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Blaise Pascal

First published Tue Aug 21, 2007

Pascal did not publish any philosophical works during his relatively brief lifetime. His status in French literature today is based primarily on the posthumous publication of a notebook in which he drafted or recorded ideas for a defence of Christianity, the Pensées de M. Pascal sur la religion et sur quelques autres sujets (1670). His philosophical commitments can be gleaned from the contributions he made to scientific and theological debates in France in the mid-seventeenth century.

1. Life and Works

Pascal was born in Montferrand, France, on 19 June 1623, and died thirty-nine years later in Paris (19 August 1662). Following his mother's death when he was three years old, Blaise was reared by his father, Étienne, in the company of his two sisters, Gilberte (b. 1620) and Jacqueline (b. 1625). Later, in Paris, the family hired a maid named Louise Delfault, who became effectively a member of the close-knit family. Pascal's father was an accomplished mathematician, and he provided the only formal education to which his son was exposed. As Carraud (1992: Chapter 2) shows, this arrangement was unique in the seventeenth century for a young man of Pascal's social status. He was never trained in theology or the philosophy of the schools, and his exclusively domestic education focused on classical languages and mathematics. The decision to educate Pascal at home was consistent with the fact that he suffered from very poor health for most of his life, beginning at the age of two. Although his sister, Gilberte, may have exaggerated in her hagiographical La vie de M. Pascal, she reported Pascal as claiming that ‘from the age of eighteen, he never passed a day without pain’ (I, 67: all references to Pascal are to Pascal, 1998/2000, with volume and page number). He continued to be so ill that, at the age of twenty-four, he could tolerate no food other than in liquid form, warmed, and fed to him drop by drop by his sisters or his nurse (Vie: I, 69). Gilberte's biography also confirms that, as his sisters matured, they assumed many of the nursing responsibilities for their infirm brother that would otherwise have been assigned to his mother.

The Pascal family moved residence frequently, for political and financial reasons. They transferred initially to Paris in November 1631, although Étienne was forced to return seven years later to his original home in what had since become Clermont-Ferrand, because he expressed public dissent concerning the crown's fiscal policies. Meantime, France had declared war on Spain in 1635, and this intermittent campaign lasted for most of Blaise Pascal's life. The external and internal political context in which he lived, together with very public disputes between competing religious and theological traditions in which he participated, helped determine the issues to which Pascal contributed philosophical comments in the 1640s and 1650s. Following the revolt of the Nu-Pieds in Normandy, in July 1639, Pascal's father was awarded a new post as a tax collector in Rouen, to which he moved in 1639 (and was followed, in 1640, by Blaise). Meanwhile, Blaise continued his education at home. While still in Paris, he had written the short Essai pour les coniques (1640) and, despite his youth, was introduced to the Mersenne circle by his father as a promising young mathematician. At Rouen he developed the first prototype of his calculating machine (1645), and began to experiment with mercury barometers. Pascal's introduction to barometric experiments occurred by chance when the royal engineer, Pierre Petit (1598–1667), passed through Rouen in September 1646 and informed both Pascals, father and son, about Torricelli's experiments in Italy. Blaise Pascal performed experiments with mercury barometers initially in Rouen and Paris, and published Expériences nouvelles touchant la vide in 1647. He subsequently arranged for his brother-in-law, Florin Périer, to conduct on his behalf one of the most famous experiments of the scientific revolution on the puy-de-Dôme, in the Auvergne.

Périer arranged for two identical barometric tubes to be filled with mercury, on 19 September 1648. He left one at the bottom of the mountain, and charged a local friar to keep watch during the day and note any changes in the height of the mercury. Together with other witnesses, Périer climbed the mountain and took readings of the height of the mercury on the mountain top, and subsequently at two intermediate places on their return journey down the mountainside. As expected, the height of the mercury varied inversely with the height (above sea-level) at which the measurements were taken. When the experimenters rejoined the friar at the bottom of the mountain and compared the measurements on both tubes, they concurred exactly. The friar reported that, throughout the day, there had been no variation in the height of the mercury column that he observed, ‘despite the fact that the weather was very changeable, sometimes calm, sometimes rainy, sometimes very foggy and sometimes very windy’ (I, 433). The results of this experiment were published as Récit de la grande expérience de l'équilibre des liqueurs (1648). Pascal argued, mistakenly, that the experiment guaranteed his interpretation of its results [see below, Section 4].

