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Plato's Shorter Ethical Works

First published Wed Jul 6, 2005

Plato's shorter ethical works show Socrates at work on topics related to virtue, which he believes we should seek for the soul as we should seek health for the body. Works in this group shows stylistic as well as philosophic affinities and are generally considered to have been written early in Plato's career. The dialogues in this group are our main source for the philosophical style and teaching of the Platonic Socrates, who is as close as we are likely to get to the historical figure. In this article, “Socrates” always refers to the Platonic figure in the works under discussion here.

Sections 2 through 9 concern philosophical themes that are common to the works under discussion. Section 10 deals with the intellectual world that Plato uses as a backdrop for these dialogues. Sections 11 to 20 deal with the individual dialogues of the group.

1. Introduction

At the center of Plato's shorter ethical works is the Apology of Socrates, which consists of a speech purportedly given by Socrates at his trial, and is probably the closest of Plato's works to the historical Socrates. The Apology is closely linked to two other works. The first is the Euthyphro, which shows Socrates discussing reverence as he is about to report to court for his indictment, which includes by implication a charge of irreverence. The second is the Crito, which shows Socrates in prison on the day before his execution, defending his decision to accept the penalty rather than corrupt the law by bribing his way out of Athens. The Crito argument depends on a principle that is the bedrock of Socratic ethics: that it is never right to do wrong, even in return for wrong (49ab). The bedrock principle rules out the view that one should do right by one's friends and wrong by one's enemies, a view that had roots in Greek tradition.

Four of the dialogues in this group are concerned with definition of virtues or good qualities, especially virtues: Euthyphro (piety or reverence), Laches (courage), Charmides (temperance or soundness of mind), and Hippias Major (the fine or beautiful). These dialogues of definition indirectly raise questions about the mutual relations of the virtues, and this question is taken up explicitly in the Protagoras, which introduces the doctrines of the unity of virtue and the impossibility of acrasia (the doctrine that it is impossible to know what is right and still do wrong). A corollary of this is the claim that no one does wrong willingly, which supports part of Socrates' argument in the Apology. Another corollary is that in seeking virtue we should seek knowledge about virtue. Nevertheless, Socrates entertains strong doubts as to the teachability of virtue. Socrates sometimes treats virtue on the analogy of techne, however, and techne means a body of specialized knowledge that can be taught.

Aside from the Apology and Crito, which contain extended speeches, the most prominent feature of these works is Socrates' use of questions calling for short answers. Although Socrates uses this style of conversation for a number of different purposes, it has been called the Socratic method, and in one of its forms is has become known to scholars as the elenchus.

Four dialogues in the group show Socrates in contrast to sophists, who were paid teachers of subjects ranging from rhetoric to mathematics. Some sophists claimed expertise on virtue, and Socrates took it as part of his mission to investigate such claims. The Protagoras treats its eponymous sophist with some respect, but the two Hippias dialogues (major and minor) poke fun at their namesake, and the Euthydemus shows its sophists as puzzle-makers who cannot make good their claim to teach virtue.

2. Elenchus

The general rule of elenchus is this: Socrates' partner (often called his interlocutor) must answer every question according to his own beliefs. Socrates' questions start from his partner's initial statement, which usually implies a claim to wisdom or to knowledge of a subject related to virtue. Sometimes Socrates seeks clarification of the claim; at other times he proceeds directly to elicit his partner's agreement to premises that will turn out to be inconsistent with the initial claim. In some cases, the premises have no authority aside from the partner's agreement; in others, Socrates provides an argument for premises, usually in the form of an epagoge, a general inference from a set of examples. An elenchus usually concludes in the discomfiture of the partner, who now appears unable to support his initial statement. Some form of elenchus is probably responsible for Socrates' claim in the Apology that he has demonstrated that every claimant to wisdom whom he has examined has failed the test (21b-23b). In the dialogues of this group, the elenchus is a negative instrument, but in the Gorgias Socrates seems to use it in support of his bedrock principle. In some cases, an elenchus seems only to discredit a person; in others it refutes a position that is under discussion. In those cases, it points the dialogue that contains it toward aporia—an impasse. Socrates seems to use the method on views he has held (as we shall see in the Laches), and he may even use it on himself, as he implies in the Hippias Major (304c-e).

