteria for what-is, and then the arguments for those criteria:

… a single account still
remains of the route that it is; and on this route there are
very many signs, that what-is is ungenerable and imperishable,
a whole of a single kind, and unshaking and complete;
nor was it nor will it be, since it is now all together
one, cohesive. (B8.1–6)

Any thing that genuinely is cannot be subject to coming-to-be or passing-away, must be of a single nature, and must be complete, in the sense of being unchangeably and unalterably what it is. These are signs for what any ultimate cause or principle must be like, if it is to be satisfactory as a principle, as something that can be known. The signs are adverbial, showing how what-is is (Mourelatos 1971). Only an entity which is in the complete way can be grasped and understood in its entirety by thought. McKirahan (forthcoming) provides a thorough analysis of the arguments of B8.

After laying out the arguments about what-is, the goddess turns to the route of mortals, in an account which she calls “deceptive.” Although Parmenides has been read as thus rejecting any possibility of cosmological inquiry (Barnes 1979, Owen 1960), there are persuasive interpretations that allow for justified belief about the contingent world, a world that may or may not be, and is not such that it must be (Nehamas 2002, Curd 2004). The problem of mortals is that they mistake what they perceive for what there is (and must be). As long as one realizes that the world of perception is not genuinely real, and cannot therefore be the object of knowledge, it may be possible for there to be justified belief about the cosmos. Some details of Parmenides' own cosmology are given, arguably as justified belief, in the Doxa section of the poem, and more in the testimonia from later authors. Parmenides marks a sharp distinction between being (what-is and must be) and becoming, and between knowledge and perception-based belief or opinion.

5. The Pythagorean Tradition

In the last quarter of the sixth century, Pythagoras of Samos (an Aegean island) arrived in Croton, in southern Italy. This was before Parmenides' birth. He established a community of followers who adopted his political views, which favored rule by the “better people,” and also the way of life he recommended on what seem to have been more or less philosophical bases. The traditional view has been that the aristocracy, the “better people,” generally meant the rich. But Burkert notes that as early as the 4th c. BCE there were two traditions about Pythagoras, one that meshes with the traditional view and associates Pythagoras with political tyrants, and another that credits him with rejecting tyrannies for aristocracies that might not have been grounded in wealth (Burkert 1972, 119). The Pythagorean Archytas (born late 5th century) lived in a democracy (Tarentum in southern Italy), and seems to have argued for fair and proportionate dealings between rich and poor (Huffman 2005). The Pythagorean way of life included adherence to certain prescriptions including religious rites and dietary restrictions (see the general discussion in Kahn 2001).

Like Socrates, Pythagoras wrote nothing himself, but had a great influence on those who followed him. He had a reputation for great learning and wisdom (see Empedocles 31B129), although he was treated satirically by both Xenophanes (21B7) and Heraclitus (22B40, B129). We do not know to what extent this included knowledge of mathematics, as would be suggested by the attribution to him of the famous Pythagorean theorem of geometry. The details of Pythagoras' views are unclear, but he seems to have advocated the immortality of the soul (a novel idea among the Greeks) and the possibility of the transmigration of the human soul after death into other animal forms. Pythagorean writers after his own time stressed the mathematical structure and order of the universe. This is often attributed directly to Pythagoras (primarily because of the geometrical theorem that bears his name), but recent scholarship has shown that the evidence for attributing this mathematically-based cosmology to Pythagoras himself is convoluted and doubtful (Burkert 1972, Huffman 1993 and 2005; but see Zhmud 1997).

What seems clear is that the early Pythagoreans conceived of nature as a structured system ordered by number (see the SEP entry on Pythagoras), and that such post-Parmenidean Pythagoreans as Philolaus (last half of the 5th century, more than a generation after Pythagoras' death) and Archytas (late 5th to early 4th century) held more complicated views about the relation between mathematics and cosmology than it is reasonable to suppose Pythagoras himself could have advanced. The Pythagorean tradition thus includes two strains. There are reports of a split in the period after Pythagoras' death between what we would term the more philosophically inclined Pythagoreans and others who primarily adopted the Pythagorean ethical, religious and political attitudes. The latter, called the acusmatici, followed the Pythagorean precepts, or acusmata (which means “things heard”). The former, the philosophical Pythagoreans (including Philolaus and Archytas), were the called mathematici, and while they recognized that the acusmatici were indeed Pythagoreans by virtue of accepting Pythagorean precepts, they claimed that they themselves were the true followers of Pythagoras.