Pascal's initial encounter with Jansenism occurred when his father slipped on ice and dislocated or broke his thigh, in January 1646. Following this accident, the Deschamps brothers, who had bone-setting and nursing skills, came to live in the Pascal household at Rouen for three months. They introduced the family to the strict observance of Christianity inspired by the work of the Dutch theologian, Cornelius Jansen (1585–1638), and the French theologian, Jean Duvergier de Hauranne, who is usually known as the Abbé de Saint-Cyran (1581–1643). Their evangelical work relied partly on Jansen's short treatise, the Discours sur la réformation le l'homme intérieur, which was based on the text of I John 2:16: ‘For all that is in the world is the concupiscence of the flesh and the concupiscence of the eyes and the pride of life, which is not of the Father but is of this world.’ Jansen taught that a desire for knowledge was one form of concupiscence and he argued that, from this ‘illness … arises the investigation of nature's secrets (which are irrelevant to us), knowledge of which is useless, and which men do not wish to know except for the sake of knowing them’ (Jansen 2004: 24). Jansen recommended that Christians should instead turn aside from the pride and concupiscence of human knowledge and scientific investigations, and should focus exclusively on knowledge of God. While this encounter with Jansenist theology is sometimes described as Pascal's first conversion, it is unlikely that, in 1646, Pascal made the definitive choice about the insignificance of mathematical and scientific work that characterised his change of heart in the 1650s. He returned to Paris with his sister, Jacqueline, in 1647. Descartes met him there, in September 1647, during an extended trip to Paris from his usual residence in the north of Holland, and discussed with Pascal some of the implications of the Torricelli experiments.

The Pascals (Étienne, Blaise, and Jacqueline) left Paris again during the civil war known as the Fronde (1648), but returned later that year to another address in the French capital. The settlement agreed by Mazarin and the regent with the parlement to end the Fronde meant that Étienne had become redundant as a tax-collector in Rouen. This return to Paris was the beginning of a radical change in the family security that Blaise Pascal had enjoyed since his earliest years. His older sister Gilberte had married Florin Périer in June 1641 and had moved to Clermont-Ferrand. However, his younger sister, Jacqueline, expressed a desire, in May 1648, to become a nun and enter the Port-Royal convent in Paris, which was under the spiritual supervision of Jansenists and where one of Arnauld's sisters was a prominent Abbess. Étienne's opposition caused Jacqueline to defer implementing her decision as long as he was still alive. However, four months after her father's death in 1651, and despite her brother's opposition, Jacqueline Pascal joined Port-Royal. At this point, for the first time in his life, Blaise Pascal was alone and in poor health. He soon began to accept spiritual guidance from his sister Jacqueline and subsequently from a prominent Jansenist, Antoine Singlin (1607–64).

In the summer of 1654, Pascal returned briefly to mathematics in correspondence with Pierre Fermat (1601–65) about calculating the probabilities involved in gambling. He summarized his findings in the Traité du triangle arithmétique which, like much of his other work, remained unpublished until after his death. In fact, as Edwards explains (Hammond, 2003: Chapter 3), Pascal's contribution to probability theory was not recognised until it was used by Bernoulli in the early eighteenth century.

During the night of 23 November 1654, Pascal had a dreamlike or ecstatic experience which he interpreted immediately as a religious conversion. He wrote a summary of the experience in a brief document entitled the Memorial, which he sewed into his coat and carried with him until his death. The intensity of this experience resulted in a definitive change in Pascal's lifestyle, in his intellectual interests, and his personal ambitions. After 1654, he terminated the discussions of probability with Fermat, and he cancelled plans to publish a booklet on the vacuum that was ready to go into print. This booklet appeared posthumously as Traités de l'équilibre des liqueurs et de la pesanteur de la masse de l'air (1663). Pascal's brother-in-law, Florin Périer, explains in his introduction that, for ten years before his death, Pascal was aware of ‘the vanity and nothingness of these types of knowledge, and had expressed such disgust for them that he could hardly tolerate intelligent people spending their time and speaking seriously about them’ (I, 459). Pascal had entered the final period of his life, which was dominated by religious controversy, continual illness, and loneliness. This was also the period in which he assumed the challenge of defending Arnauld and, more generally, Jansenist theology in the Provincial Letters.

Antoine Arnauld (1612–94) was a prominent theologian in the Sorbonne, most famous for his defence of Jansenism in De la fréquente communion (1643). Following the condemnation by Pope Innocent X (May 1653) of five propositions about grace that were allegedly found in Jansen's posthumously published book, Augustinus (1640), Arnauld was threatened with censure by the Theology Faculty at the Sorbonne. This provoked Pascal into writing a series of open letters, between January 1656 and March 1657, which were published one by one under a pseudonym and became known as the Provincial Letters. They purported to inform someone living outside Paris (in the provinces) about the events that were newsworthy in theological debates at the Sorbonne and, more widely, in the Catholic Church in France. The Letters rely on satire and ridicule as much as on logic or argument to persuade readers of the justice of Arnauld's cause and of the unsustainability of his critics' objections. However, despite Pascal's efforts, Arnauld was expelled from the Sorbonne (February 1656). Those who lived at Port-Royal des Champs — another convent associated with Port-Royal, which was outside the city boundaries — agreed to leave voluntarily (March 1656) under threat of forcible expulsion, and the convent was eventually razed to the ground. The Provincial Letters are Pascal's deeply personal, angry response to the use of political power and church censure to address what he considered to be a matter of fact, and to what he perceived as the undue influence of a lax Jesuit morality on those who held political and ecclesiastical power in France. The Jesuits were not members of the Sorbonne and were not officially involved in Arnauld's censure; it is not immediately clear, therefore, why Pascal, in the course of writing the letters, devoted so much energy to criticizing the Jesuits. He may have blamed Arnauld's fate on the Jesuits' influence in Rome and their political connections with the monarchy in France.