The philosophical puzzle of the elenchus is to see how it could lead to any firm result, if its premises have no authority beyond the partner's agreement. Perhaps the method can do no more than convict a partner of confusion (as Hugh Benson has contended), but Vlastos has argued persuasively that elenchus in fact supports Socrates' ethical doctrine: Socrates believes he has grounds for clinging to beliefs of his that have been well tested and not refuted.

On the elenchus, see especially Vlastos 1983, Kraut 1983, Brickhouse and Smith, 1984, Benson 1987.

3. Socratic definition

When Socrates asks a question such as “What is reverence?”, he has in mind a question that can be answered only in certain ways. To begin with, he will not be satisfied with an answer that points only to a certain kind of reverence, or only to an example of reverence. The answer must identify a feature that (1) belongs to every kind of reverence (generality requirement), and (2) to nothing that is not reverent (exclusion requirement), and (3) has explanatory power.

The first two requirements appear in many texts, but the third emerges most clearly in the Euthyphro. The Euthyphro seems to require that a definition state the essence (ousia) of the thing being defined, by contrast with a statement of that thing's non-essential attributes (pathe); such a statement could be true without qualifying as a definition. The statement “reverence is what all the gods love” states only a pathos, because it does not explain what makes something reverent. We are left to speculate about what would count as stating the essence of reverence; probably it would state what makes things reverent in the way that having three straight sides and three angles makes a plane figure a triangle, while giving delight to geometers does not. Clarification for the explanation requirement comes from the synonymy requirement, that the explanatory cause of Xness must be always X, a requirement that appears to be invoked in the Hippias Major: the cause of beauty must be such that it is never ugly, but is always beautiful (cf. Phaedo 105d).

Scholarly opinion is divided as to whether Socrates is satisfied with any of the definitions of virtues that he considers. But mastery of definitions would be sufficient for the expert knowledge of virtue that Socrates disclaims, so either he lacks that mastery or his disclaimer is (as some hold) ironic.

On Socratic definition, see Vlastos 1976, Nehamas 1975, Benson 1990.

4. Priority of definition

Socrates seems to assume in these works that knowledge of definitions has priority in two ways: (1) One must know what reverence is before one could know of any particular action that it is reverent (whether, for example, it is reverent to prosecute one's father), and so for the other virtues and other cases. (2) One must know what reverence is before one could know what properties reverence has (whether, for example, it is teachable). The first of these has been attacked as the Socratic fallacy by Peter Geach; Socrates himself thinks he knows things () for which he is unable, so far as we know, to give definitions. Luckily, no text unequivocally assigns either claim to Socrates, and the matter is under debate. A charitable view would assign to Socrates in place of (1) the view that expert knowledge on the model of techne requires the ability to give definitions, and in place of (2) the view that we cannot know what the essential features of something are until we know its essence.

Socrates nevertheless has strong opinions about virtues, opinions that guide his search for definitions—for example, that courage is noble (Laches 193d). If Socrates thinks he lacks mastery of definitions of virtues, then we must ask how he thinks he can be right enough about the virtues even to look for their definitions. This puzzle is taken up to some extent in the Meno.

5. Virtue

“Virtue” translates arete, which Socrates' contemporaries used of any sort of excellence that leads to success. A number of writers before Socrates had used the word and its associated vocabulary primarily in ethical contexts. But Socrates was probably the first to identify ethical virtue with what is analogous in the soul to health.

In Socrates' usage, virtue is the ability to do what is right and resist doing what is wrong. As we learn especially from the Crito, Socrates holds that wrong actions harm the soul. Because the soul is more important to us than the body, we should care about nothing so much as virtue, and Socrates understands his role in Athens as that of shameing Athenians into taking this most important concern seriously (29e-30a).