Philolaus of Croton seems to have blended the Pythagorean life with an awareness of and appreciation for the arguments of Parmenides (Huffman 1993). According to Philolaus, “Nature in the cosmos was fitted together out of unlimiteds and limiters” (44B1). These limiters and unlimiteds play the role of Parmenidean basic realities—they are and unchangingly must be what they are, and so can be known; they are joined together in a harmonia (literally, a carpenter's joint; metaphorically, a harmony), and “it was not possible for any of the things that are and are known by us to come to be, without the existence of the being of things from which the cosmos was put together” (44B6). The unlimiteds are unstructured stuffs and continua; the limiters impose structure (shape, form, mathematical structure) on the unlimiteds. Things become knowable because they are structured in this way; the structure can apparently be expressed in a numerical ratio that allows for understanding: “All things that are known have number; for without this nothing whatever could possibly be thought of or known” (44B4).

6. Other Eleatics: Zeno and Melissus

Parmenides had argued that there were strict metaphysical requirements on any object of knowledge; the later Eleatics, Zeno of Elea (born ca. 490) and Melissus of Samos (fl. ca. 440), extended and explored the consequences of his arguments. Zeno paid particular attention to the contrast between the requirements of logical argument and the evidence of the senses (Vlastos 1967 is a masterly treatment of Zeno). The four famous paradoxes of motion, for which he is now and in antiquity best known, purported to show that, despite the evidence all around us, the ordinary motion of everyday life is impossible. The paradoxes claim that motions can never be begun (the Achilles) or be completed (the Dichotomy), entail contradictions (the Moving Blocks), or are altogether impossible (the Arrow).[6] Recent philosophers of space and time (see Grünbaum 1967, articles in Salmon 2001, Huggett 1999) hold that the arguments are reductios of the theses that space and time are continuous (the Achilles and the Dichotomy) or discrete (the Moving Blocks and the Arrow). Consider the Dichotomy: a runner can never complete a run from point A to point B. First, the runner must move from A to a point halfway between A and B (call it C). But between A and C there is yet another halfway point (D), and the runner must first reach D. But between A and D there is yet another halfway point … and so on, ad infinitum. So the runner, starting at A, can never reach B. The argument assumes that it is impossible to pass an infinite number of points in a finite time. Similarly, Zeno produced paradoxes showing that plurality is impossible: if things are many, contradictions follow (Plato's Parmenides 127e1ff.; Zeno in 29B1, 29B2, and 29B3); there were also purported proofs that place is impossible (29A24) and that things cannot have parts (the Millet Seed, 29A29).

Melissus, dismissed as a simple-minded thinker by Aristotle, expands Parmenides' arguments about the nature of what-is. It is Melissus who explicitly claims that only one thing can be: if what-is is unlimited (as he thinks it is), it must be one and all alike (if there were two [in number or in character] they would be “limited against each other” 30B6). Melissus specifically argues against the empty (the void), and rejects the possibility of rearrangement (which would allow for the appearance of coming-to-be and passing-away)—all these characteristics are incompatible with the unity of what-is. Melissus thus claims that what is real is completely unlike the world that we experience: the split between appearance and reality is complete and unbridgeable.

7. The Pluralists: Anaxagoras of Clazomenae and Empedocles of Acragas

While Zeno and Melissus reinforced Parmenides' distinction between what-is and what appears, other post-Parmenidean thinkers accepted Parmenides' arguments against coming-to-be and passing-away (as characterizing what-is), and about the nature of what is ultimately real, and argued that they did not rule out the possibility of metaphysically-based (or rational) cosmology. Both Anaxagoras and Empedocles worked within the Parmenidean pattern while developing distinct cosmological systems that addressed their own particular concerns (especially in the case of Empedocles, concerns about the proper way to live).

