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Plato's Cratylus

First published Wed Oct 4, 2006

The formal topic of the Cratylus is ‘correctness of names’, a hot topic in the late fifth century BC when the dialogue has its dramatic setting. Sophists like Prodicus offered training courses in this subject, sometimes perhaps meaning by it little more than lessons in correct diction. But that practical issue spawned the theoretical question, what criteria determine the correct choice of name for any given object? And in the Cratylus Socrates' two primary interlocutors, Hermogenes and Cratylus (the latter of whom is reported by Aristotle to have been an early philosophical influence on Plato), represent two diametrically opposed answers to that question.

As a preliminary, it is important to be clear about what is meant by ‘names’. The plural noun onomata (singular onoma), translated ‘names’, in fact varies between being (a) a general term for ‘words’, (b) more narrowly, nouns, or perhaps nouns and adjectives, and (c) in certain contexts, proper names alone. In (a), the most generic use, it comes to designate language as such. Ultimately, for this reason, the Cratylus is Plato's dialogue about language, even if the elements of language on which it concentrates are in fact mainly nouns. Proper names are included among these nouns, and at times are treated as paradigmatic examples of them.

The positions of Hermogenes and Cratylus have come to be known to modern scholarship as ‘conventionalism’ and ‘naturalism’ respectively. An extreme linguistic conventionalist like Hermogenes holds that nothing but local or national convention determines which words are used to designate which objects. The same names could have been attached to quite different objects, and the same objects given quite different names, so long as the users of the language were party to the convention. Cratylus, as an extreme linguistic naturalist, holds that names cannot be arbitrarily chosen in the way that conventionalism describes or advocates, because names belong naturally to their specific objects. If you try to speak of something with any name other than its natural name, you are simply failing to refer to it at all. For example, he has told Hermogenes to the latter's intense annoyance, Hermogenes is not actually his name.

Socrates is the main speaker in this dialogue, and his arguments are generally taken to represent Plato's own current views. He starts out by criticizing conventionalism, and persuades Hermogenes that some kind of naturalism must be endorsed. This leads to a long central section in which Socrates' version of naturalism is spelt out by appeal to proposed etymologies of philosophically important words: those words, it turns out, have not been attached in a merely arbitrary way to their objects, but are encoded descriptions of them. So far the argument seems to be going Cratylus' way. But in the final part of the dialogue Socrates turns to Cratylus and shows him that his expectations as a naturalist are set impossibly high: names cannot aspire to being perfect encapsulations of their objects' essences, and some  element of convention is must be conceded.

Scholarly opinion has long been divided as to how Socrates' own eventual position should be understood — as a qualified vindication of conventionalism, of naturalism, or of neither. If Socrates is read as actually dismissing naturalism, it is almost inevitable that his naturalistic etymological decodings of words, to which well over half the dialogue is devoted, should be taken as not seriously intended, and in fact as making fun of the entire etymological practice. This has been the majority position among interpreters for well over a century. It rests partly on the conviction that (a) the etymologies are ridiculous, and (b) Plato knew as well as we do that they are ridiculous.

However,  at least some caution is required here. The Greeks knew little about the historical origins of their  own language, and the style of etymology practised by Socrates in this dialogue is not very different — except perhaps in its elaborateness — from that practised by a great many ancient writers, one which had its roots in Homer and Hesiod. None of Plato's readers in antiquity, starting with his own pupil Aristotle, seems to have suspected the Cratylus etymologies of being non-serious. The interpretation according to which Plato is mocking etymological practice, although not demonstrably wrong, may be suspected of crediting him with an anachronistic degree of insight into historical linguistics. That Socrates' long etymological extravaganza is peppered with humour is not in doubt, but that the humour must be directed at the etymologies as such is less clear. Reading Socratic humour is a largely intuitive matter, and one which regularly divides readers. Socrates' humour in the Cratylus is at least partly directed at his own uncharacteristic boldness in declaiming long strings of word derivations, contrary to his familiar disavowal of expert knowledge about anything. Whether some of it is left over for deflating the etymological enterprise itself is a question on which readers must make up their own minds. But the present article is based on the contrary assumption, that the etymological practice on display in the dialogue is seriously meant.