The principal virtues of interest to Socrates in this group of dialogues are courage (andreia), reverence or piety (eusebeia, to hosion), wisdom (sophia), temperance or sound-mindedness (sophrosune), and justice (dikaiosune).

These dialogues raise two general questions about virtues that are important to ethical theory, one concerning instrumentality and another concerning unity. They also raise a question about the analogy between virtue and expert knowledge (techne).

6. The Instrumentality of Virtue

Are virtues instrumental for other goods, or are they good in themselves? If they are instrumental, are they instrumental in respect of themselves, by causing virtue to grow in the holders of virtue and in those on whom they have influence? On the instrumentality of virtue there was an important dispute between Vlastos and Irwin.

In a famous passage in Republic 1, which has some affinities with dialogues of our group, a sophist named Thrasymachus challenges Socrates to define justice without saying (as he was apparently known for doing) that justice is the beneficial or the advantageous (336d). Instead, Thrasymachus insists on the precision that specifies who receives the benefit or advantage of justice; in Thrasymachus' view it is the rulers who reap the benefits, while those who are ruled pay a heavy price. Socrates defends the use of terms such as “beneficial” in defining justice, implying that he would accept some sort of instrumental view, but he plainly holds that justice is beneficial to everyone who is touched by it. This is the main theme of the Republic, but it also resonates with the shorter ethical dialogues, as we shall see. The ending of the Hippias Major bears on the problem of instrumentality in a valuable way.

7. The Unity of Virtue

Socrates argues in the Protagoras for the unity of virtues, a thesis that has been variously interpreted and may be supported by other dialogues in this group. Vlastos famously explained the thesis as bi-conditional: that whoever has one virtue has them all. Others (Penner, Woodruff) have argued for a stronger thesis, such that the definitions of the virtues would have something in common. Dialogues of definition, such as the Laches, seem to presuppose that each virtue has its own definition, but, at the same time, such dialogues seem to be moving towards the view that the essence of each virtue is wisdom or knowledge. The Protagoras defines courage as the knowledge of what id and is not to be feared (360d), but the Laches rejects a similar definition on the grounds that it does not differentiate courage adequately from other virtues (199e). And the Euthyphro ends in aporia (at an impasse) because Socrates is unable to differentiate reverence adequately from justice. Efforts to define sound mindedness (sophrosune) in the Charmides end in an impasse partly owing to the difficulty of specifying the subject of the knowledge that is the essence of this virtue. If (as seems the case) Socrates is never satisfied with a definition of a virtue, this may be because the virtues cannot be differentiated at all.

8. Techne Analogy

Techne is, at the most basic level, what can be learned and taught. The word is usually used for a body of professional knowledge, mastered by experts on whom laypeople may safely rely. It is often translated “art” or “craft” or “skill,” but in these pages it will be rendered “expert knowledge.” Navigation and medicine are frequent examples of expert knowledge. To establish your credentials in expert knowledge, you should be able to identify your teachers and students (Laches 185b), as well as the specific field of your expertise, which you must have mastered as a whole (e.g., Ion 532b, ff.). You should also, ideally, be able to give an account of the aim of your profession (e.g. health for medicine, Laches 190a, cf. Gorgias 465a). Expert knowledge must be rational in its ability to account for what it does.

Socrates seems to inquire after virtue as if it were, or at least resembled, the expert knowledge of living well, or the expert knowledge of care for the soul. If so, this knowledge could be taught and learned. Yet Socrates has grave doubts as to whether virtue can be taught (Protagoras 319a, ff.).