Anaxagoras (writing in the mid-5th c.) claims, “The Greeks [i.e., ordinary people] do not think correctly about coming-to-be and passing-away; for no thing comes to be or passes away, but is mixed together and dissociated from the things that are. And thus they would be correct to call coming-to-be mixing-together and passing-away dissociating” (59B17). What seem to be generated objects (human beings, plants, animals, the moon, the stars) are instead temporary mixtures of ingredients (such as earth, air, fire, water, hair, flesh, blood, dense, dark, rare, bright, and so on).[7] The original state was one of universal mixture: “All things were together, unlimited both in amount and in smallness, for the small, too, was unlimited. And because all things were together, nothing was evident” (59B1). This mixture is set into rotary motion by the operation of Mind (Nous – B12, B13, B14; see discussions in Laks 1993, Lesher 1995, Menn 1995, Curd 2007), a separate cosmic entity that does not share in such mixture. As the rotation spreads out through the unlimited mass of indistinguishably intermingled ingredients, the rotation causes a winnowing or separating effect, and the cosmos as we know it emerges from the mixture. Moreover, not only were all things together, they are even now all together, in a different way, despite the differentiations now achieved. Everything is in everything (59B5, B6, B11), in some proportions, however small or great – this is a move to prevent even the appearance of coming-to-be from what-is-not.

Anaxagoras marks an important theoretical step in attributing the motion of his ingredients to an external, intelligent force (although both Plato and Aristotle were disappointed that his theory was not properly—from their point of view—teleological). The rotation is ultimately causally responsible for the formation of the heavens and the activities of the great masses of the earth and the water on the earth, as well as all meteorological phenomena. Insofar as the causes of the operations of the heavens and the phenomena apparent to us from day to day are the same at both the macro- and micro-level (the rotations that cause the apparent motions of the stars are the same as those that govern the cycles of weather and life and death on earth), we can infer the nature of what is real from what is apparent. Although we do not perceive all things as being together, and the move to the ultimate explanations is an inference, it is a legitimate one (“owing to their [the senses’] feebleness, we are not able to determine the truth” yet “appearances are a sight of the unseen” 59B21 and 21a).

A younger contemporary of Anaxagoras, Empedocles, who lived in Sicily, also recognized the force of Parmenides' arguments against coming-to-be and passing-away. (Empedocles also adopts Parmenides' poetic meter in order to tell his story.) Empedocles proposes a cosmos formed of the four roots (as he calls them), earth, water, air, and fire along with the motive forces of Love and Strife. Love unites opposed (unlike) things, mixing unlikes, while Strife sets unlikes in opposition and pulls them apart, with the effect that it mixes like with like. Just as painters can produce fantastically lifelike scenes just by mixing colors, so the operations of Love and Strife, using just the four roots can produce “trees and men and women, and beasts and birds and water-nourished fish, and long-lived gods best in honors” (31B17). These are the things that Empedocles calls “mortal,” and he even provides recipes. 31B73 tells how Kypris (the goddess Aphrodite, i.e. love) fashions shapes (or kinds): “she moistened earth in rain, and gave it to quick fire to harden.” B96 gives a recipe for bones, while in B98 flesh and blood have the same recipe (earth, water, air, and fire in equal proportions), but differ in the refinement of the mixture.

Like the other Presocratics, Empedocles has a cosmological theory, in his case, an unending cycle involving the competition between Love and Strife. Love overcomes the separating influence of Strife, bringing together unlikes and so preventing the clinging together of likes. The triumph of Love results in the Sphere, which is a complete mixture because the four unlike roots are as mixed (integrated) as possible. Strife breaks up the sphere by beginning to attract like to like and so pulling the mixture apart, until, when it triumphs, there is complete segregation of the roots. Love resists the separation of unlikes and the clinging together of likes, by trying to keep unlike things mixed. The cosmos as we know it is a result of intermediate phases between the two extremes of the triumph of one of the forces.[8]

Although Empedocles has a cosmic story to tell, cosmology is not his sole interest. Like the Pythagoreans, Empedocles thought that how one lived was as important as one's theoretical commitments (and that the two were intimately connected). The ancient evidence seems to suggest that Empedocles was the author of two works, commonly called in modern scholarship the Physics and the Purifications, one cosmological and the other ethico-religious. The relation between the two works has been a matter of some controversy. In the 1990s new evidence from the Strasbourg Papyrus showed unequivocally that the cosmological and ethico-religious aspects of Empedocles' thought are inextricably intertwined (Martin and Primavesi 1999, Primavesi forthcoming, Kingsley 1995), although commentators still disagree about whether this new evidence supports the conclusion that there was a single poem combining both.[9] The correct philosophical understanding of the physical world and the correct way to live cannot be separated from one another in Empedocles' thought; one cannot fully understand the world without living correctly.[10] Like the Pythagoreans, the Empedoclean way of life included vegetarianism and a story of transmigrating daimōns who seem to have some kind of personal identity.