The final years of Pascal's life were devoted to religious controversy, insofar as his increasingly poor health permitted. During this period, he began to collect and draft ideas for a book in defence of the Catholic faith. While his health and premature death partly explain his failure to complete this work, one might also suspect that an inherent contradiction in the project would have made the task impossible. Apologetic treatises in support of Christianity traditionally required the author to provide reasons for religious faith; however, according to Pascal's radical theological position, it was impossible in principle to acquire or support genuine religious faith by reason, because genuine religious faith was a pure gift from God. Having collected ideas for some time, Pascal began the task of cutting and pasting his draft notes into a coherent form before he died; however, he left the manuscript in such a condition that subsequent editors failed to agree on any numbering system or on the order, if any, in which they should be read. The most frequently quoted modern editions of the Pensées—those of Lafuma, Sellier, or Le Guern—provide concordances to the numbering systems adopted by alternative editions. Because the Pensées are a posthumously published notebook, it also remains unclear whether Pascal endorsed the opinions that are recorded in these notes, or whether he planned to save some of them merely for comment or critique. They are reliably used only when Pascal expressed similar views elsewhere. One of the most famous and most extensive notes in the Pensées (Fragment 397: II, 676–81) is the so-called ‘wager’ in favour of belief in God.

Cole (1995, Chapter 15) argues that Pascal exhibited signs of manic depression and an almost infantile dependence on his family in his mature years. In addition, many of the reported details of his personal life suggest a kind of fundamentalism about religious belief that is difficult to reconcile with what is taken today as the critical stance that defines philosophy as a discipline. For example, if his sister's Life is accurate, Pascal seems to have had an almost obsessive repugnance for any expressions of emotional attachment, which Gilberte attributed to his high regard for the virtue of modesty. She reports that ‘he could not even tolerate the caresses that I received from my own children’ (I, 83). Pascal believed that God performs miracles, among which he included the occasion when his niece was cured of a serious eye condition by what was believed to be a thorn from the passion of Christ. Pascal's commitment to Jansenism was unqualified, although he denied in the Provincial Letters that he was ever a member of Port-Royal (I, 781). Everything we know about Pascal during his maturity point to a single-minded, unwavering belief in the exclusive truth of a radical theological position that left almost no room for toleration of alternative religious perspectives. This is not to suggest that it is impossible to be a religious believer and a philosopher; there are too many obvious counterexamples to such a suggestion. However, the intensity of Pascal's religious faith, following his conversion, seems to have made philosophical inquiries irrelevant to him, with the result that he approached questions during the final ten years of his life almost exclusively from the perspective of his religious faith. It was this perspective that predominated in the Pensées.

There is a complementary reason for urging caution about reading Pascal as a philosopher. He wrote much but published little, none of it philosophy in the sense in which that term is used today. Apart from his brief essays on the vacuum and the Provincial Letters, all his writings were edited and amended posthumously by collaborators who were still involved in the theological controversies that had dominated Pascal's later life. For example, he seems to have contributed to an early version of the Port-Royal Logic (Arnauld and Nicole, 1993) that was subsequently published in 1662; and the Entretien avec M. de Sacy was composed many years after his death, based on the recollections of an editor. Thus philosophical opinions that were attributed to him in various draft writings should be read with caution, and should be understood with reference to the context in which they were published by others apart from the author. His apparent disenchantment with philosophical studies is reflected in Fragment 77 of the Pensées: ‘we do not believe the whole of philosophy to be worth one hour's effort’ (II, 566). This may also testify to the extreme ill-health and loneliness he experienced in his final years, when he reported that he could find consolation for his misery only in religion.

Pascal was never employed in any capacity, and lived modestly from the financial support provided by his family. He died in the care of his sister, Gilberte, and was buried in the church of Saint Étienne du Mont, in Paris. His younger sister, Jacqueline, had predeceased him at the Port-Royal convent in October 1661.

2. Nature and Grace

Pascal's philosophical reflections are dominated by a theological interpretation of the human condition, following Adam's Fall from grace, that he claimed to have borrowed from Saint Augustine. On this view, human nature is essentially corrupt, and there is no possibility of recovery by natural means or human effort. This theological perspective determined Pascal's views about human freedom, and about ethics and politics; it also set extra-philosophical limits to his theory of knowledge, and prompted the negative assessment adopted during the final years of his life about the relative worthlessness of scientific or mathematical research.

Following Augustine, Pascal emphasized the extent to which any recovery from the fallen state of human nature was a gift from God, one that was not earned or deserved in any way by human agents. This divine gift included, as one of its elements, religious faith itself, the capacity of humans to believe the theological interpretation on which the implied worldview depended. Other commentators on Christian belief in the seventeenth century, such as John Locke or John Toland, presupposed that what a Christian is invited to believe must be intelligible, so that faith merely compensated for a lack of evidence in support of a particular proposition and made it possible for a Christian to accept it as true. For these philosophers of religion, there were no mysteries in Christianity if that term included propositions that we cannot understand. For Pascal, however, faith provides appropriately disposed Christians with a means to transcend the limits of what is intelligible and to accept as true even matters that we cannot understand. To claim otherwise would be to set limits to the reality of God and to reduce religious faith to the compass of human understanding. The Pensées suggest: ‘if one submits everything to reason, our religion will contain nothing that is mysterious or supernatural’ (Fragment 162: II, 602). Thus those who are given the gift of genuine religious faith are expected not only to accept things that are uncertain but, especially, to accede to realities that are incomprehensible. Pascal offered no explanation of how this was possible.

This degree of incomprehensibility in the content of religious belief would have been consistent with a corresponding relativism about the competing claims of different religious traditions. For example, each tradition might have been presented as an alternative perspective on the transcendent. However, Pascal was as committed to the exclusive truth of Catholicism, and even to his preferred interpretation of that tradition, as he was open to belief in mysteries. ‘I see several inconsistent religions, all of which except one are false. Each one wishes to be believed on the basis of its own authority and threatens unbelievers. I therefore do not believe them for that reason.’ (Fragment 184: II, 608). For Pascal, the Roman Catholic Church was the only true church, ‘outside of which I am fully convinced there is no salvation’ (Provincial Letters: I, 781).

In contrast therefore with many of his contemporaries in France, such as Descartes or Malebranche, Pascal also rejected the suggestion that one could prove the existence of God by rational means. ‘The metaphysical proofs … have little value’ (Fragment 179: II, 605). A fortiori, it was not necessary, as Malebranche had argued, that one prove God's existence by rational arguments as a precondition for believing that God revealed various truths in the Scriptures. According to that way of thinking, we have no basis for believing the alleged content of revelation unless we have prior proof that there exists a God who is capable of communicating with us. For Pascal, however, reason was completely inadequate to the task of connecting with a transcendent divinity, and the only way to God was by ‘faith’.

Thus the discussion of wagering in favour of religious belief in the Pensées (Fragment 397: II, 676–81), which Pascal drafted and revised a number of times, was written from the perspective of someone who already believes in God, and who assumes that their belief is itself a gift from God. Pascal had independently studied the mathematics of gambling, and while considering how to compose an apology or defence of Christianity, he reviewed ways in which a committed Christian might adapt the logic of wagering to show that their belief is not unreasonable. However, according to Pascal's deepest theological convictions, nothing that he wrote in this context could persuade an unbeliever to become a believer in any sense that could lead to salvation. No one can communicate religious faith in Pascal's sense to others by reasoning or wagering, nor can such faith be self-induced by the same methods. For Pascal, a decision to believe God's revelation (in the relevant sense of ‘believe’) is not based on rational calculation nor, as indicated above, does it presuppose a philosophical argument in favour of God's existence. A calculation of the probability of one's wager is logically posterior to belief, and it purports to show only that those who have accepted divine grace and believed in God have made a wager that is not unreasonable.

The various kinds of divine assistance (or, in the language of theology, grace) by which human beings could overcome their Fallen condition was the subject of intense theological controversy in the seventeenth century. The Church had condemned as heretical the Pelagian theory that human beings could achieve eternal salvation by the use of their unaided, natural powers. Various opinions to the effect that they could make some independent contribution to this process were equally condemned as semi-Pelagian. Both suggestions were thought to deny the significance of the Incarnation. Jansenism represented a starkly exclusive interpretation of how God's assistance enabled Fallen human beings to recover from the effect of Original Sin by the influence of ‘efficacious grace’. However, such a unilateral interpretation of God's intervention seemed to make human effort redundant. Pascal mocked the theory that God assisted weak human beings by means of a ‘sufficient grace’ which was not sufficient, and that this insufficient grace required an independent contribution from human agents. ‘By sufficient grace you mean a grace that is not sufficient’ (Provincial Letters: I, 601). In response to what he understood as various degrees of Pelagianism, Pascal attempted to formulate a position according to which no human effort could contribute to salvation, even as a partial cause, and at the same time to acknowledge the efficacy of God's agency if He chooses freely to assist undeserving sinners.

This controversy about the relative efficacy of God's grace was most evident in the discussion of free will, and in Pascal's account of how we come to know the truth about radically different kinds of reality, the natural and the supernatural.