Does Socrates, or does he not, believe that virtue is to be understood on the analogy with expert knowledge? If he believes that virtue is instrumental to happiness (as some scholars hold), then he might well believe that virtue is a kind of practical knowledge, and the analogy would be helpful. If he believes (as other scholars hold) that virtue is at least partly constitutive of happiness, then the analogy seems misleading, since bodies of expert knowledge are generally valued only as instrumental for their goals. If Socrates does not subscribe to the analogy, however, why does he use it in argument? He uses it in argument in the context of the larger question whether virtue can be taught, probably on the assumption that, if it can be taught, it can be taught as expert knowledge is taught. But whether it can be taught at all, of course, is in question. The Meno will explore a process of learning without teaching; this process is known as recollection.

The word sophia bridges a gap; usually translated “wisdom,” it may be used as a rough synonym for techne, but it may also be used for less specific forms of wisdom that are not obviously taught or learned and may lack the rational features of expert knowledge.

On the unity of virtue, see especially Vlastos 1972 and 1994, Penner 1973, Woodruff 1977,

9. The Impossibility of Acrasia

Socrates' doctrine on this, apparently, is that knowledge of what is right cannot be overcome by pleasure or passion. After Aristotle, philosophers have termed this the issue of acrasia. Acrasia, weakness of will, would occur when someone who knows what is right does what is wrong under the influence of passion or in order to secure pleasure.

Holders of expert knowledge are reliable in the exercise of that knowledge; they are professionals, and part of their professionalism is to ply their trade competently regardless of the weight of passion or the blandishments of pleasure. So the techne analogy might be construed to imply the impossibility of acrasia. Socrates' argument for this in the Protagoras, however, is based on his demonstration that the popular explanation for acratic behavior (that knowledge is overcome by pleasure) is incoherent. Socrates is not denying that people do wrong under the influence of passion or desire for pleasure; he is rejecting the usual explanation for this, and denying that it occurs to those who have knowledge. Plainly, the doctrine presupposes a stringent criterion for knowledge, at least as demanding as the test for techne.

A related doctrine is that no one errs voluntarily. If acrasia is impossible, then every moral error involves a cognitive failure about the action or the principle that it violates, and cognitive errors negative (or at least weaken) responsibility for actions caused by those errors. Socrates generally assumes that actions taken in ignorance are involuntary, and that therefore the proper response to wrongdoing is not retribution, but education, as he says in the Apology (25e-26a).

In the Hippias Minor, by contrast, Socrates argues that it is better to do wrong voluntarily than in ignorance. Although he is unhappy with this conclusion, he gives no direct hints as to how to avoid it.

10. Background: Sophists and Scientists

Aristophanes depicted Socrates in the Clouds (421 BCE) as a participant in the two revolutions that constituted the new learning of the period, and these were both exciting and disturbing to ordinary Athenians.

Sophists. One of these was the explosion of interest in traveling teachers, later known as sophists, who taught, among other things, the art of words, later known as rhetoric. Although the art of words was widely used for entertainment, it also had applications in deliberative and forensic rhetoric, and the sophists were accused of teaching their pupils how to win on behalf of a bad cause—to make the worse argument into the stronger. Socrates is accused of this in the Clouds: a student emerges from his instruction with an argument that purports to justify a son's whipping his father.

Clever techniques of argument were taught by some sophists, as were serious devices for the effective staging of adversary debate, on which the city-states of those periods depended, both for decisions about policy and for verdicts in criminal cases. Some people felt that these techniques corrupted political and legal processes. Plato took pains to depict Socrates not only as different from the sophists, but as opposed to them on many points. This is a theme in several dialogues in our group: Euthydemus, Hippias Minor, Hippias Major, and Protagoras.

Natural scientists. Thinkers of the period were developing explanations for natural phenomena that displaced the gods from their traditional roles as causes. Again, Socrates is depicted in the Clouds as involved in this sort of explanation. Again, Plato takes pains to show that Socrates is not interested in this project.

11. Apology

Unique among Plato's works, this is a formal speech. The aim of forensic rhetoric by a defendant is normally acquittal, but Socrates' aim here seems to be to bring out the truth of his life, regardless of how it affects the jury. Still, the speech is artfully made, and could be used to illustrate a textbook of rhetorical technique.