Where does the Cratylus belong among Plato's works. It is conventional, though far from uncontroversial, to place an entire series of dialogues featuring the ‘classical theory of Forms’ in his middle period (see the entry on Plato's middle period metaphysics and epistemology). And three of these — the Republic, Phaedrus and Parmenides — are often thought to belong late in that period, on the evidence of stylistic features. For those who accept this schema, the Cratylus ought to belong relatively early in the group, since it contains the classical theory of Forms but lacks the late stylistic features. It might therefore, with some plausibility, be placed close to the Phaedo, and this dating has often been favoured. However, thematic links to the interests explored in late dialogues like the Sophist have encouraged some to date it later. Besides the manuscripts preserve two passages that seem to be traces of a superseded first edition of the dialogue, suggesting that what we have could be a revised edition, quite possibly of relatively late date. If so, the text as we have it may not straightforwardly represent any one period of Plato's work.

1. Opening scene (383a-385e)

As the dialogue opens, Cratylus and Hermogenes are approaching Socrates to referee their dispute (see above) about language. Cratylus, Hermogenes complains, has been maddeningly secretive about the details of his naturalist thesis, and has had the effrontery to inform him that Hermogenes is not his real name. How can that be, Hermogenes wonders, when all it takes for a name to be someone's name is that there be an agreement by the relevant human community to use it that way?

Quizzed by Socrates about the size of the relevant community, Hermogenes agrees that at an extreme it might even be one person's private name usage that is at issue. And he concedes that Socrates could if he wished have private nicknames that conflict with the city's public vocabulary, for example by calling a man ‘horse’ and vice versa.

This may be read as simply establishing the precise terms of Hermogenes' conventionalism. Although it is often interpreted as already reducing his thesis to an absurdity, there is no reason to think so, and at all events it is only in the next move that Socrates represents himself as developing an actual objection to Hermogenes' conventionalist stance.

2. A general case for naturalism (385e-390e)

That next move starts with Socrates securing Hermogenes' rejection of out-and-out relativism like that of Protagoras. (See the entry Plato on Knowledge in the Theaetetus.) This in turn commits him to the view that things have objective natures independent of how they may appear to us, and that there are objectively determined skills for dealing with them: for example, the right way to cut something is determined, independently of our own subjective preferences, by that thing's objective nature. Like cutting, naming too will be an objective science. Much as a shuttle is a tool for separating threads, a name is a ‘tool for instructing by separating being’ (388b-c). But tools must be made by appropriate experts, who are themselves advised and guided by the tools' destined users. Thus, just as the shuttle-making carpenter is guided by the weaver who has commissioned his product, so too the name-maker is an expert who, ideally at least, is guided by that ultimate expert in word use, the dialectician. It follows that names, if correctly made, cannot be randomly adopted, as Hermogenes' conventionalism would imply, but on the contrary need to be expertly made for their specific purpose, in a way that corresponds to the natures of the things they name.

Like any good craftsman, Socrates also maintains, the name-maker (or ‘lawmaker’, as he also somewhat mysteriously calls this particular expert) must turn his mind's eye to the appropriate Form, which he then embodies in the materials at his disposal, just as a carpenter making a shuttle or drill, having turned his mind's eye to the appropriate Form, then embodies it in the particular wood or metal at his disposal. In the case of name-making, the appropriate material is not wood or metal, but vocal sound. Implicitly, just as the same shuttle Form can be embodied in various woods and metals, so too the same name Form can be embodied with equal success in the various sound systems that different languages employ. In this way, it is made clear, the undeniable fact that the same thing is called by many different names around the world need not conflict with the naturalist thesis that names belong naturally to their objects: each of those names is the appropriate and natural way to represent its name-Form in the local sound system (389d-390a).

The relevant name Forms for a name-maker to look to, Socrates makes clear, will not be simply the generic Form of name, but also one of its species, the specific Form of the name currently being sought. Presumably the generic Form of name is the function of a name as such, which as we have seen is to instruct by separating being. If so, the Form of a specific name, say the Form of the name of a man, will be that name's function of instructing by separating the being of a man. Otherwise put, the name ‘man’, or its equivalent in any other language, is a suitable and well-made name in so far as it discharges its function of separating off vocally what it is to be a man from what it is to be a dog, a drainpipe, or anything else. In doing this, the name also ‘instructs’. It does so, it seems, ideally by the educational means that a dialectician would use — by accurately focusing the discussion onto the object of inquiry, in this case man, and thus helping interlocutors to proceed with the task of defining, and thereby understanding, what a man essentially is. But at a more mundane level of language use, there is little doubt that the ‘instruction’ envisaged will reduce to the ordinary imparting of information — in this case, for example, by indicating that the item referred to in a sentence is a man rather than something else.

Everything down to here is set out in terms of Plato's own metaphysics, and has all the hallmarks of philosophical seriousness. Names are purpose-made portions of vocal sound, expertly constructed for their specific function of marking off this or that item's being. This is clearly a form of naturalism, since it treats names as appropriately correlated to the specific natures of the objects they name. But what does that natural correlation amount to?

At a minimum it might have consisted merely in the accurate mapping of a language's vocabulary onto the natural genera and species that constitute reality, so that each word corresponds to precisely one entity. But such a mapping could in principle be done even if the actual words were formed and assigned on a random basis, which would be entirely compatible with Hermogenes' conventionalism. Since Socrates and Hermogenes seem agreed that that original stance has now been undermined, and since it is the actual making of names that has been presented as an expertise, not merely their assignment once made, it is clear that Socratic naturalism must lie not merely in a correct mapping relation, but in each word's formation as one specifically appropriate to it object. What kind of appropriateness is at issue?

3. The etymologies (390e-427d)

Socrates' proposed answer fills the very extensive central section of the dialogue. In short (for to say it at length would exceed the capacity of this article), names are appropriate to their objects in so far as they describe them. According to a long series of etymologies proposed by Socrates, the Greek vocabulary itself, when suitably decoded, is an elaborate set of descriptions of what each named item is. To continue with the example already mentioned, the Greek word for ‘man’, anthrôpos, according to Socrates appears to break down into anathrôn ha opôpe, ‘one who reflects on what he has seen’ (390c). That is, the species which uniquely possesses both eyesight and intelligence has been given a name which acknowledges precisely that distinguishing combination.

Any residual sympathy for Hermogenes' original conviction that man and horse could just as easily have been assigned each other's names is, it seems, meant to have evaporated by this point. (Even at 333e-334a, very near the end of the dialogue Socrates will continue to reject Hermogenes' assertion of name-interchangeability, this time with the examples of ‘large’ and ‘small’.) Scholars who doubt that Plato means to make such generous concessions to naturalism have been inclined to treat etymologies like that of ‘man’ as non-serious. But this particular decoding was widely accepted by later writers, not all of them Platonists, and there is no evidence that anyone, Plato included, thought it ridiculous. The latter is equally true regarding the remainder of the etymologies.

The other etymologies that make up this central section are systematically ordered to cover the main objects of philosophical and scientific discourse. After an only partly successful trial-run with personal names, including Homeric and mythological ones (391c-397b), Socrates and Hermogenes set out to work through the vocabulary of cosmology (397c-410e): the hierarchy of intelligent beings; soul and body; names of deities; astronomical entities; the elements; and the principles of temporal regularity. They then turn to ethics (411a-421c): intellectual virtues; moral virtues; technical virtues; generic terms of evaluation; emotive states; judgement; will; and finally truth (presumably treated as underlying the intellectual virtues). Lastly, they seek the roots of all this signification in the directly imitative primary sounds out of which the simplest words are composed (421c-427d).

Socrates' implied main principles of etymology, as they emerge over this entire section, supplemented by the remainder of the dialogue, can be summarized as follows:

  1. The names of things were originally assigned to them by one or more of our early ancestors.
  2. It is a familiar fact that when a name is created it is normally descriptive of its object (cf. our ‘computer’, ‘ashtray’, etc.), and likewise the original name-makers will have encoded in their products their own insights  — some better, some worse — into the natures of the things they were naming.
  3. Those original names have survived into today's language, but corrupted by sound-shifts over the centuries, so that to discern their originally intended message requires special expertise.
  4. Even the original encodings may have been enigmatic, due to the need for compression into just a few syllables. (Modern acronyms are a useful parallel  here.)
  5. A name is a tool, whose function is to instruct by separating the being of its object.
  6. A name's ‘power’ (dunamis) lies in its success in separating the being of its object by descriptive means.
  7. Two names have the same ‘power’ provided that both succeed in marking off the same object, even if they do so by means of different descriptions, i.e. without being simple synonyms (cf. 394b-c).
  8. Because a name signifies by description, it can be said to imitate the being of the object to which it has been assigned. It does with vocal materials what a painted portrait does with visual materials.
  9. Such imitation, however, could never be complete and perfect. (See section 4 below.)
  10. A complex name is analysable sometimes into a predicative description (rhêma) of its object, sometimes into a complete statement (logos) about it.
  11. The simpler names composing complex ones may admit of further analysis, but eventually primary names must be reached.
  12. Primary names are analyzable, not into further names, but into elementary sounds (or letters), each of which has its own imitative significance. Socrates uses the comparison of portraits, whose primary organic components (nose, fingertip, etc.) will be analysable, not into further organic parts, but into directly imitative colours.
  13. Each elementary sound may have more than one imitative significance, and recognizing the relevant one will then depend on context. (We might compare the variable signification of the letters constituting modern acronyms.)
  14. An etymological expert has to learn to detect the salient semantic or phonetic components of each name and to set aside the others. To illustrate this with a very simple case (393d-e), in understanding the names of the letters alpha, beta etc., we can all learn to recognize that it is the first sound alone that determines the meaning, and that the others can be safely ignored.
  15. When a single name turns out to admit of two or more decodings, sometimes these will be mutually complementary and should therefore be endorsed in combination. An example is hêlios, ‘sun’, a word whose superlative appropriateness is appreciated only when we work out that it is that which, by its rising, ‘assembles’ (halizein) people, which ‘always rolls’ (aei eilein iôn) around the earth, and which by its motion ‘variegates’ (aiollein) the things that grow from the earth (409a1-6).
  16. Sometimes instead we are forced to choose between rival decodings of the same word. In such cases, the most subtle and/or complex one is normally to be preferred (cf. 399d-400b).
  17. A single Greek word is best understood by examining its profile across all the language's dialects. Sometimes these variants will bring out different aspects which complement each other (cf. 401b-e).
  18. Some etymologies will look far-fetched, but even these may gain in credibility when taken jointly with kindred ones (cf. 415d-e).
  19. A primary name may contain a mixture of appropriate, neutral and inappropriate sounds, and thus have a greater or lesser degree of imitative ‘correctness’. But (implicitly) it could not have a preponderance of sounds inappropriate to its object and still be that object's name.
  20. Some names may have originated as loan-words from other languages, and therefore not respond to (Greek) etymological analysis.

Socrates' and Hermogenes' assumption throughout the etymological section is that, by decoding the philosophically significant Greek vocabulary, they are reading off from it the beliefs of those early members of their race who first gave things their names. It is in this sense that they assume etymology to work: it really can decode words and thus read the mindset of our early ancestors. Moreover, in keeping with his culture's veneration for antiquity, Socrates respects whatever insights the ancients prove to have had into many cosmological matters, above all their recognition, which emerges on nearly every page, that intelligence is the key factor in the world's structure.

But at no point does Socrates let that veneration turn into an attribution of authority to the ancients, and hence into a belief that etymology is a route to establishing the truth. The ancients' views, once rediscovered, must be assessed on their merits, and when he turns to the ethical vocabulary he in fact finds them to have blundered disastrously. For, he maintains, the Greek ethical vocabulary when put under the microscope turns out again and again to associate positive values with flux, negative values with stability. In thus tying values to constant change, he suggests, the name-makers were projecting their own intellectual dizziness onto the things they were naming.

Socrates' exposure and criticism of the ancients' error no doubt hints at what Plato sees as his philosophical forerunners' failure to recognize the essential stability of values. Plato sees the two of them — Socrates and himself — as responsible for that all-important breakthrough. The way in which the ancient name-makers prove to have understood cosmology so much better than they did ethics mirrors Plato's relative valuation of the Presocratic philosophers in the same two disciplines.

4. The critique of extreme naturalism (427d-440e)

Cratylus, who came to be known in antiquity as a proponent of universal flux, is not at all deterred by the flux content discovered in the existing Greek vocabulary, and interprets Socrates' etymological marathon as vindicating his own naturalist stance. But from now on Cratylus' extreme position will be under attack. He believes all names to be perfectly faithful descriptions of their objects, with the consequence that a string of sound embodying a less than accurate description of some object could never be that object's name. As a further consequence he also holds, conversely, that a string of sound which did succeed in being the object's name would be a guaranteed source of knowledge about it. These are the twin targets of Socrates' critique.

If an allegedly inaccurate name like ‘Hermogenes’ fails to name at all, to call the person in question ‘Hermogenes’ is not even to say something false, according to Cratylus, but simply to fail to say anything. In this way Cratylus turns out to belong to that school of sophistic thinkers who paradoxically deny that false statement is possible (see the entry on method and metaphysics in Plato's Sophist and Statesman).

Socrates' reply to this seeks to enforce an admission that there are, in such naming contexts, variable degrees of correctness, and indeed that no naming act could ever attain perfect accuracy. He finally wins this round by appeal to a pair of analogies with paintings. First (430a-431c), if attaching names to people is like assigning portraits to them, there seems no reason why one could not succeed in incorrectly assigning them the wrong portrait, and likewise the wrong name. Second (432b-c), however good a likeness a name is of its object, some gap between the two must inevitably remain: otherwise painting a completely accurate portrait of Cratylus would result, not in Cratylus plus his picture, but in two Cratyluses.

Although Plato's long-standing interest in the falsity issue is well known, the main aim here is to enforce Cratylus' agreement on a point already established in the etymological section: that although names do indeed function as names by being miniaturized descriptions of their objects, they can succeed in being names despite a considerable variation in their degree of descriptive accuracy. Names are ‘so far as possible’ likenesses of their objects, but the minimum condition for their being those objects' names is merely that they convey their ‘outline’ (432e-433e). The portrait analogy is here too not far from the surface.

Not only does Socrates thus weaken the principles of naturalism, but he also makes it clear that in doing so he is reintroducing an element of conventionalism (434a-435d). This is argued in two ways.

First, at the level of primary sounds, it is agreed that the word for ‘hardness’, sklêrotês, contains both a hardness sound, R, and a softness sound, L. (We are permitted to assume that all the other sounds in it are neutral in this regard.) How then do people succeed in understanding its meaning correctly? Thanks to convention, is the unfortunate answer to which Cratylus commits himself, thus conceding to Hermogenes far more than he ever intended to (434e-435b). Second, Socrates points out that the names of numbers will be impossible to explain without including an element of convention.

The difficult question about these two moves, on which scholarship is divided, is how far the pendulum has now swung back towards conventionalism. There are reasons for being wary of exaggerating the swing. As regards the first argument, it is significant that Socrates nowhere in the dialogue admits any case in which the inappropriate elements in a name outnumber the appropriate ones (hence item 19 in the list of etymological principles, section 3 above). The test case, that of sklêrotês, is one where the score is even, so that convention has to be called in to break the deadlock. And as regards the argument about numbers, Socrates is explicit that convention needs to be invoked here, not to replace naturalism, but on the contrary to vindicate it: ‘[W]here do you think you're going to get, to apply to numbers, a supply of names which resemble every single one of them, if you don't allow the consent and agreement you spoke of to have some authority concerning correctness of names?’ (435b-c). And he does have a good point. There cannot be a simple set of direct and unmediated resemblances between numbers and their names, because there are infinitely many numbers, so that an infinite set of number-names made out of the finite stock of letters would be unable to place any limit on the length of those names. We therefore have to have agreed rules for composing their names out of smaller units: twenty-seven, two hundred and forty, etc. (English and ancient Greek are not very different in this regard.) And those rules will be where the element of convention creeps in. If so, the result is that the descriptive power of number-names is vindicated: thanks to this simple set of conventions we can name, by description, any one of the infinite series of natural numbers. This is very far from being an abandonment of naturalism.

5. Flux and Forms (435d-440e)

The closing topic to which Socrates and Cratylus turn is where knowledge is to come from. Cratylus, despite the damage Socrates has inflicted on his extreme naturalism, still clings to his belief that the study of things' names is the privileged route to knowledge of the things themselves. But why, Socrates wants to know, should we assume that the original name-givers were infallibly right in the descriptions they encoded? Cratylus, who is emerging as an adherent of the flux theory, points to the consistent emphasis on flux revealed throughout the foregoing etymologies. To this Socrates retorts that (a) one can be consistently wrong, as well as right, and (b) other etymologies can be found that show up the original name-makers as not quite so consistently wedded to flux after all.

This latter point should not be mistaken for an attempt to refute the etymological theory as such — that is, the theory that etymological analysis can succeed in reading off the beliefs of the original name-makers. For Socrates will soon be reaffirming his own confidence in the main finding of the etymologies, that the name-makers really did believe everything to be in flux (439c). He is just questioning how consistent and single-minded they were about sticking to that belief, and hence challenging their infallibility, and their reliability as authorities.

There remains, Socrates points out, the question where the original name-makers would have got their knowledge from. Obviously not from the study of names, he points out (438a-b). It is only a short step from this to agreeing that no intermediacy, of names or anything else, between the would-be knower and the object known can do anything but impede the learning process. Rather, Socrates proposes, reality should be directly studied in its own right. Some have thought that Plato is here proposing an altogether non-linguistic mode of philosophizing, although his remarks can in fact be adequately understood as merely denying that names should be studied in the pursuit of knowledge, without any accompanying denial that they should even be used.

The dialogue's final argument (439b-440d) implicitly identifies the Forms as the objects that require that unmediated study in pursuit of knowledge. Even Cratylus, by now a passionate partisan of flux, can see the point that something should remain stable through the change. For even so self-guaranteeing a statement as the self-predication ‘The Beautiful itself is beautiful’ could not be truly utterable unless the Form referred to endured long enough for the predicate to be attached to it. Worse, knowledge would not be possible if, during the process of our learning about its object, that object were already changing into something else. With these arguments spelt out, Socrates allows himself definitively to deny the truth of the universal-flux thesis, while Cratylus, disregarding Socrates' warnings, reaffirms his own commitment to it.

This final scene thus points forward to two diametrically opposed developments. One is Cratylus' eventual conviction, as reported by Aristotle (Metaphysics 1010a7-15), that flux is so rampant and exceptionless as to make it impossible to speak of anything at all. The other is Socrates' progress towards the stable ontology that would in due course be the hallmark of Platonism. Plato had in his formative years been influenced in turn by both Cratylus and Socrates. The dialogue's close symbolizes his own eventual philosophical choice between them.



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Plato: method and metaphysics in the Sophist and Statesman | Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology | Plato: on knowledge in the Theaetetus