8. Presocratic Atomism

The pluralism of Anaxagoras and Empedocles maintained the Eleatic strictures on metaphysically acceptable basic entities (things that are and must be just what they are) by adopting an irreducible pluralism of stuffs meeting these standards that could pass on their qualities to items constructed from them. Ancient atomism responded more radically: what is real is an infinite number of solid, uncuttable (atomon) units of matter. All atoms are made of the same stuff (solid matter, in itself otherwise indeterminate), differing from one another (according to Aristotle) only in shape, position, arrangement. (Later sources say that atoms differ in weight; this is certainly true for post-Aristotelian atomism, but less likely for Presocratic atomism.) In addition, the Presocratic atomists, Leucippus and Democritus (Democritus was born in about 460 BCE in Abdera in Northern Greece, shortly after Socrates was born in Athens), enthusiastically endorsed the reality of the empty (or void).[11] The void is what separates atoms and allows for the differences noted above (except weight, which could not be accounted for by void, since void in an atom would make it divisible and, hence, not an atom) (Sedley 1982).

Like Anaxagoras, the atomists consider all phenomenal objects and characteristics as emerging from the background mixture; in the case of atomism, the mix of atoms and void (Wardy 1988). Everything is constructed of atoms and void: the shapes of the atoms and their arrangement with respect to each other (and the intervening void) give physical objects their apparent characteristics. As Democritus says: “By convention sweet and by convention bitter, by convention hot, by convention cold, by convention color: in reality atoms and void” (68B125 = B9). For example, Theophrastus says that the flavors differ according to the shapes of the atoms that compose various objects; thus “Democritus makes sweet that which is round and quite large, astringent that which large, rough, polygonal and not rounded” (de Caus. Plant. 6.1.6 = 68A129). Simplicius reports that things composed of sharp and very fine atoms in similar positions are hot and fiery; those composed of atoms with the opposite character come to be cold and watery (in Phys. 36.3–6 = 67A14). Moreover, Theophrastus reports that the atomists explain why iron is harder than lead but lighter; it is harder because of the uneven arrangements of the atoms that make it up, lighter because it contains more void than lead. Lead, on the other hand, has less void than iron, but the even arrangement of the atoms makes lead easier to cut or to bend.

Adopting a strong distinction between appearance and reality, and denying the accuracy of appearances, as we see him do in the above quotation, Democritus was seen by some ancient sources (especially Sextus Empiricus) as a sort of skeptic, yet the evidence is unclear. It is true that Democritus is quoted as saying, “In truth we know nothing; for truth is in the depths” (68B117). So for him, the truth is not given in the appearances. Yet, even Sextus seems to agree that Democritus allows for knowledge:

But in the Rules [Democritus] says that there are two kinds of knowing, one through the senses and the other through the understanding. The one through the understanding he calls genuine, witnessing to its trustworthiness in deciding truth; the one through the senses he names bastard, denying it steadfastness in the discernment of what is true. He says in these words, “There are two forms of knowing, one genuine and the other bastard. To the bastard belong all these: sight, hearing, smell, taste, touch. The other, the genuine, has been separated from this” [68B11]. Then preferring the genuine to the bastard, he continues, saying, “Whenever the bastard is no longer able to see more finely nor hear nor smell nor taste nor perceive by touch, but something finer…”

Thus Sextus suggests that the evidence of the senses, when properly interpreted by reason, can be taken as a guide to reality (the claim that “appearances are a sight of the unseen” is attributed to Democritus as well as to Anaxagoras). We just need to know how to follow this guide, through proper reasoning, so as to reach the truth—i.e., the theory of atoms and void (Lee 2005).

In addition to fragments advancing these metaphysical and physical doctrines, there are a number of ethical fragments attributed to Democritus (but the question of authenticity looms large here); although a passage reported in John Stobaeus seems to link moderation and cheerfulness with small measured movements in the soul and says that excess and deficiencies give rise to large movements (68B191), it is unclear whether or how these claims are directly related to the metaphysical aspects of atomism (Vlastos 1945 and 1946, Kahn 1985b). Democritus was identified in antiquity with the idea of “good cheer” (euthumiē) as the proper guiding objective in living one's life. In this, as in other aspects of his philosophy, he may have had some influence on the formation of Epicurus' philosophy a century later.