The official charge is that he corrupted the young men of Athens, and that he introduced new gods; this implies the old charge from Aristophanes Clouds, that Socrates replaced the gods with naturalistic explanations, and that he corrupted the youth by teaching rhetoric, “to make the worse argument win.” Socrates denies having taught anything, and disclaims any interest in natural science or the teaching of rhetoric.

How, then, did he come under such suspicion? Because he led a life that seemed strange to his compatriots, in fulfillment of his mission. Socrates claims to have been given this mission by the god, evidently Apollo, and he identifies this mission with his gadfly role of shaming people into sharing his quest for virtue. He may have developed elenchus (which derives from a word for shame) for this purpose, but he has another purpose for elenchus as well. Once the oracle declared that no one was wiser than he, Socrates had set out to test its meaning by examining all those who claimed to be wise. Finding none who could pass the test, he concluded that the meaning of the oracle was probably this: that no one could be wiser than a person who was aware, as Socrates was, of his own failure to be wise. In keeping with this result, Socrates is cautious in his philosophical claims in the Apology. On the subject of death, he presents himself as agnostic here, although other texts show him to have been committed to the immortality of the soul.

12. Crito

In the Crito Socrates states the doctrines must important to his conception of the ethical life. He will give up his life rather than compromise his ethics. His peers would all agree that life is not worth living with a badly deformed body; they should agree that life is even less worth living with the sort of deformation that is caused by acting wrongly.

Crito, a wealthy Athenian friend of Socrates, has bribed the jailers and prepared means for Socrates to escape from Athens, but Socrates refuses on the grounds that to do so would be to damage the laws wrongfully, and this violates his bedrock principle that one must never do wrong, even in return for a wrong. He applies this principle, he says, using his old method of accepting the reasoning (logos) that seems best to him as he reasons about it (46b). The bedrock principle has guided his life so far, and it would be absurd to give it up now merely because his circumstances have changed (46b, 49ab).

When Crito appeals to popular opinion on the matter, Socrates replies that the only authority he would accept on the matter would be that of someone who is expert on the matter at hand, which is the effects of doing right and doing. Because these are analogous to the effects of health and disease on the body, Socrates is looking for an expert on moral health and corruption, apparently for the soul. In the absence of such an expert, however, he must make up his own mind. His argument at this stage is highly condensed, leading to a question Crito cannot answer: One should abide by one's agreements provided they are just; would I be abiding by my agreement if I escaped without persuading the city (49e-50a)?

Because Crito cannot answer, Socrates personifies the laws and imagines their response, on behalf of his obligation to them. (Here as elsewhere, with the exception of the Apology, Socrates avoids giving an extensive speech in his own persona.) The argument they give is elaborate, and appeals mainly to two points: an agreement they allege Socrates made to obey them by choosing to live in Athens, and the benefits they claim Socrates has received from them, which place Socrates under a stronger obligation to the laws than he has to his parents. Neither Crito nor Socrates can reply to the arguments given by the laws, and their conclusion is allowed to stand.

The conclusion of these personified laws—that one must obey the city in all things (51bc)—seems to conflict with a memorable text in the Apology, as Grote first pointed out; there Socrates promises to disobey the court if it should let him off on the condition that he give up his mission in Athens (29d). Scholarly opinions differ over how to reconcile these texts.

13. Euthyphro

A dialogue of definition, the Euthyphro takes up the subject of reverence or piety, a virtue that traditionally bears on the keeping of oaths, the treatment of the weak (such as prisoners and suppliants), family relationships, and respect toward the gods. The discussion here lifts reverence out of its traditional context, while marking sharply the difference between reasoning about ethics and accepting authority and implying support for the unity of virtue.

Socrates is on his way to answer the indictment against him; Euthyphro is apparently a well-known crank on religious matters; his name ironically means “straight-thinker.” He has just lodged a charge against his father for the accidental death of a servant accused of murder. Most Athenians would probably have been shocked by the irreverence of Euthyphro's prosecution of his father, but Euthyphro is confident he is doing the right thing. His confidence rests on the special knowledge he claims on the subject of reverence.

Socrates presupposes that such special knowledge implies knowledge of the definition of reverence. If Euthyphro knows what reverence is, he should teach that to Socrates, so that Socrates may use the knowledge in defense during his own trial. Euthyphro's first two answers fail the first two conditions of Socratic definition; the first is not general (“what I am doing now”—6d), and the second could make the same things both reverent and irreverent; being loved by a god would make it reverent, while being hated by another would make it irreverent (8ab). Socrates helps Euthyphro to a better answer (reverence is what is loved by all the gods), but this succumbs to the requirement that a definition state the essence of its subject (11ab). The essence of reverence cannot be conferred on reverent actions by the gods' approval of them; their approval, rather, must follow on their partaking of the essential nature of reverence. So actions are made reverent not by the authority of a god, but by their satisfying the definition of reverence—or so most modern readers have inferred.

Socrates then, and for the second half of the dialogue, explores the idea that reverence is a proper part of justice, without finding a way to specify what part it is. Attempts to differentiate reverence from justice by appeal to the gods lead back to the better answer that was refuted earlier. The conclusion is aporia (impasse); most scholars believe that it points to a theoretical point, a component of the doctrine of the unity of virtue. There is no differentiating reverence from justice, because there is no essential difference; reverence is simply justice described with reference to the love that the gods bear for justice.

14. Charmides

A dialogue of definition, the Charmides takes up the subject of temperance or sound-mindedness (sophrosune). This is the virtue that produces self-control, the ability to resist the temptation to act violently in satisfaction of desires, the temptation that, in Plato's scheme of things, characteristically leads tyrants to disaster. The main theme of this dialogue is the role of knowledge in virtue.

The dramatic date of the dialogue is before Plato's birth, and Socrates' main partners are Plato's maternal uncle, Charmides, then a teenager, and Charmides' older first cousin Critias. By the time Plato wrote the dialogue, both men had been killed in the battle of the Piraeus, in 403BCE. Critias had been the leader of the group known to their enemies as the Thirty Tyrants, and Charmides had been among the extended leadership established by the Thirty. The excesses of the Thirty, who had conducted a violent and rapacious reign of terror in 404-03, provide an historical counterpoint to the declared interest of these men in sound-mindedness almost thirty years earlier.

The topic arises when Charmides is praised for both external and internal good qualities, including sound-mindedness. Socrates assumes that Charmides must have some sense of what this virtue is, if he has it within him (158e). Charmides answers first that sound-mindedness is a kind of quietness and order (159b); indeed, he has a reputation for sound-mindedness because of his quiet and orderly good manners. This fails because sound-mindedness is among those things that are always fine, and quietness is fine only in certain contexts. The relevant condition on definition in this case is that of explanation; the proposed explanation does not consistently have the feature it is supposed to explain. Charmides' second attempt fails by the same criterion: a sense of shame looks like sound-mindedness in some contexts, but it appears not always to be a good thing (160e-161b). His third attempt is plagiarized, probably from Critias, who may have heard it from Socrates: Sound-mindedness is doing one's own things (a phrase identical to that used in the Republic to define justice). Charmides is unable to explain what this means. Critias takes over, in order to defend his definition, and is led to gloss it as doing good things (163e).

Socrates then introduces the issue of knowledge, which Critias agrees is necessary to the exercise of sound-mindedness. But knowledge of what? Critias suggests that it is self-knowledge that is sound-mindedness (164d). Critias has in mind the kind of self-knowledge that consists in knowing what one knows and what one does not know. From this it is a short step to defining the virtue as the knowledge of itself and the other kinds of knowledge—i.e., the knowledge that enables one to evaluate all sorts of knowledge claims (166e). Socrates raises two questions about this kind of knowledge: whether it is possible, and whether it is beneficial (relevant because the virtue was assumed to be beneficial). It would seem impossible for there to be such a kind of knowledge, since all other examples of kinds of knowledge have subject matter specific to each, and this would be an exception. To know whether a candidate has knowledge of medicine, for example, one would need to know medicine. As for the second question, it would appear that such knowledge is beneficial (173a, ff.), because it would allow us to submit all decisions to knowledge. But the appearance is deceptive, because the knowledge of knowledge does not add anything to the various kinds of knowledge (such as medicine) on which we depend.

The kind of knowledge that would be most beneficial would be knowledge of good and evil (174b, ff.), but this is not the same thing as sound-mindedness. So this line of inquiry has led to the contrary results that the virtue in question is and is not beneficial. The speakers confess aporia and pledge to continue. Critias and Charmides threaten to use force to wrest continuing education from Socrates. This is a joke, but it comes with a disturbing historical irony, because Charmides will follow Critias into a leadership position in the regime of the Thirty Tyrants. Their use of force will terrorize the people, but not achieve what Critias wants in the long run.

As with other aporetic dialogues, we are left without a clear answer. As with Laches and Euthyphro, however, the inquiry has led to a suggestion that goes beyond defining one among a number of independent virtues to investigating something of unbounded ethical importance, the knowledge of good and evil.

15. Laches

A dialogue of definition, the Laches takes up the subject of courage, broadly construed. Unique among ancient writings about courage, the Laches takes courage far beyond the battlefield, seeking a definition for courage not only in war but also in seafaring, in illness, in poverty, and in politics (191d). The principal interlocutors are men of military experience, Laches and Nicias. Nicias is known to us for his prominence in the Sicilian expedition narrated in melancholy detail by Thucydides (Books 6 and 7). He was enormously brave in battle, but a coward in politics, afraid to tell the Athenian people how dangerously situated their army was. His life in itself illustrates the importance, recognized by Socrates, of cultivating courage in all the arenas of action and suffering

The dialogue begins with a specific query about military training for the young. A teacher is in town, displaying a new technique for fighting in armor, and two elderly fathers (Lysimachus and Melesias) are trying to determine whether they should send their young sons to this teacher. Lacking accomplishments, the fathers have no confidence in their ability to choose how their sons should be educated, and they have asked two generals, Laches and Nicias, to observe the display and advise them. Nicias advises them to accept advice from Socrates as well, as Socrates has referred him to an excellent teacher of music (180d); Laches supports Socrates' reputation also, citing his actions at the battle of Delium, a disastrous defeat for Athens in which, as we know from other sources, Socrates showed extraordinary courage (181b). This example will cast a long shadow over the subsequent discussion, for Socrates' courage in this case was shown not merely in defeat, but during a rout.

Socrates makes a move that will become familiar in other dialogues. The anxious fathers have consulted generals, and Socrates thinks they are on the right track; they should consult an expert (185a), but for some time Socrates leaves it unclear what the expert should be an expert about. The anxious fathers had not obviously been anxious about ethics, but this is how Socrates takes their question, on the unexamined assumption that the purpose of any form of military training is to instill courage in the soul (185e, with 190d), so they are seeking an expert in that. An expert in instilling X must know what X is (190a).

If there is an expert on military training, then, that expert will be able to say what courage is. Laches tries first, with an answer that is inconsistent with his praise for Socrates: Courage is staying at your post and not running away (190e). (Socrates' courage was shown during a retreat, the military maneuver that most calls for courage.) Laches' proposal plainly fails by the generality requirement, and Socrates shows this with examples of courage that do not satisfy the proposed definition (191a-d).

Laches' second try is that courage is a kind of endurance of the soul (192c). But what kind of endurance, foolish or wise? Here Laches enters a tangle; he does not want to say that courage is ever foolish, because then courage would not be kalon, as all present believe that it is. Nor does he want to say that courage is sophos, since mastery of the matter at hand seems to render actions less courageous (192c-193e). Unable to see a way out of this tangle, Laches agrees with Socrates that he does not have a good answer.