3. Free Will

How to reconcile the complementary agency of God and of natural causes was a central metaphysical problem for those, in the seventeenth century, who accepted divine intervention in the natural world. One of the solutions offered (for example, by Malebranche and La Forge) was occasionalism, and it was motivated in part by the recognition of God's omnipotence. Unless God's causality were to be understood as inadequately efficacious, occasionalists thought it was redundant to require a supplementary causal activity on the part of natural phenomena or human agents in order to cause the effects that are attributed to them in ordinary language. Pascal's account of free will reflected this dilemma at the heart of human choice. His discussion owes much to that of Augustine in On Free Choice.

Pascal was little concerned about the freedom of human choices that result, for example, in deciding to read one book rather than another, or in analyses of what it means to claim that an agent could have done or chosen otherwise. The comprehensive concupiscence under which human nature struggled, according to Pascal's account of the Fall, implied that human ‘choices’ are determined by the dominant desires of each individual. That provided a naturalistic theory of mundane human choices. The less mundane cases, which were the focus of Pascal's interest, includes those where someone ‘chooses’ to act morally or otherwise. The Jansenist theory of grace was that God intervenes in the lives of individuals and makes it possible for them to choose something that otherwise they could not choose, namely, to act in a manner that is conducive to salvation. If God's assistance were sufficient to guarantee its efficacy, it would seem as if the choice of a human agent were determined by God's greater power. On the other hand, if God's grace were inefficacious, it would seem as if He provided inadequate assistance by relying on natural human powers to exercise free will and thereby to supply what was missing from divine grace. This latter position was rejected by Pascal as heretical and semi-Pelagian.

Pascal's solution was to repeat his interpretation of Augustine's theory of grace, and to re-describe as ‘free’ the choice of a human will that is ‘infallibly’ motivated by God's efficacious grace. ‘Human beings, by their own nature, always have the power to sin and to resist grace, and since the time of their corruption they always have an unfortunate depth of concupiscence which infinitely increases this power of resistance. Nevertheless, when it pleases God to touch them with his mercy, He makes them do what he wants them to do and in the manner in which he wishes them to act, without the infallibility of God's operation destroying in any way the natural freedom of human beings … That is how God disposes the free will of human beings without imposing any necessity on them, and how free will, which can always resist grace but does not always wish to do so, is carried both freely and infallibly towards God’ (Provincial Letters: I, 800, 801). The Écrits sur la grâce, which was drafted at about the same time as the Provincial Letters, summarizes the Augustinian position as follows: God predestines some human beings for salvation and saves them by ‘means that are certain and infallible’ (II, 262). There are also others to whom God gave graces ‘that would have led them to salvation had they used them properly’ (I, 262), but He chose not to provide them with the ‘unique grace of perseverance’ without which it is impossible to be saved. By defending the necessity of God's grace and its infallible efficacy, and by assuming that some people resist this divine assistance, Pascal was forced by the logic of his position to endorse predestination. If God were to provide efficacious grace to each person, they could not fail to be saved. Therefore, if some are damned, it must be because God has decided not to rescue them from the Fallen condition into which they have been born as a result of Adam's sin.

It would be easy, philosophically, to accept the limitations of human powers on which this account is based as a theologically inspired account of weakness of the will. However, it is difficult to see in what sense human choice is free when it is motivated infallibly by a divinely originated desire that the will of each individual, to whom it is granted, finds irresistible. For Pascal, one's choice of salvation is free in the sense that it expresses one's strongest desire; but the desire itself is communicated only to those who are predestined by God, and is such that the recipient is guaranteed to follow it.

4. Theory of Knowledge

Pascal did not set out a coherent theory of knowledge or philosophy of science in any single text. His essays on the vacuum (written during the late 1640s), De l'esprit géométrique (1655), and the Entretien avec M. de Sacy (published posthumously), provide indications of conflicting intuitions about natural knowledge, although they all accept the special role of religious belief. The Provincial Letters provide a statement of his general overview: ‘How do we learn the truth about facts? That will be from our eyes … which are the appropriate judges of fact, as reason is of natural and intelligible things, and the faith is of things that are supernatural and revealed’ (I, 810–11). Apart from faith, which is directed to revealed truths and the supernatural world, Pascal focuses on ‘experience and reason’ (I, 455) as the only ways of acquiring knowledge of the natural world.

The scientific and theological controversies in which Pascal became involved engaged him in epistemological questions that were both commonplace and unresolved in the seventeenth century. These included queries about observations or experiments as sources of evidence, the certainty or otherwise of various types of knowledge claim, and the status of hypotheses that are constructed to explain natural phenomena.