9. Diogenes of Apollonia and the Sophists

In the last part of the 5th century, Diogenes of Apollonia (active after 440 BC) revived and revised the Milesian system of cosmology, claiming that “all the things that are are alterations from the same thing and are the same thing” (64B2); he identified this single basic substance with air, like Anaximenes more than a century before. Yet Diogenes takes care to give arguments for the existence and properties of his basic principle. In B2 he says that only things that are alike can affect one another. If there were a plurality of basic substances, each differing in what Diogenes calls their “own proper nature,” there could be no interaction between them. Yet the evidence of the senses is clear: things mix and separate and interact with one another. Thus, all things must be forms of some one single thing. Like Anaxagoras, Diogenes claims that the cosmic system is ordered by intelligence, and he argues that that “which possesses intelligence (noēsis) is what human beings call air” (B5). Humans and animals live by breathing air, and are governed by it —in them air is both soul and intelligence (B4). Moreover, Diogenes argues, air governs and rules all things and is god (B5). Thus, like Anaxagoras, Diogenes has a theory grounded in intelligence, although Diogenes is more fully committed to teleological explanations, insofar as he states explicitly that intelligence (noēsis) orders things in a good way (B3). In presenting his arguments, Diogenes fulfills his own requirement for a philosophical claim. In B1 he says, “In my opinion, anyone beginning a logos (account) ought to present a starting principle (archē) that is indisputable and a style that is simple and stately.” He notes that his theory that air is soul and intelligence “will have been made clearly evident in this book” (B4).

Theophrastus says that Diogenes was the last of the physical philosophers, the physiologoi, or “inquirers into nature,” as Aristotle called them. There was also another group of thinkers active about this time: the Sophists. Many of our views about this group have been shaped by Plato's aggressively negative assessment of them: in his dialogues Plato expressly contrasts the genuine philosopher, i.e., Socrates, with the Sophists, especially in their role as teachers of young men growing into their maturity (youths at the age when Socrates, too, engaged with them in his discussions). Modern scholarship (Woodruff and Gagarin forthcoming, Kerferd 1981, Guthrie 1969) has shown the diversity of their views. They were not completely uninterested in the theoretical problems that concerned others of the Presocratics. Gorgias of Leontini explored the possibility of the sort of theoretical knowledge that Parmenides explored: in his On Nature, or On what-is-not, Gorgias claims that nothing satisfies Parmenides' requirements for what-is (Mansfeld 1985, Mourelatos 1987b, Palmer 1999, Caston 2002, Curd 2006). Protagoras, too, questioned the possibility of the sort of objective knowledge that the Presocratics sought. The Sophists explored ethical and political questions: Does law or convention ground what is right, or is it a matter of nature? They were peripatetic, sometimes serving as diplomats, and they were both entertainers and teachers. They gave public displays of rhetoric (this contrasts with Diogenes of Apollonia's comments about his book, which seems to imply a more private enterprise)[12] and took on students, teaching both the art of rhetoric and the skills necessary for succeeding in Greek political life. With the Sophists, as with Socrates, interest in ethics and political thought becomes a more prominent aspect of Greek philosophy.

10. The Presocratic Legacy

The range of Presocratic thought shows that the first philosophers were not merely physicists (although they were certainly that). Their interests extended to religious and ethical thought, the nature of understanding, mathematics, meteorology, the nature of explanation, and the roles of mechanism, matter, form, and structure in the world. Almost all the Presocratics seemed to have something to say about embryology, and fragments of Diogenes and Empedocles show a keen interest in the structures of the body; the overlap between ancient philosophy and ancient medicine is of growing interest to scholars of early Greek thought (Longrigg 1963, van der Eijk forthcoming). Recent discoveries, such as the Derveni Papyrus (Betegh 2004, Kouremenos et al. 2006, Janko 2001, Laks and Most 1997), show that interest in and knowledge of the early philosophers was not necessarily limited to a small audience of rationalistic intellectuals. They passed on many of what later became the basic concerns of philosophy to Plato and Aristotle, and ultimately to the whole tradition of Western philosophical thought.


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Anaxagoras | Anaximander | Anaximenes | atomism: ancient | Democritus | Diogenes of Apollonia | doxography of ancient philosophy | Empedocles | Gorgias | Heraclitus | Leucippus | Melissus | Parmenides | Protagoras | Pythagoras | Pythagoreanism | Sophists, The | Thales | Xenophanes | Zeno of Elea | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes