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Method and Metaphysics in Plato's Sophist and Statesman

First published Thu Oct 6, 2005; substantive revision Wed Dec 2, 2009

The Sophist and Statesman are late Platonic dialogues, whose relative dates are established by their stylistic similarity to the Laws, a work that was apparently still “on the wax” at the time of Plato's death (Diogenes Laertius III.37). These dialogues are important in exhibiting Plato's views on method and metaphysics after he criticized his own most famous contribution to the history of philosophy, the theory of separate, immaterial forms, in the Parmenides. The Statesman also offers a transitional statement of Plato's political philosophy between the Republic and the Laws. The Sophist and Statesman show the author's increasing interest in mundane and practical knowledge. In this respect they seem more down-to-earth and Aristotelian in tone than dialogues dated to Plato's middle period like the Phaedo and the Republic. This essay will focus on method and metaphysics.

1. Introduction

The Sophist and Statesman represent themselves as the first two members of a trilogy, which was to include a third member, the Philosopher, a dialogue Plato never wrote. The conversations in the Sophist and Statesman take place sequentially on a single day and are dramatically linked to the Theaetetus, which occurred on the previous day, shortly before Socrates' trial (Theaetetus 210d, Sophist 216a). The Sophist is also linked more remotely to the Parmenides, a conversation Socrates says he had with the great philosopher of Elea, when Parmenides was very old and he was very young (Sophist 217c). Socrates plays a minor role in the conversations in the Sophist and Statesman, observing the proceedings but replaced as main speaker by a visitor from Elea, a follower of Parmenides, who converses with Theaetetus in the Sophist and with a young man named Socrates (the Younger) in the Statesman.

Although the Sophist and Statesman are dialogues, the interaction between the Stranger and his two young interlocutors seems very different from that between Socrates and his interlocutors in the Socratic dialogues, including the Theaetetus. In that dialogue Theaetetus distinguished himself as a highly promising student, who answered Socrates' questions resourcefully. The respondents in the Sophist and Statesman seem docile by comparison, readily accepting the Stranger's arguments and occasionally asking him to explain, but rarely raising tough objections or making good proposals of their own. Young Socrates in the Statesman is particularly prone to misunderstandings and mistakes. Of all the respondents in Plato's dialogues, the interlocutors in the Sophist and Statesman most closely resemble the respondent in the second part of the Parmenides, a young man named Aristotle (not the famous philosopher), who never objects when he should, and who gives his most enthusiastic assents when Parmenides' argument is most problematic or obscure.

These dramatic features raise questions of philosophical importance. Why does Plato connect the Sophist and Statesman with the Theaetetus and Parmenides, dialogues written in all probability a good deal earlier? Why do the speakers keep anticipating a third dialogue, the Philosopher (Sophist 216c–217b, with 218b–c; 253b–254b; Statesman 257a–c, with 258b), on a topic plainly dear to Plato's heart, which he then never wrote? Why does Plato replace Socrates with the colorless visitor from Elea? Elsewhere Plato allows speakers to give long speeches (e.g., Timaeus' account of cosmology in the Timaeus), so why does the visitor engage in question and answer, when he does most of the talking and his respondents seem unprepossessing and are chosen precisely because they are young and so likely to cause least trouble (cf. Sophist 217d with Parmenides 137b)?

The Sophist and Statesman strike many scholars as more dogmatic than other Platonic dialogues. The Stranger sets out to define the sophist, the statesman, and the philosopher, claiming that they are three distinct kinds (Sophist 217a–b); the two existing dialogues appear to give successful definitions of their target kinds and to present and defend significant methodological and metaphysical positions. The Sophist arguably solves the problem of false statement, one of a family of problems that had dogged other Platonic dialogues, including the Theaetetus.

Perhaps Plato replaces Socrates with the visitor from Elea because Elea was the hometown of Parmenides, and in the Sophist Plato plans to criticize Parmenides' dictum that we cannot speak or think of what is not (237a). Perhaps, too, readers are meant to recall the Parmenides, a dialogue staged some fifty years earlier, in which Parmenides himself led the conversation. After criticizing Plato's middle period treatment of forms (inadequately defended by a youthful Socrates), Parmenides announced that before positing forms Socrates should undertake rigorous philosophical training. In the second part of the dialogue, Parmenides then demonstrated with a youthful respondent the sort of exercise he had in mind, focusing on another thesis for which he was famous, that there is only one thing (Parmenides 128a–b, 137b). By using a visitor from Elea, Plato invites his audience to recall Parmenides' own positions and performance in that earlier dialogue. (For discussion of the dialogue form in these late works, cf. Frede 1996, Rowe 1996, and C. Gill 1996).

2. Purpose of the Sophist and Statesman

The Sophist and Statesman each undertakes a particular task, the first to define a sophist, the second to define a statesman. But they have a larger purpose. The Statesman gives many indications that the investigation of the statesman is being undertaken not primarily for its own sake but for the sake of a greater project—our becoming better dialecticians (285d).

The Stranger makes this announcement, first reminding Young Socrates of a previous discussion about children learning their letters:

Suppose someone should ask us about the children sitting together learning their letters: when one of them is asked of what letters some word or other is composed, do we ever say that the inquiry is more for the sake of the one problem set before him or for the sake of his becoming a better speller in all such cases?—Clearly for the sake of his becoming a better speller in all such cases.—Now again what about our inquiry about the statesman? Is it posed more for the sake of that thing itself [the statesman] or for the sake of our becoming more dialectical about everything?—This too is clear, that it's for the sake of our becoming more dialectical about everything. (285c–d)

Next the Stranger talks about examples, like weaving, for which there are perceptible likenesses, easy to understand, which an instructor can point to when an inquirer has trouble grasping an account. But there are other things, described as greatest and most valuable, that cannot be imaged. It is for the sake of these harder topics that the inquirers practice giving and receiving an account on simple examples, like weaving, where they can fall back on perceptible images. The Stranger says:

Hence it is necessary to practice being able to give and receive an account of each thing. For immaterial things, being finest and greatest, are shown clearly by an account alone and by nothing else, and all the things said now are for the sake of those. But in everything practice is easier in lesser things, rather than in greater things. (286a–b)

We first practice giving and receiving an account on easy examples like weaving, which can also be imaged. Then we practice on difficult examples, like the statesman. Here we must give and receive an account without relying on visual aids. But the statesman is still part of the exercise. Our inquiry about him is itself undertaken to make us better dialecticians, able to deal with all such topics. If we can succeed with the statesman, we will have learned a technique, or how to find a technique, that can be applied to other difficult cases, such as the philosopher.

The Statesman chiefly aims to demonstrate how to undertake all such inquiries. Its own inquiry stimulates the participants (and us readers) to recognize what mistakes to avoid and what paths are worth pursuing and why. But significantly, as one sees from comparing the treatments of the sophist and statesman, different kinds of subject matter demand different sorts of methods. So we cannot simply extend the methods of the Sophist and Statesman in a mechanical way to the investigation of the philosopher and other great and difficult topics. These dialogues teach us how to go about philosophical investigations. They do not offer a formula that can be simply applied to further cases.

If the Sophist and Statesman are philosophical exercises, there may be a good reason why the final dialogue of the trilogy, the Philosopher, is missing. Plato would spoil the lesson if he wrote it for us (cf. Dorter 1994, 236). If we have learned how to investigate philosophical problems in the Sophist and Statesman, Plato may be challenging his audience to search for the philosopher themselves, using the techniques and recommendations these dialogues provide.

3. Method

The Sophist and Statesman search for definitions, and both dialogues focus on the search. The Sophist speaks often of the hunt in which we are engaged and of the sophist as our quarry. In this hunt the sophist time and again eludes us, taking cover in the darkness of not-being, reappearing occasionally to dispute the very existence of the kind to which we wish to assign him. How can we define the sophist at all, if we cannot get hold of him or coherently characterize the kind to which he belongs? The Statesman repeatedly notices the road traveled—longer roads and shorter roads that will take us to our destination or lead us astray. The dialogue often reflects on better and worse methods of seeking the goal. The Sophist and the first part of the Statesman represent the search by means of an elaborate tree-like system of roads. The inquirers travel down these branching roads; at each fork they must choose which branch to take in the hope of finding their quarry, and that quarry alone, at the terminus. This method of discovery is called division, and in its most usual form it is the repeated dichotomy of a general kind into subordinate kinds (cf. Phaedrus 265e–266b). Inquirers use division to locate a target kind at the terminus of one branch of the division. A definition, when reached by this means, recounts the steps of that branch.

3.1 Names, Kinds, and Collection

Where does an investigation into a topic like sophistry or statesmanship begin? At the start of the search for the sophist, the Eleatic visitor remarks that he and Theaetetus may share merely the name “sophist” in common but may mean quite different things by the name. He aims to establish agreement about the kind to which they ascribe the name (218b–c), and he wants to find a real definition—a definition that applies to all and only members of the kind, and one that explains why any instance is an instance of that kind: the inquirers seek the essence of the target kind, the property or collection of properties that make the kind what it is.

As a preliminary step in locating the essence of a kind, the inquirers must figure out what people understand by the name of that kind. This opening maneuver can occur in several ways: First, what does the name connote, and what associations does it conjure up? The word “sophist” is cognate with the word “sophos,” which means “wise man.”[1] That connection suggests that the sophist has some sort of wisdom (sophia) or expertise (technê) (Sophist 221c–d). This idea enables the inquirers to locate the sophist's ability and practice at the outset in the wide kind art or expertise (technê). The word “statesman” in Greek (politikos) is cognate with the word “city” (polis), and so people associate the statesman's activity with affairs of a city (Statesman 305e). In addition, the Stranger relates statesman and king (258e) and relies on the Homeric epithet of Agamemnon as shepherd of the people (cf. Miller 2004, 40–43). The image of a herdsman quietly guides the initial attempt to define the statesman, whom the Stranger identifies in the opening division as herdsman of the human flock.

Second, what sorts of individuals does the name pick out, and what features do those individuals share? Readers of the Socratic dialogues will recall that when Socrates asks his “What is X” question (e.g., “What is piety?” “What is courage?” “What is knowledge?”), the respondent frequently opens with some sort of list. Euthyphro, when asked what piety is, says: “I say that piety is doing what I'm doing right now, prosecuting the wrongdoer, be it about murder or temple robbery or anything else, whether the wrongdoer is your father or your mother or anyone else” (Euthyphro 5d–e). Theaetetus, when asked what knowledge is, first replies: “I think the things someone might learn from Theodorus are knowledge—I mean geometry and the things you enumerated just now [arithmetic, astronomy, music]—and cobbling, too, and the arts (technai) of the other craftsmen; all of them together and each separately are simply knowledge” (Theaetetus 146c–d). Socrates regularly objects that the interlocutor has merely given him a list, whereas he wants to know what all the items on the list have in common, and what it is that makes them all instances of one kind. Although he complains about the list, it helps to orient the investigation, because reflection on the list enables the inquirers to see the common character shared by all the items enumerated.

The Phaedrus calls this technique collection, and it is used together with division, a procedure that is new in the late dialogues. A collection can occur at the beginning of an investigation and at any step of a division. By means of collection an inquirer brings together a number of disparate things or kinds of things, often called by different names, into one kind (Phaedrus 265d). The Statesman offers a good example of a collection at the outset of its inquiry. The visitor gathers together several kinds of things, called by different names, into one kind—the target kind to be defined:

Shall we posit the statesman, the king, the slave-master, and further the household manager, as one thing, although we call them all these names, or should we say there are as many arts as the names used? (Statesman 258e)

The visitor remarks that although we call these people by different names, they all have in common a power to maintain their rule by the strength of their understanding with little use of their hands and bodies (259c). This is a rough and ready description of the target kind which the inquirers hope to find at the terminus of their division. This crude description enables them to pick out a wide kind to divide (knowledge, epistêmê), and to take a number of steps in the division. The Stranger first divides knowledge into practical and theoretical and then seeks to locate the target at the terminus stemming from theoretical knowledge.

3.2 Models and Division

At the beginning of the investigation into the sophist, the Stranger says they need to practice their investigation on a model (paradeigma), before they embark on the difficult and controversial topic before them.

In the Parmenides and elsewhere Plato speaks of separate, immaterial forms as models (paradeigmata), and sensible particulars as likenesses of them, which somehow fall short of the original. This notion of a model recurs in the Sophist, in the Stranger's discussion of imitation (Sophist 235d–e). But the Sophist and Statesman use another conception as well. A model involves a mundane example which has a feature—sometimes an essential feature—relevant to the definition of the more difficult kind under investigation. In the Sophist, an angler, defined as a sort of hunter, guides the initial search for the sophist, who is also identified as a sort of hunter.

A model is not merely an example (or paradigmatic example) of some general kind, as angling is an example of hunting and more generally of expertise. The search for the definition of the example reveals a procedure, which can be transferred to the harder case, independent of content. Different models introduce different procedures. The model of the angler introduces the method of dichotomous division, and the definition of the angler recounts the steps on one side of that division. Both the procedure and definitional structure are featured in the harder case. The Statesman's main model, weaving, is offered much later in the investigation, after an initial attempt to define the statesman by dichotomous division has failed. Again, the example shares properties in common with the target kind—both the weaver and the statesman engage in the art of combination, among other things. The model also introduces a procedure that can be extended to the target. The Stranger calls the new procedure division “by limbs” (Statesman 287c). By means of such division he gradually marks off the kind to be defined (weaver or statesman) from other sorts of experts, who are related to it in various ways and operate in the same domain. Plato's models in the Sophist and Statesman typically reveal a productive next move or series of moves in an investigation. A model indicates how to go on—how to take the opening steps in an investigation or how to get beyond an impasse.

4. The Problem of the Sophist

The divisions in the Sophist and Statesman are divisions of arts (angling, sophistry, weaving, statecraft), and only secondarily of experts who possess those arts. The art is what makes the expert the sort of expert he is. The initial attempts to define the sophist and statesman, using the method of dichotomous division, each reveal a problem with the target kind, which is then resolved in some other way, or at least in conjunction with some other method. The puzzle about the sophist is that his art turns up, not at a single terminus like angling, but at many different termini. Reflection on this peculiarity enables the inquirers to recognize something they had previously missed—the essence of the sophist—which ties together the various previous appearances.

4.1 The Angler and the Sophist

The model of the angler demonstrates the method of dichotomous division and steers the first attempt to define the sophist. An angler has a humble profession, familiar to everyone (Sophist 218e): an angler hunts water creatures using a special sort of hook. The visitor arrives at his definition by first locating the angler's profession in a wide kind, art or expertise (technê). He divides art into two subordinate kinds, productive and acquisitive, then continues to divide the acquisitive branch until he reaches the terminus, where he finds angling marked off as what it is, apart from everything else. The sophist resembles the angler in possessing expertise, but more intimately as well. He, too, is a sort of hunter, but one who hunts terrestrial creatures rather than aquatic. The Stranger first defines the sophist as a hired hunter of rich young men (223b; 231d).

So far angling seems well suited to direct the inquirers toward their goal. Set on the right track, they readily complete the rest of the division. But at the end of the first division, the Stranger remarks that the sophist's art is really quite complicated (223c). He then turns his attention to a feature mentioned toward the end of that division. The sophist earns wages from those he hunts. He has a product to sell. Returning to acquisitive art, the Stranger this time ignores the branch that leads to hunting, and instead follows the other branch, beginning from the art of acquisition by exchange, and defines the sophist as someone engaged in commerce, who sells products for the soul (224c–d; 231d). In the pages that follow, the Stranger focuses on various features of the sophist's activity and defines him in five different ways. Each time the sophist turns up at the tips of branches that stem from acquisitive art. Then on a sixth round the Stranger makes a fresh initial division of art, marking off the art of separation, and finds the sophist at the terminus of a branch originating from there.

What should we make of the fact that the sophist turns up all over the tree, and not at a single terminus like the angler? The angler differs from the sophist in two main respects. First, the essence of the angler is evident from his activity and is easy to spell out using dichotomous division. As the Stranger says in the Statesman (see above § 2), some things are easily pictured. We can perceive the angler's essential activity, fishing by means of a special hook, and readily depict it. The essence of the sophist, too, might seem easy to picture from his activities. He engages in many activities, which we can observe. So it seems appropriate to define him in a number of ways. But the essence of the sophist, as we soon discover, is none of those things. His essential activity cannot be pictured, as angling can.

Second, the nature of angling is uncontroversial, and the Stranger and Theaetetus mean the same thing by the name (Sophist 218e). By contrast, people have various conceptions of what sophistry is, witnessed by the numerous divisions. They may also disagree about what individuals fall under the kind. Because sophistry is a disputed notion, people may have different conceptions of it, and some conceptions may be simply mistaken.

4.2 Appearances

The sophist is not unique in his tendency to turn up all over a tree. Anything, including very simple things, can do the same, because people experience them in different ways and so have different conceptions of them. People tend to share the same concept of an angler, because he engages in a single observable activity. But anything of any complexity, which engages in several activities, is apt to be conceived in different ways by different people. Some of those conceptions may capture the entity by a feature or activity essential to it, but many others will capture it in some accidental way. Division does not itself guarantee that one attends to essential features. Furthermore, a dispute might arise about virtually any entity, but in many cases we can sort out disagreements by perception or by some straightforward decision-procedure (we can settle disputes about number by counting; disputes about size or weight by measuring or weighing; cf. Euthyphro 7b–c; Phaedrus 263a–c). In other cases there is no ready way to decide.

The anomalous sixth division of the sophist (Sophist 226b–231b) reveals that sophistry is a disputed concept. Whereas the first five divisions locate the sophist somewhere under acquisitive art, the sixth division locates him in a quite different place, under the art of separation, which the Stranger did not mark off in the original dichotomous division. This sophist purifies souls of beliefs that interfere with learning, and he looks a lot like Socrates. The Stranger queries using the label “sophist” in this case and calls the art he has just uncovered the “noble” art of sophistry. The sixth division exploits the fact that many people mistook Socrates for a sophist (cf. Aristophanes' depiction of Socrates in the Clouds and Socrates' defense against the charge in Plato's Apology). This definition fails to capture the sophist by even an accidental feature, but instead snares a distinct kind, which merely has the same name owing to a superficial resemblance.

The sophist is special not because he turns up in so many places, or because some conceptions pick out different kinds altogether which merely share the same name. The sophist is unique because the multiplicity in his case reflects not only something about us and our experience, but also something about him and his art. The Stranger restates the six definitions of the sophist (231c–e), and then observes:

Do you know that, when someone appears to know many things, and is called by the name of one art, this appearance (phantasma) is not sound, but it is clear that the person experiencing it in relation to some art is unable to see that [feature] of it toward which all these sorts of learning look, and so he addresses the person having them by many names rather than one? (232a)

The Stranger has defined the sophist as a hired hunter of rich young men, as engaged in selling his own and other people's wares for the soul, as an expert in disputation about justice and injustice, and so on. Why is the appearance not sound, and why does it indicate that we, who experience that appearance, have failed to see that feature “toward which all these sorts of learning look”? We have called all six conceptions by the name “sophist.” Why does the Stranger say that those who experience this unhealthy appearance call the entity by many names instead of one?

The Stranger will go on to point out that the sophist makes people think he knows things he doesn't know (232b–233c). His pretense would certainly explain the unhealthiness of the appearance of manifold expertise. But the preceding discussion and definitions leading up to the quoted passage have not revealed the sophist's pretense. One must look ahead in the dialogue to see that. Instead the unhealthy appearance seems to rest on the very fact that the sophist, as so far defined, has so many sorts of expertise—he knows how to hunt, how to make a profit, how to sell his own intellectual wares, how to dispute about justice and injustice, how to purify the soul of ignorance (cf. Notomi 1999, 80). Our judgment is unsound because we, who experience the sophist's appearance of manifold expertise, fail to detect that feature of his art “toward which all these sorts of learning look”—something about the sophist that explains why he seems to know so much, something about him that would justify our calling him by one name: “sophist.”

What is that one thing we are missing? As the discussion proceeds, the Stranger argues that we are missing the feature of sophists that explains how they can successfully appear wise to their students, when they are not in fact wise (233b). We carefully defined the sophist in terms of many of his activities but none of those makes him what he is. We have so far missed the essence of the sophist. That is why we mistakenly call him by many names instead of one.

The Stranger introduces a new model (233d) to help us recognize the special nature of the sophist's art. Consider someone who claims to make all things by means of a single art. The one art that might enable him to do that is the art of imitation, which creates images with the same names as the originals (234b). The imitator might fool children, who gaze at his products from a distance, into thinking he can make anything he wants. Again, someone might achieve the same result with statements (logoi), making large things appear small, and easy things hard (234c–e). This person, too, could fool young people who don't know. In short, the sophist is a sort of wizard, who imitates things with words (234e–235a). What links all the appearances together is the sophist's skill at imitating people who truly know the things he appears to know.

With this insight, the Stranger declares that we have nearly caught the sophist, and he sets off once again with his divisions (he finally completes this seventh division at the end of the dialogue). This time the visitor ignores the entire branch of acquisitive art from which the first five divisions set out and instead takes the branch of productive art down to image-making, which he divides into two parts: (1) copy-making (eikastikê), and (2) appearance-making (phantastikê). Whereas a copy-maker preserves the proportions of the model (paradeigma in its more usual sense), and keeps the appropriate colors and other details; an appearance-maker alters the true proportions of the original, so that the image appears beautiful from a distance (235e–236c). In which group should we locate the sophist? The Stranger's proclaimed uncertainty on this point takes him into the dialogue's main project, the investigation of not-being. He has to make sense of appearances.

This appearing and seeming, but not being, and stating things, but not true [things], all these were always full of difficulty in the past and they still are. It is very difficult, Theaetetus, to find terms in which to say that there really is false stating or judging, and to utter this without being caught in a contradiction. (236e–237a)

In essence the sophist produces appearances, and more precisely false appearances. So to understand the sophist, the inquirers have to make sense of appearances and their production. And to do that, the Stranger must take on Parmenides, who famously said:

Never shall this be proved, that things that are not are. When you inquire, keep your thought from that route. (237a = Diels and Kranz 1951–52, 28B7.1–2)

5. Not-Being and Being

To define the sophist as an expert in deception, as someone who produces false appearances by means of statements, the Stranger needs to show that Parmenides was wrong; he needs to demonstrate that it is possible to say and to think that things that are not are, and to do so without contradiction. He starts with a series of puzzles about not-being and then suggests that we may be in similar confusion about being.

5.1 Puzzles

What makes it seem impossible to think or talk about not-being is a false assumption about negation. The inquirers assume that a negation specifies the opposite of the item negated (240b, 240d). Think of opposites as polar incompatibles—a pair of opposed terms that exclude each other. These include polar contraries, like black and white, or hot and cold, which have some intermediate between them; and polar contradictories, like odd and even, large and not-large, or beautiful and not-beautiful, which do not (see Keyt 1973, 300 n. 33). If not-being is the opposite of being, then not-being is nothing at all, and we cannot think about that. A second source of trouble about not-being infects being as well. The speakers mistakenly assume that there is a one-to-one correspondence between a name and a thing: a name picks out something, different names pick out different things, and each thing has one proper name. The Stranger later attributes the idea to some people he derisively calls Late-Learners, who urge that we call a thing only by its own name and not by any other. Thus they allow us to call a man “man” and the good “good,” but they do not allow us to call a man “good” (251b–c) (for this interpretation of the Late-Learners, see Moravcsik, 1962, 56–59; cf. Bostock, 1984, 99–100).

Given these assumptions, it seems impossible to talk about not-being coherently (on the puzzles about not-being, cf. Owen 1971, 241–250). The first puzzle (237b–e) shows that we cannot meaningfully use the phrase “what is not,” because the phrase attempts and fails to pick out nothing. The second puzzle (238a–c) shows that we cannot say anything meaningful about what is not (i.e., about nothing), because in using the words “what is not” we treat the referent as one thing (by using the singular). The third puzzle (238d–239c) shows that we contradict ourselves even trying to state the puzzles. If not-being is the opposite of being (i.e., nothing), and if there is a one-to-one correspondence between a name and a thing, then Parmenides was right: we cannot coherently think or talk about not-being. The Stranger still finds these puzzles persuasive at the end of the dialogue, because he says: “If a statement is of nothing, it would not be a statement at all, for we have shown that a statement that is a statement (logos) of nothing cannot be a statement” (263c). In a final pair of puzzles (239c–240c; 240c–241b), the Stranger shows that Parmenides also provides the sophist a means to escape his pursuers (241a–c). The sophist does not say what is not after all, because his images, though not the originals, are not nothing either, but other things like the originals, and hence things that are. The speakers later recognize that they made a mistake in assuming that not-being is the opposite of being (257b; 258e), but at this stage negation confounds them.

This essay skips over the puzzles about being, which aim to show that we are in as much confusion about being as we are about not-being, a situation that gives the Stranger hope: to the extent that we get clear about being or not-being, we can will get clear about the other as well (250e–251a) (Owen 1971, 229–31, called this claim the “Parity Assumption.”)[2]

5.2 Great Kinds

To show that we can call one thing by many names and that some names specify a thing but misdescribe it, the Stranger introduces some machinery. He proposes that some kinds can partake of, or blend or associate with, other kinds (these terms appear to be synonyms and to introduce an asymmetrical relation between an entity and a property it has (pace Cornford 1935, 255–57; see Ackrill 1957, 216–18), whereas some kinds cannot blend with each other (251d–252e). There are great kinds that enable the blending of kinds, much as vowels enable consonants to fit together (252e–253a). Even as some expertise is required to determine which letters can associate with which, so dialectic is required to determine which kinds blend with which others and which exclude each other, and which kinds hold everything together and make them capable of blending, and which are causes of division (253b–e). (For two alternative interpretations of dialectic in the Sophist, see Stenzel 1931 [1940]; Gómez-Lobo 1977.)

The Stranger announces that there are five great kinds (254b–c), and he will ask two questions about them: (1) Of what sort are they? and (2) what capacity do they have to associate with other things? (254c). The kinds he discusses are: change, rest, being, sameness and difference. He will eventually identify not-being with difference (258d–e).

The Stranger does not say that these five are the only great kinds. There are probably others, including likeness and unlikeness, and oneness and multitude (cf. Parmenides 129d–e and 130b). The second part of the Parmenides investigates such kinds, especially oneness and multitude, being and not-being, but also sameness and difference, likeness and unlikeness, equality and inequality, and others. The Stranger presumably selects the five he does in the Sophist, because for the present purpose he needs a pair of opposites that exclude each other (change and rest, described as “most opposite” [250a], serve as consonant forms which cannot blend) and three vowel forms—being, sameness, and difference—which enable kinds to fit together or to be marked off from others.

The central section of the Sophist has been much discussed and remains controversial. The distinction between consonant and vowel forms concerns the way kinds relate to other kinds, but different types of forms usually play these two roles. Consonant forms typically have categorial content—that is, they can be organized into genus-species trees, like entities in Aristotle's Categories and like the kinds in the earlier divisions in the Sophist. Vowel forms are typically content-neutral, and the greatest of the great kinds apply to everything, including their own opposite. Philosophers in the Middle Ages would call such kinds transcendentals, since they transcend Aristotle's ten categories (substance, quantity, quantity, and the other categories). Gilbert Ryle called them syncategorematic: these entities are not highly general kinds. If one views them as such, one treats them as categorial, since highest genera have (very general) categorial content. In Ryle's words, the vowel forms “function not like the bricks but like the arrangement of the bricks in a building” (Ryle 1939 [1965], esp. 131, 143–44). They structure other kinds and enable them to relate to one another. I will call them structural kinds (in using this label, I do not mean to suggest that categorial kinds lack structure, only that structural kinds are purely structural and derive categorial content through their applications).

Structural kinds apply to categorial individuals and kinds on the basis of other, ultimately categorial properties those entities have. For instance, two objects are equal or unequal if they have some definite size or duration, or if they are numerable. Two objects are like, if they have one or more categorial properties in common. A red cube and a red ball are like because they share redness in common. They are unlike, because their shapes are different. Structural kinds themselves are determined as what they are by their functional roles in enabling categorial kinds to be what they are and/or to associate with or differ from one another.

Change and rest are great kinds, but they exclude—are incompatible with—each other. Plato sometimes treats change as a categorial kind. In the Parmenides (138b–c, cf. Theaetetus 181c–d), it is divided into species, alteration and locomotion, and locomotion is further divided into spinning in the same place and moving from one place to another. The Stranger needs a pair of consonant forms to demonstrate the operation of the vowel forms. (Note that the status of change and rest is problematic, since sometimes they are listed along with other structural kinds, e.g., Parmenides 129d–e, 136a–c; for one interpretation of change and rest in the Sophist, see Reeve 1985.) I believe that for the purposes of the second half of the Sophist, we must regard change and rest as categorial consonant kinds, since many of the arguments depend on their being opposites which exclude each other.

5.3 The Distinction of Great Kinds

In the first part of this section (254d–255e), the Stranger addresses question (1): Of what sort is each of the great kinds? He distinguishes each of the five kinds from one another, starting with being, change, and rest. Change and rest, as opposites, do not associate with each other; but being applies to both, since we say that both of them are. Being must be a third thing distinct from them, for if being, which applies to both opposites, were the same as either of them—say change—then when being applies to rest, by substitution rest would partake of its own opposite, which is impossible (254d, with 249e–250c). The Stranger uses a similar argument to show that sameness and difference are distinct from change and rest (254e–255b). Furthermore, being is distinct from sameness. They have to be different, because if they were not, when we say that change and rest both are, we could substitute “are” with “the same,” and change would be the same as rest. (Much more can be said about sameness: for discussion see Lewis 1976, and de Vries 1988.)

Finally, the Stranger distinguishes difference from being. This argument introduces a crucial distinction between two senses or uses of “is” and deserves a separate subsection.

5.4 The Distinction between Difference and Being

The Stranger begins with an important distinction, which he uses to differentiate difference from being:

But I suppose you agree that some of the things that are are themselves by themselves (auta kath hauta), whereas others are always said in relation to other things (pros alla).—Of course.—But difference is always in relation to something different (pros heteron), isn't it?—Yes.—And this would not be the case, if being and difference were not distinct. For if difference partook of both forms (i.e., auto kath hauto and pros alla), as being does, then something even among the different things could be different without being different in relation to something different. But in fact it has turned out for us that necessarily whatever is different is the very thing that it is [i.e., different] from something different. (255c–d)

So the nature of difference is a fifth kind (255d–e).

Furthermore, we shall say that it goes through all of them, since each one is different from the others not because of its own nature, but because it partakes of the form of the different. (255e)

Difference is distinct from being, because difference is always relative to other things (pros alla), whereas being is both itself by itself (auto kath hauto) and relative to other things (pros alla).

What is it for something to be itself by itself and/or in relation to other things (for a detailed discussion of this distinction, see Dancy 1999)? The traditional understanding of the distinction relies on a passage from Diogenes Laertius (first half of the 3rd century CE). Diogenes uses the expression “in relation to something” (pros ti) in place of “in relation to other things” (pros alla):

Of things that are, some are by themselves (kath heauta), whereas others are said in relation to something (pros ti). Things said by themselves are ones that need nothing further in their interpretation. These would be, for instance, man, horse and other animals, since none of these gains through interpretation. All the things said in relation to something need in addition some interpretation, for instance, that which is greater than something and that which is quicker than something and the more beautiful and such things. For the greater is greater than something less and the quicker is quicker than something. So of things that are some are said themselves by themselves (auta kath hauta), whereas others are said in relation to something (pros ti). In this way, according to Aristotle, he [Plato] used to divide the primary things. (Diogenes Laertius III.108–109)

Many scholars have thought that, in saying that being is said both itself by itself (auto kath hauto) and in relation to other things (pros alla), Plato distinguishes different senses of the verb “to be”—a complete or absolute sense (= existence, as in “The sea is”) and an incomplete sense (the “is” of predication, as in “the sea is blue” and/or the “is” of identity, as in “the sea is the sea”) (Cornford 1935; Ackrill 1957). There is no separate verb “to exist” in classical Greek. Existence was expressed by means of the verb “to be.”

If the Stranger characterizes being as having two (or more) senses, we expect Plato to mention two (or more) forms of being, one for each sense. Note that the Stranger introduces sameness as a distinct kind, which should take care of the “is” of identity, so the real issue is whether Plato distinguishes two other senses of the verb “to be”, a complete sense and an incomplete predicative sense. Michael Frede (1967, 1992) and G. E. L. Owen (1971) argue that Plato does not mark off two senses of the verb “to be,” but only different uses. There are significant differences between these scholars' views, but their common ground, that Plato uses “being” only as an incomplete predicate, has been queried. Sentences in the Sophist like, “Change is, because it partakes of being” (256a) are most naturally construed as using “is” as a complete predicate (existence).

But if Plato does use the verb “to be” as a complete predicate, why does he not mention two forms, existence and a form designated by the incomplete “is” of predication? Lesley Brown (1986) has argued that there is no sharp semantic distinction between the two syntactically distinct uses of the verb “to be” in “x is F” and “x is.” The “is” in “x is” is complete but allows a further completion. If Brown is right, Plato need not distinguish two senses of “is”, yet claims in the Sophist like “Change is, because it partakes of being,” can also be accommodated. Change is (exists), because it is something—it has a property that makes it the very thing that it is: change.

Notice that on this view the complete use of “is” in Greek does not correspond to existence in our modern sense: we say that horses exist, whereas imaginary objects, like Pegasus, do not. On the proposed interpretation, anything describable is (exists). So Pegasus is (exists), since we can describe him as a winged horse. On the other hand, what is not is nothing at all—indescribable. It was this notion of not-being—nothing—that was responsible for the earlier puzzles about not-being in the Sophist. (For criticisms of Brown's view, see Malcolm 2006b, and for criticisms of Malcolm and Brown, see Leigh 2008.)

Supposing that being is a structural kind that functions in two ways, let us consider its operation with categorial kinds. Take some categorial kind F. F is itself by itself (auto kath hauto), if being links F to its own nature, to what F is by (or because of) itself. For instance, change is changing by itself, largeness is large by itself, heat is hot by itself, the one is one by itself. All of these statements are self-predications of the sort Plato's characters mention in earlier dialogues (largeness is large, justice is just; for self-predications in the Sophist, see 258b–c). Scholars disagree about how to understand self-predication in Plato. (For a view quite different from that articulated here, see the entry on Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology.) The item in the subject position and the item in the predicate position are identical, but the relation between them is predication (cf. Heinaman 1981). F has its own nature by (or because of) itself. One might say that the property F exhausts what F is in its own right.

F is in relation to other things, if being links F to something other than itself. For instance, change is different from rest. Here being links change to difference, and difference relates change to something other than change. Or change is the same as itself: “When we say change is the same as itself, we speak in this way because of its participation in the same in relation to itself [pros heautên])” (256a–b). Being links change to sameness, and sameness relates change to itself.

Notice that Plato speaks often of participation and blending but mentions no distinct form of participation. He mentions no distinct form, because being simply is the form that links a subject to a property it has.

Difference is always in relation to something different (pros heteron) (255d). Difference invariably relates the kind F to something different from F.

Although the operation of difference as a structural kind always relates an entity F to something other than F, difference can itself stand in the subject position and be related to itself (via being itself by itself). Difference is different by (or because of) itself (259a–b, with 255e and 258b–c). Being and difference admit of self-predication like any other kind.

5.5 The Blending of Kinds

The second part of the treatment of great kinds takes up question (2): What capacity do the five kinds have to associate with one another? The Stranger carries out the analysis for one great kind, change (255e–256d), and argues very systematically that change is non-identical with each of the other four kinds (change is not rest, not the same, and so on), but partakes of three of the four—all but rest. Thus it turns out that change both is and is not each of the others (the Stranger even adds the counterfactual: if change could partake of rest there would be nothing strange about calling it resting [256b]). The whole analysis is implemented with two relations: non-identity (F-ness is not G-ness, because F-ness partakes of difference from G-ness), and positive predication (F-ness is G, because F-ness partakes of G-ness). For example, change is not the same, because change partakes of difference from the same, but change is the same, because change partakes of sameness in relation to itself (256a–b).

Scholars have noted that the Stranger's machinery, as so far articulated, seems insufficient to address the upcoming problem of false statement. The visitor has provided an analysis of identity (via being and sameness), non-identity (via being and difference), and positive predication (via being). What about negative predication, which Plato needs for the analysis of false statements, like “Theaetetus is flying”? Isn't this statement false, precisely because the negative predication, “Theaetetus is not flying,” is true? Can Plato also handle negative predication?

6. False Statement

With the main machinery in place for his analysis, the Stranger will shortly turn to false statement. But two preliminary topics remain: (1) How does negation work? (2) What is a statement?

6.1 Negation

The Stranger made a serious mistake about negation in the puzzles about not-being earlier in the dialogue (highlighted at 240b, 240d), in supposing that the negation in “not-being” indicates the opposite (enantion) of being. The opposite of being (its polar contradictory) is nothing, and Parmenides is right that we cannot speak or think about nothing: if we speak or think at all, we speak or think about something. But Parmenides mistakenly thought that all talk about not-being is attempted talk about nothing.

The Stranger solves the problem of not-being by recognizing two things: (1) the negation operates on the predicate, not the subject; (2) the negation need not specify the opposite of the item negated but only something different from it.

Some scholars think that the Stranger extends his machinery to include negative predication, as well as non-identity, at the end of the section on great kinds. He appears to switch his focus from the subject-kind to the predicate-kind, which he says applies to or is about the subject. He sums up his conclusions about change and generalizes to other kinds saying: “And so necessarily not-being applies to (epi) change and to (kata) all the other kinds” (256d); and then: “So about (peri) each of the forms the being is much and the not-being is unlimited in multitude” (256e). Some scholars take the not-being that applies to change to include negative predicables (e.g., not quick) as well as kinds it differs from (e.g., rest) (for interpretations of this sentence, see McDowell 1982, and Frede 1992).

The Stranger calls attention to the mistake about negation and offers a solution. Here too he focuses on the predicate-kind:

When we say “not being” (to mê on), as it seems, we don't mean something opposite to being, but only different.—How?—For instance, when we call something “not large,” we don't indicate by the expression the small any more than the equal.—Of course.—So we won't agree when someone says a negation signifies an opposite; we will agree only to this much, that the “not” when prefixed to the names following it reveals something different [from the names], or rather from the things which the names uttered after the negation designate. (257b–c)

Apparently, when one says, “Simmias is not large,” one indicates by the “not” merely something different from large. Simmias could be equal or small in comparison with someone else.

Now there is a pressing interpretive question. Does the speaker designate by “not large” just anything other than large (e.g., human being, just, red-haired, blue-eyed, etc. etc.)? (Keyt 1973 and Brown 2008 call this the “Oxford interpretation.” The discussion of not large itself suggests otherwise. “Different from large,” while it does not mean the opposite of large (= small), surely means some size other than large, which includes large, equal and small. The negation appears to specify part of a wider kind which is determined by the positive item (large) that is negated—in this case size (cf. Philip 1968, Ferejohn 1989, Brown 2008; Brown calls this the “incompatibility range” interpretation).

In characterizing the nature of difference, the Stranger compares it to knowledge (257c–d) (on this analogy, cf. Lee 1972). Knowledge is of course a categorial kind, and many species of knowledge differ structurally from one another (cf. below § 7.2). Even so, the comparison is instructive because some branches of knowledge, such as applied mathematics, are distinguished from one another, not by intrinsic differences in the structure of the expertise, but simply by differences in the objects to which the same expertise applies (e.g., calculation in surveying and navigation). Like varieties of applied mathematics, whose content is supplied by the domain to which the knowledge is applied, there are parts of difference whose content is supplied by the item negated.

The visitor gives a second example of negation, which helps to clarify this point. There is a part of the different that is placed over against the beautiful. This is called “not beautiful” and it is different from nothing other than the nature (phusis) of the beautiful (257d). The Stranger then says:

Doesn't it turn out in this way that the not beautiful, having been marked off from (aphoristhen) some one kind among beings, is also again in turn set in opposition (antitethen) to some one of the things that are? (257e)

He mentions two kinds in addition to the not-beautiful, since he marks off the not-beautiful from some one kind among beings, and then sets it in opposition to the nature of the beautiful. The not-beautiful is not just anything other than beautiful, but something other than beautiful within a kind that covers both (call it “the aesthetic”). On this view a part of difference gets its categorial content from the item negated in two ways. First, it falls within a wider kind (such as size, temperature, the aesthetic), specified by predicable F, and that kind is exhausted by F and its opposite (call this an incompatibility range); and second, not-F is something different from F on that range. The part of difference different from F need not be the opposite of F (that was the earlier mistake), but merely some item other than F on that range.

6.2 Statement

Making a statement (true or false) requires three steps (cf. Frede 1992, who mentions two steps): First, one must pick out an individual or kind to say something about—a statement must be about something to be a statement at all. Second, one must pick out an individual or kind to relate to the original entity. Third, one asserts a relation between the two items—identity, difference (non-identity), or participation. A statement consists minimally of two parts, one part that refers to the entity the statement is about (subject), and one part that says something about that entity (predicate). Only if the predicate states something about a subject is there a complex—a statement—that can be true or false (262e–263b).

The Stranger distinguishes between names and verbs (261e–262a). A verb is a sign that is set over actions; a name is a sign that is set over the things that perform the actions (262a). There cannot be a sentence that simply consists of a string of names or a string of verbs. A statement must minimally fit a name together with a verb (262a–c).

The central idea about statements is very simple. A statement has structure and its parts perform different functions. The name refers to something, and if it fails to pick out anything the statement does not come off (262e). The verb ascribes an action to the subject. If someone asserts a predicate of a subject, and the assertion states something that is about the subject (i.e., an action the subject is performing), the statement is true. If the predicate states something that is not about the subject (i.e., something different from what is true about it), then the statement is false (263b). For instance, “Theaetetus is sitting” is true, because “sitting” specifies something that is about Theaetetus, who is currently sitting. “Theaetetus is flying” is false, because “flying” specifies something different from what is about Theaetetus (namely sitting).

6.3 Negative Predication

The statements the Stranger considers, “Man learns,” “Theaetetus is sitting,” and “Theaetetus is flying,” are all positive predications, the first two true, the third false. But as noted above (§ 5.5), we need negative predication to analyze the false statement, “Theaetetus is flying.” Since the statement is false, the statement “Theaetetus is not flying” is true.

Negative predication has received considerable attention in the scholarly literature on the Sophist (for helpful accounts of the various interpretations, and their advantages and disadvantages, see Keyt 1973). Some scholars think that Plato needs a second notion of negation in addition to difference (understood as distinctness or non-identity), such as incompatibility, to accommodate negative predication. On this view, flying is incompatible with one of Theaetetus' properties (namely sitting). The incompatibility interpretation faces the difficulty that Plato must change the meaning of heteron from “different” to “incompatible”, and there is no evidence in the text that he does. Alternatively, on the Oxford interpretation, which preserves one meaning for heteron, Plato needs universal quantification in order to analyze negative predication. On this view, to analyze the statement “Theaetetus is not flying”, he needs to show that flying is different from everything that Theaetetus is—a man, snub-nosed, sitting, and so on. Plato does not provide such an account (see Wiggins 1971; Bostock 1984, 113; White 1993, §§ 10, 11).

If Plato construes difference as a structural kind, which operates in the way we have discussed (the incompatibility range interpretation), he can handle negative predication without introducing a second meaning of heteron. We need not consider all of Theaetetus' properties to explain the falsehood of “Theaetetus is flying.” The analysis of negative predication is complex. First, the item negated, say large, specifies an incompatibility range, in this case size, which consists of a pair of opposites (polar contradictories) large and not-large. The negation indicates somethingdifferent (non-identical, distinct) from large on that range. Thus, in the case of Theaetetus' imagined flight, we must simply find that property different from flying within the relevant incompatibility range. The relevant incompatibility range appears to be our pair of consonant forms: rest/change. Since Theaetetus is currently sitting (a species of rest), his current rest excludes flying (a species of change). We can explain his not flying by appeal to his sitting.

7. Method and Metaphysics in the Statesman

Like the Sophist, the opening division in the Statesman locates a problem with its target kind. Whereas the sophist turned up all over the tree, the statesman turns up at a single terminus, but he is not alone, since many rivals have a claim to be there too. Just as the puzzle about the sophist revealed by the opening divisions indicated something significant about the essence of a sophist, so the competition at a single terminus indicates something significant about the essence of a statesman.

7.1 The Statesman and the Herdsman

The Statesman embarks on its division without a model. Apparently the angler from the previous dialogue serves as a viable guide for the method of dichotomous division itself. As we noted in § 3.1, the Statesman opens its investigation with a collection of entities that make up the target kind, and this allows a crude description of the kind to be defined, which guides the inquiry. Since the members of the target group can direct and control other people by means of their understanding without physical manipulation, the Stranger starts his division from the wide kind knowledge and immediately divides it into practical and theoretical, and then looks for the statesman down the branch originating from theoretical knowledge.

The opening division takes place in two stages—a first stage that focuses on the statesman's knowledge, followed by a lecture on method, and a second stage that focuses on the object of that knowledge. Both phases of the division are peculiar but in quite different ways.

Consider stage one. Having set off down the theoretical branch of knowledge in search of the statesman, the Stranger divides theoretical knowledge into two sub-kinds. One kind recognizes difference, judges things recognized and then leaves off (the Stranger locates the art of calculation here); the other kind recognizes difference and judges things recognized, and then directs on the basis of that judgment (he locates statecraft here) (Statesman 259d–260c). Directing suggests practical, if not hands-on, knowledge. Keep in mind that the Stranger marked off practical knowledge and abandoned it at the start (cf. Dorter 1994, 184). Next he divides directive knowledge into two sorts: one sort passes on the directions of others (heralds belong here), while the other passes on its own directions for the sake of generation (the statesman belongs here) (260c–261b). Knowledge for the sake of generation/production again suggests practical expertise. The statesman's knowledge looks ever more practical as the division proceeds. At the next division one kind passes on its own directions to generate inanimate creatures (the master-builder belongs here), whereas the other generates animate things (the statesman belongs here) (261b–d). The Stranger then divides this latter kind into those who generate and rear single animate things (ox-drivers and grooms belong here), and those who generate and rear them in herds (the statesman and herdsman belong here) (261d). Once the statesman merges with the herdsman, the theoretical branch has become thoroughly mixed up with the practical branch originally discarded. The knowledge of horse-breeders, cowherds, shepherds, and swineherds is practical and scarcely theoretical. No wonder the statesman has company at the terminus. Everyone concerned with practical aspects of human care—farmers, millers, physical trainers, and doctors—turns up at the terminus together with him (267e).

At the end of the first stage of the division, when the inquirers have reached herd-rearing, the Stranger invites Young Socrates to make the next division himself. By now Socrates sees where the division is heading and proposes to mark off the rearing of humans (= statecraft) from the rearing of beasts (ordinary herding) (262a). The Stranger objects that that is like dividing the human race into Greek and barbarian—we have a name “barbarian,” but it merely refers to humans who do not speak Greek. The mistake is like marking off the number 10,000 from all the other numbers (262a–263a). Numbers other than 10,000 share merely a negative property—being numbers other than 10,000. The Stranger insists that Young Socrates divide through the middle of things, not break off one small part, leaving many large ones behind, which fail to constitute a kind. The visitor goes on to give a lecture on the difference between mere parts of a kind and parts that are themselves genuine kinds (263b). Apparently real kinds include only members that have some positive feature in common, whereas mere parts include members that share only some negative feature.

Scholars have taken the Stranger's lecture very seriously as indicating Plato's views about proper procedure and the metaphysics on which division relies (see Moravcsik 1973, Cohen 1973, and Wedin 1987). But before we assess Young Socrates' mistake and the Stranger's lecture, we should consider the second stage of the division, which purportedly demonstrates correct procedure.

First the visitor retraces his steps and points out that in speaking of rearing animate things, they had already in effect divided living creatures into wild and tame (264a). All rearing deals with tame creatures, and some of that rearing devotes itself to tame animals in herds. He then divides herd-rearing into aquatic and terrestrial (the branch he pursues). Next he marks off the winged from the footed (the branch he pursues); then the horned (oxen, sheep) from the hornless (the branch he pursues); then the interbreeding (horses, donkeys) from the non-interbreeding (the branch he pursues); and finally the four-footed (just pigs are left) from the two-footed (humans). He now defines statecraft as rearing the two-footed, non-interbreeding, hornless, footed, terrestrial, tame herd: humans (267a–c).

This division has given Platonic division a bad name. Why does Young Socrates go along with it? One sees that something is amiss when the swineherd turns out to be more akin to the statesman than he is to the cowherd and shepherd. There is much to query about this division, but the main question is this. How is the isolation of human beings from other animals by means of their physical features relevant to statecraft? Statecraft is a kind of knowledge that deals with humans, but (unlike human biology) is not particularly concerned with their physical features. The second stage of the division adds nothing to the definition of statecraft.

7.2 The Statesman's Knowledge

Young Socrates has made some sort of mistake, but his division of herding into the herding of humans and the herding of other animals seems to have considerable merit and indeed to apply two lessons from earlier that day. First, according to the Sophist (cf. § 6.1 above), both a predicable form and its negation, such as large and not-large, or beautiful and not-beautiful, are forms with their own natures (Sophist 257e–258a). So why can't there be a form of animal other than human? The group even has a common name, “beast.” And why can't there be a form of human speakers other than Greeks, especially since this group too has a common name “barbarian”? Second, the Stranger said in the Sophist that parts of knowledge derive their names from the objects they are set over (Sophist 257c–d). Relying on those earlier guidelines, Young Socrates reasonably thinks that he can distinguish the statesman's knowledge from other forms of herding by their objects: humans and beasts.

Socrates made the right cut, but he has lost sight of the target. The kind to be divided is knowledge of a particular sort—a sort of herd-rearing. He should be distinguishing the knowledge of human herding from all other herding by a difference in the mode of herding (Statesman 275a). He treats herding as though it were a single undifferentiated whole, marked off merely by the objects to which it applies. But herding is not like calculation, which can simply be applied to different objects. There is an internal structural difference between the art of human herding (= statecraft) and all other herding (cf. Lane 1998, 44). Socrates has in fact made two mistakes. First, as the upcoming myth shows, the aspect of humans relevant to statecraft is not their biological features, but their way of life, their culture and expertise (274b–e).[3] Second, even if one thinks of humans and other herd animals in the right way, in terms of their way of life, that still does not address the rivalry at the terminus in the statesman's case. No one disputes with the cowherd his claim to look after all aspects of the life of his herd. He rears them; he is their doctor, their match-maker, their breeder and trainer. The same is true of all other herdsmen, with one exception: the herdsman of humans, the statesman. In his case alone many rivals compete for the title of care-taker, since they look after various aspects of human life—farmers produce their food, doctors cure their diseases, physical trainers guide their exercise, and so on (267c–268c; 275d–e). Something about the nature of the statesman's art, and not about its objects, accounts for that difference.

The Stranger's lecture on parts and kinds is pertinent, but not in the way we initially expect. If we want to divide humankind into two, it is indeed a mistake to differentiate Greek and barbarian (262c–d). Greek and barbarian are mere parts of humankind and not themselves subordinate kinds. But if the target kind were Greek speaker, and the kind to be divided were language user, the division into Greek and barbarian would be quite appropriate. Division is directed toward a goal, a target kind to be defined. That target (however vague or even misguided the initial conception of it) determines what wide kind to divide (art in the Sophist, knowledge in the Statesman), and what successive divisions are relevant (cf. Ackrill 1970, 384; Cavini 1995, 131). Different targets (the angler, the sophist, the statesman) prompt the investigators to carve up the world in different ways. What counts as a “natural joint” (Phaedrus 265e1–3; cf. Statesman 262a8–b1), a proper break between kinds and not mere parts, depends on the target under investigation. The definition of statecraft, when ultimately discovered, will mention humans, since the city is the object of the statesman's knowledge, and humans make up a city. But the essence of statecraft must be found in the structure of that expertise.

Earlier we observed (§ 4.2) that the problems of definition to which the Sophist calls attention, though not unique to the sophist, are in his case partially explained by his essence. The same is true of the statesman. What is it about the statesman that explains why he has so many rivals? That is the puzzle of the statesman. Reflection on the shortcomings of the first division and the Myth eventually suggests a way to get beyond the impasse. What is the special manner of the statesman's care as opposed to that of his many rivals? We have noticed that the inquirers tangle the threads of theoretical and practical knowledge. This difficulty arises, because statecraft, as we finally learn, involves both theoretical and practical knowledge (cf. Statesman 284c, 289c–d, 305c–d, 311b–c). Because of the nature of his expertise, the statesman is intimately connected with everyone engaged in the care of humans: the truest mark (horos) of the statesman, says the Stranger, is that by which the wise and good man manages the affairs of the ruled for the benefit of the ruled (296d–297b). So their business is also his business. Perhaps the statesman somehow combines theoretical and practical knowledge in managing the interactions of the members of his flock. Indeed, perhaps his essence is or includes the art of combining, like a weaver. The last part of the dialogue recognizes this connection and takes weaving as its model.

7.3 Weaving and Statecraft

The Stranger quickly presents a dichotomous division that yields the art of weaving. He defines weaving as the art in charge of clothes (279c–280a). Like the definition of the statesman reached in the first part of the dialogue, this definition, for all its detail, is too general, since many arts compete for the same title: carding, spinning, spindle-making, mending, clothes-cleaning, and others. The dichotomous division fails to isolate the mode of clothes-working peculiar to weaving.

The model of weaving serves two main functions (on this model, see El Murr 2002 and Blondell 2005). First, it introduces a new procedure, which shows how to mark off the art to be defined from others akin to it, which are located in the lowest kind reached by the previous dichotomous division. As earlier noted (§ 3.2), the new procedure is division by limbs, “like a sacrificial animal” (287c) (for a different view, see El Murr 2005). Whereas dichotomous division separates a kind into two parts, and then ignores at each step the part that does not lead to the goal; division by limbs breaks off pieces of an original whole, whose members are interrelated and share a common domain, and defines the art in relation to the others that share its domain. All the arts of clothes-working have clothes as their object. Many of the kindred arts turn out to contribute to weaving by providing its tools or preparing its materials (these contributing arts are characterized as sunaitiai, “helping causes”). The differentiation of weaving from various subsidiary arts reveals a procedure to define statecraft in relation to the subordinate arts.

Second, like the model of angling, weaving is relevant not only in indicating a useful procedure that yields a definition, but also as an example. The essence of weaving—intertwining different kinds of threads—indicates an essential feature of statecraft. The statesman weaves in a number of ways. In particular, he weaves together into one fabric the virtues of courage and moderation, which often clash in the city. The statesman and the weaver have many other features in common. They are both experts in measurement: they measure the more and the less not merely in relation to each other but also in relation to some goal they aim to achieve (284a–e) (on the arts of of measurement, see Delcomminette 2005, Lafrance 2005, and Sayre 2006). Furthermore, both are said to direct the subsidiary experts, whose products and activities they use (308d–e). The statesman directs the experts who are, as it were, the practical arms of his expertise: the orator, the general, the judge, and the teacher. The statesman must be an expert in timing to determine when the general should go to war (on the importance of timing, see Lane 1998), though he leaves it to the general to work out the details of military strategy and carry them out. He must determine the good that rhetoric will serve, though he leaves the techniques and practice of persuasion to the rhetorician. The statesman must decide whether a particular goal is best achieved through force or persuasion, or through force with some people, persuasion with others, and then delegate the tasks to the appropriate experts. The statesman must also decide what is just and lawful, though he leaves it to the judges to implement his judgment. The statesman must further determine what mix of courage and moderation will most advance the good in the city, though he leaves it to the teachers to instill in the youth the right belief about what is good (308e–310a). The visitor tells us that the statesman cares for every aspect of things in the city, weaving them together in the most correct way (305e).

8. Metaphysics and Dialectic in the Sophist and Statesman

In the first part of the Parmenides, the youthful Socrates set out a theory of forms reminiscent of forms in the Phaedo and the Republic, which the main speaker, Parmenides, then put to the test by focusing on two main questions: What forms are there? and what is the nature of the relation between physical objects and forms—the relation known as participation? At the end of the interrogation in Part I, when Socrates failed to rescue his theory, Parmenides came to its defense, saying that if someone with an eye on all the difficulties denies that there are stable forms, he will have nowhere to turn his thought and will destroy the power of dialectic entirely (Parmenides 135b–c). Scholars look to the Sophist and Statesman and other late dialogues in the hope of finding Plato's answer to the problems posed in the Parmenides. Does Plato continue to treat forms as he did in the Phaedo and Republic, despite the objections? Are the objections answerable and was Socrates simply too inexperienced to answer them adequately? Do the late dialogues record Plato's on-going perplexity? Or do they seriously modify Plato's earlier positions?

Our investigation of the Sophist and Statesman prompts several observations. First, these two dialogues are engaged from beginning to end in dialectic, and the Statesman explicitly claims that the exercise aims to make us better dialecticians. So Plato clearly thinks that dialectic remains possible. Second, both dialogues search for the essence of their target kinds. An essence is something stable, which makes its possessor be what it is. Both dialogues are fairly successful in their search for the essence of the kinds under investigation—the sophist and the statesman—which are both characterized as great and difficult kinds (Sophist 218c5–d9; Statesman 278e7–8; cf. 279a7–b2), as opposed to the angler and weaver, which are humble and easy to track down. But the Stranger identifies the essence of those humble entities too. Are the sophist, the statesman, the angler, the weaver, and their arts separate forms of the sort described in the Phaedo and Parmenides? Strange if they are, since these experts and their expertise are human inventions. These kinds are not said to exist separately from actual practitioners. Although the Stranger alludes to “immaterial things, which are finest and greatest, [which] are shown clearly by account alone and by nothing else,” and claims that “all things said now are for the sake of those” (Statesman 286a–b), the sophist and the statesman appear to be among those great things. There are other great things as well, including not only the philosopher, but also the separate immaterial forms discussed in the Timaeus (widely regarded as a late dialogue). But those separate forms seem to be absent from the Sophist and Statesman.

In addition to categorial kinds like the sophist and statesman, there are also the great kinds discussed in the Sophist—change, rest, being, sameness and difference. These kinds were recognized in the Parmenides (esp. Parmenides 130b; cf. the “common notions” at Theaetetus 184–186). But these great kinds seem very different from ordinary kinds like the sophist and statesman. The vowel forms—being, sameness, and difference—appear to structure other kinds, enabling them to be what they are and to relate to one another. Dialectic aims to discover and articulate those structures. Structural kinds are closely tied to dialectic, as Parmenides foretold, but both forms and dialectic seem to have developed apace since the Phaedo and the Republic.


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Plato | Plato: Cratylus | Plato: middle period metaphysics and epistemology | Plato: on knowledge in the Theaetetus | Plato: Parmenides | Plato: Timaeus