Pascal was sympathetic to the mild, comprehensive pyrrhonism that is found in Montaigne: ‘Montaigne is incomparable … for disabusing those who cling to their opinions and who believe that they have found unshakeable truths in the sciences’ (Entretien: II, 97). Despite this tendency towards scepticism, Pascal frequently expressed confidence in the certainty with which we can know ‘matters of fact.’ For example he argued, in the Provincial Letters, that ‘matters of fact are proved only by the senses’ and that they are ‘easily decided’ (I, 812, 723). This was consistent with one of the main lines of argument in the Letters. Pascal's defence of Arnauld hinged on the claim that the five propositions condemned by the Pope as heretical did not occur in the text of Augustinus, and that this fact could be established by inspection, i.e. by reading the book. On questions of fact, therefore, even the Pope could be mistaken, and it is inappropriate to appeal to any authority apart from one's senses to decide a factual question: ‘authority is useless in that context’ (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 452). The same kind of certainty about experimental facts, he thought, should have resolved the dispute about heliocentrisim that led to Galileo's house arrest. ‘It was in vain’ therefore that the Jesuits ‘obtained from Rome a decree against Galileo … That is not what will prove that the earth does not move; and if one had consistent observations that proved that the earth revolves, all the men in the world could not stop it moving’ (Provincial Letters: I, 813).

Even if facts could be known with certainty by observation, Pascal conceded that it would require the use of reason to understand or explain natural phenomena, and that ‘the secrets of nature are hidden’ (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 455). To penetrate those secrets, one had to have recourse to hypotheses. Pascal's account of how hypotheses are confirmed, and the degree of certainty that one could claim for them, were ambivalent. When reflecting on the results of the puy-de-Dôme experiment, he argued against critics that not only had he established that the mercury rises in a barometer because of the weight of the air, but that the empty space at the top of a barometric tube is a vacuum. Others (including Descartes) accepted the experimental results, but disputed this interpretation of them. They accepted that mercury is supported in a barometer by the weight of the air; they also argued, however, that the apparently empty space in a barometric tube contains a subtle matter of some kind, that it has physical properties (for example, a specific size, or the capacity to be penetrated by light, etc.), and that both interpretations of the nature of this apparent vacuum are consistent with the experimental results.

In this context, Pascal argued as follows. There are three types of hypothesis. The negation of some hypotheses implies an absurd consequence, and they must therefore be true. The affirmation of others implies an absurdity, and these must be false. In a third category, if no absurd conclusion results from either the affirmation or negation of an hypothesis, no conclusion may be drawn about its truth. This classification of possible outcomes assumed that the logic of scientific theories could be modelled on mathematical proofs. At least in the third case, Pascal seems to have recognized that, logically, different assumptions may ‘lead to the same conclusions, for everyone knows that truth is often concluded from falsehood’ (Entretien: I, 90). When applied to experimental situations, it meant that one could get apparently confirming results from a poorly executed experiment or one that is designed according to mistaken hypotheses. Accordingly, even the phenomenal success of the puy-de-Dôme experiment did not show conclusively that Pascal was correct about the vacuum. On the other hand, Pascal implicitly assumed that a negative experimental result disconfirmed the hypothesis that an experiment was designed to test, by analogy with the claim that ‘absurd’ consequences could be attributed to affirming or denying individual hypotheses rather than clusters of interconnected hypotheses. The Duhem-Quine thesis, as it is known today, shows that negative experimental results may be attributed to any of the many hypotheses that are assumed in observations or experiments, and that the certainty to which Pascal aspired cannot be realized even when experimental results are inconsistent with expectations.

This analysis left unresolved the status of scientific hypotheses. Do hypotheses provide genuine knowledge, despite their uncertainty? Or did Pascal anticipate the solution later adopted by Locke and restrict genuine knowledge to two categories: (a) what is perceived, and (b) what is ‘demonstrated’? De l'esprit géométrique adopts a foundationalist perspective on knowledge, in which ‘principles’ are first established and the certainty of other knowledge-claims derives from that of the principles. Such logically interconnected principles and conclusions were called ‘demonstrations’. Thus every demonstration requires that one first identify ‘the evident principles that it requires. For, if one does not guarantee the foundations, one cannot guarantee the building’ (II, 175). One establishes the certainty of propositions if they are ‘deducible by infallible and necessary logical steps from such axioms or principles, on the certitude of which depends all the certitude of the consequences that are properly deduced from them’ (letter to Father Noël: I, 378). This invites the question: does physical science provide demonstrations in this sense? Pascal limited ‘demonstration’ to mathematics and ‘whatever imitates it’ (II, 180). At the same time, he seems to have believed that his own physical investigations were sufficiently similar to mathematics that they amounted to demonstrated knowledge, and that experiments or observations provided their foundational principles.

Accordingly, Pascal's preface for the Traité du vide (1651) claims: ‘the experiments that provide us with an understanding of nature consistently proliferate; and, since they are the only principles of physics, their consequences proliferate accordingly’ (I, 455). The certainty of experimental results based on observation, their role as principles of a scientific demonstration, and the facility with which natural philosophers could perform appropriate experiments or make relevant observations, led Pascal to an optimistic interpretation of scientific progress. He claimed that, when researchers work together, they ‘make continual progress in science in proportion as the world gets older’ (I, 456). This apparently bright future for physical sciences was contrasted with the scientific failure of earlier natural philosophers, ‘those timid people who did not dare to discover anything in physics’ (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 454) and is reflected in the comment in the Pensées, Fragment 654: ‘To what extent have telescopes revealed realities to us that did not exist for our philosophers of old?’ (II, 807).

In summary, Pascal adopted an interpretation of natural science which exaggerated both the ease with which the interpretation of observations and experiments could be agreed, and the simplicity of the logical links between theories and their apparently confirming evidence.

In contrast with all knowledge that is derived from experience and reason, Pascal identifies ‘authority’ as the exclusive foundation of religious belief. Authority depends on memory and is purely historical, because the objective is simply to find out what someone said or wrote. This applies ‘especially in theology’ (Preface to the Traité du vide: I, 452), a discipline which Pascal presents as if there could be no dispute about what is revealed in the scriptures or, more fundamentally, about whether a particular writing belongs among the canonical texts. He had to recognize that there were many religious traditions that claimed to report divine revelations, and that each in turn rested its claims on its own authority as a reliable witness to earlier historical events and their interpretation. Even within Catholicism, Pascal was familiar with the decisions of at least some church Councils that determined which interpretations of its doctrinal history were acceptable and which were anathemized as heretical. Since he rejected the validity of rational arguments as a criterion for distinguishing between what was authentic or otherwise in Christian belief, he had to rely ultimately on a personal choice of what to believe about the supernatural, and then to interpret that personal choice as if it were inspired by a special grace from God.

It seems evident that the circularity of Pascal's self-justification could be repeated, with appropriate changes, by equally committed members of other religious traditions.

5. Ethics and Politics

In the discussion of what he described as the ‘perniciously lax’ morality of the Jesuits, in the Provincial Letters, Pascal classifies many human actions — such as homicide, when self-defence is not relevant — as obviously immoral, and as widely recognised as such. He characterizes these immoral actions variously as contrary to the ‘natural light’, to ‘common sense’ or the ‘natural law.’ As Ferreyrolles (1984) shows, there are numerous references in Pascal to a ‘law of nature’. However, Pascal does not argue that this natural law can be discovered by reason, or that it acquires its obligatory force from human convention or contracts. The Jansenist interpretation of the human condition implied that human nature is corrupt, and therefore that reason is now an unreliable moral guide. ‘There are undoubtedly natural laws, but our fine reason was corrupted and it has corrupted everything’ (Fragment 56: II, 560). According to this view, God had provided reliable moral guidance to human beings in the prelapsarian state of nature, and some remnants of God's law continue to be reflected in Fallen nature. Natural law, therefore, is what remains of God's law in our current state of concupiscence. There is thus no independent, philosophical account of morality available in Pascal, apart from the law of God which is more or less dimly revealed.

According to God's law, or those elements of it which survive in the widely held opinions of human beings all over the world, there are certain actions which are intrinsically evil or good. Our moral duties include not only the more familiar examples, such as the obligation to refrain from voluntary homicide; Pascal also quotes with approval from Cajetan that ‘we are obliged by justice to give alms from our surplus, to alleviate even the common necessities of the poor … those who are rich are merely stewards of their surplus, in order to give it to whoever they select from among those who are in need’ (Letters: I, 714).

Having assumed that there are objective moral obligations, Pascal directs his critique, both in the Provincial Letters and in his contributions to the Écrits des Curés de Paris, to the claim, attributed to Jesuit casuists, that one can change radically the moral character of many actions by changing one's intention at the time of their performance. On this account, if an agent acts immorally while formally intending to act immorally, nothing can excuse the action in question. In all other cases, however, it is possible to modify the moral character of the action by applying the method of ‘directing the intention, which consists in selecting something that is permitted as the objective of one's actions’ (Letters: I, 649). This escape from moral responsibility relies on the principle that ‘it is the intention which determines the moral quality of an action’ (Letters: I, 679).

The claim that one could direct one's intention away from what is otherwise a morally reprehensible action was consistent with the casuists' defence of the doctrine of ‘probabilism’. This doctrine, to which Pascal also objected, meant that one may decide moral issues according to any opinion which is said to be ‘probable’, even if it is much less probable that alternative opinions. ‘Probable’ in this context was defined as ‘everything that is approved by well-known authors’ (Letters: I, 732). The limits of what was morally acceptable were thus provided by examining the writings of approved authors and finding the least demanding moral opinion available in the literature. Pascal's satirical critique of Jesuit casuistry assumes, in contrast, that human actions have a moral character that is independent of the private thoughts or intentions of the agent who performs them, and that one cannot ameliorate them by ‘intending’ results that differ from the actual effects or consequences that follow naturally from a given action. In that sense, Pascal's critique is an early version of a modern objection to the so-called ‘Principle of Double Effect.’

Pascal's political theory was likewise dictated by his account of human concupiscence. According to Fragment 90 of the Pensées, ‘concupiscence and force are the sources of all our actions. Concupiscence causes voluntary actions, and force causes those that are involuntary’ (II, 570). Although there was a state of nature before the Fall of Adam, human relations are now completely compromised by concupiscence and by the exercise of power by one person over another. One inevitable effect of this unwelcome subservience is that we are coerced into obeying those who exercise political power over us, and this can be interpreted as punishment for our sinful condition. The Trois Discours sur la condition des grands distinguishes between natural gifts or abilities, which vary from one individual to another and may deserve our esteem, and variations in social status or political power which result from human contingency and require only that we obey and salute those who happen to be our superiors (II, 194–9). The natural equality of human beings that is implicit in this analysis, however, provides no basis for a theory of justice which would legitimate opposition to an established civil society or government, no matter how tyrannical it may be. In fact, there is no independent perspective in Pascal's writings from which one may query whether the laws of a country are just; they are just, by definition, because they are the laws. ‘Justice is what is established; all laws are just because they are established’ (Fragment 530: II, 776). A more extreme expression of the same view, in the Pensées, is that ‘justice, like finery, is dictated by fashion’ (Fragment 57; II, 562).

This political conservatism is reflected in Pascal's view that ‘the worst evil of all is civil war’ (I, 569). In the Provincial Letters, he directs readers to the moral teaching of the Gospels to guide them in political action. ‘The Church … has always taught her children not to render evil for evil; … to obey magistrates and superiors, even those who are unjust, because we must always respect in them the power of God who has set them over us’ (I, 744). This compulsory tolerance of the status quo, for the sake of the common good, did not preclude comparative assessments of the merits or otherwise of different political systems. However, even in such assessments, the criterion of judgment remained the extent to which various states facilitated citizens in the performance of their primary duties to God.

The appropriate attitude of subjects or citizens to the political powers that govern them was exemplified, acutely, in the demand by the civil authorities in Paris that even conscientiously objecting Jansenists had to sign and obey the formulary which condemned the five propositions allegedly found in Jansen's work. Dissenters like Pascal were not required to assent, in conscience, to what they did not believe; but they were required to assent in their behaviour and obey their political and ecclesiastical superiors. Likewise, the subjects of Pascal's polity were not required to esteem their political masters, nor to hold beliefs about them as human beings which they believed were false. It was enough that they obey them, that they observe the laws in their behaviour, and offer them the public deference that was appropriate to their status as God's representatives, worthy or otherwise, on earth.

6. Pascal and Human Existence

While it would be anachronistic to describe Pascal as an existentialist, one of the most abiding features of his work is the philosophical reflection on the radical contingency of human affairs that emerges in the final years of his life. He used these reflections to puncture the pride, arrogance and self-love of those who thought of themselves as superior to the vicissitudes of human life. Cromwell provided a contemporary illustration by his fall from power due to a relatively common illness. ‘Cromwell would have ravaged the whole of Christendom; the royal family was lost, and his own family was about to become all-powerful, except for a little grain of sand that lodged in his bladder. Even Rome was about to tremble beneath him. Once this little piece of stone became lodged there, he died, his family was disgraced, peace was established all round, and the king was restored’ (Fragment 632: II, 799). Many of Pascal's intuitions along these lines were almost a commonplace in the period, especially among Calvinist theologians. They were inspired in part by a growing acceptance within cosmology of the infinite extent of the universe and, in contrast, the relative finitude of individual human lives. They owed even more to a theological perspective that claimed to represent human affairs from God's perspective, including the absolute will by which He predestines individuals for salvation or eternal perdition. Pascal's distinctive contribution was to capture some of these insights in elegant, pithy phrases that matched the status of the Pensées as a personal notebook. Fragment 104, for example, compares a human life to a ‘thinking reed.’ ‘It is not in space that I should search for my dignity, but in the control of my thoughts… . The universe comprehends me by space and engulfs me like a point; by means of thought, I can comprehend it’ (II, 574).

One could question the validity of considering the value of finite beings from the naturalistic perspective of an infinite universe, or even the conceivability of a divine perspective that, according to Pascal, is naturally inaccessible to finite minds. Given his extremely poor health and the expressions of abandonment that emerge from his writings, one cannot avoid considering whether Pascal's choice of ‘wretchedness’ (la misère) as a sub-title for one group of ‘thoughts’ reflected his personal experiences. ‘The greatness of human beings consists in their ability to know their wretchedness’ (Fragment 105: II, 574). Pascal's rejection of any naturalistic explanation of the human mind or soul, his emphasis on dread of an unknown future (in his case, whether we are saved or damned), the apparent insignificance of human existence, and the experience of being dominated by political and natural forces that far exceed our limited powers, strike a chord of recognition with some of the existentialist writings that emerged in Europe following the Second World War. This was philosophy in a different register. Rather than speculate about abstract matters which were inaccessible to most of his contemporaries, Pascal invites his readers to recognize the description of his personal experiences as resonating with their own. While emphasizing the natural insignificance of individual human lives, he did not conclude that human existence was absurd. He pointed instead, as Christian existentialists have done since, to a source of meaning that would transcend the limitations of our thought. Access, however, was strictly limited to those to whom God gave the gift of religious faith.


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