Laches' tangle calls for someone to specify the kind of wisdom that courage requires, and Nicias is prepared to do just that: Courage is knowledge of what should inspire terror or confidence in war or any other circumstance (195a); Socrates will understand this to be knowledge of future goods and future evils. This, as we shall see, is very similar to the definition that Socrates will give to Protagoras in the Protagoras (360d). Even so, it will go down to defeat. Knowledge of good and evil is not carved up by temporal words such as “future,” and knowledge of good and evil plainly embraces far more than courage; indeed, it would be the whole of virtue (199e). But Nicias had been clear that courage was only a part of virtue (198a, from 190cd). So he too has failed to establish that he knows what courage is.

How should readers take this outcome? Has Socrates refuted to his own satisfaction the position he takes in the Protagoras? The matter is debated by scholars. Perhaps we can apply here a tool given us in the Euthyphro, where a statement about reverence (that it is loved by all the gods) was taken to be true, but not the definition of reverence. In a similar way, “knowledge of future goods and evils” could be true of courage without satisfying the conditions of definition. In this case, that would be because (it seems) courage cannot be differentiated by definition from virtue as a whole, just as reverence apparently could not be differentiated from justice. Like the Euthyphro, then, the Laches could be read as supporting the unity of virtue. But this reading is not obvious; taken by itself, the dialogue seems to end on ground that is hostile to the unity of virtue.

16. Hippias Major

A dialogue of definition, the Hippias Major takes up the subject of the fine or beautiful (to kalon), one of the two most general terms of commendation in ancient Greek, the other being agathon, good, nearly a synonym. Being kalon is the primary feature of each of the virtues, and, by implication, the dialogue points to an important Socratic idea about ethics: That in being kalon a virtue is beneficial. The authenticity of the dialogue has been questioned (see Section 17).

Hippias is a sophist from Elis, in the northwest corner of the Peloponnesus; he takes pride in being a polymath, an expert on many subjects including rhetoric, history, and mathematics. The question arises because Hippias boasts about the high quality of a speech he will soon make, and he invites Socrates to attend, along with others capable of judging a speech. Socrates by implication invokes the priority of definition: How can anyone judge what is fine or foul in a speech, without knowing what it is to be fine (286c)? Here Socrates uses a strikingly unique feature of the dialogue, the Questioner—someone who, Socrates says, will not allow him to get away with claims that imply knowledge, but persists in asking him shame-inducing questions such as this one. Since the Questioner meets Socrates in the privacy of his home, we must imagine that he is Socrates' alter ego, and that the process referred to is the self-elenchus by which Socrates is driven to his famous disclaimer of knowledge.

The dialogue reviews seven definitions, three proposed by Hippias, and four more sophisticated ones proposed by Socrates. All are refuted, and the work ends at an impasse, as is usual for works in this group. It does, nevertheless, point to the idea that a good (such as virtue, probably) can be beneficial by replicating itself.

Hippias makes three category mistakes, one in each of his answers to the question, “What is the Fine?” (287e-293c) He identifies three kinds of entity that can be fine—a particular (a fine girl), a mass substance (gold), and a universal (living the traditional good life). Socrates' double strategy is the same in each case: (1) To show that the answer fails the generality requirement; it does not explain all the cases of being fine. (2) To show that the fine entity to which Hippias refers is not fine in every context. This violates the exclusion requirement, for it does not exclude non-fine things. It also implies that the answer fails to satisfy the explanation requirement; generally, to explain Xness, something must be X no matter what (synonymy requirement). If fire explains heat, that is because it is always hot; but gold cannot explain fineness, because gold is not always fine; it is foul in cookware. All of these answers fail because they identify things that are fine in some contexts, leaving unanswered the question what makes them fine in those contexts but not in others.

It is unusual for Socrates to consider three answers that are bad in the same way in a dialogue of definition, and indeed these are not wrong in exactly the same way. Hippias has attempted greater degrees of generality in his second and third answers (gold and living the good life). The sequence illustrates the point that Socrates is going beyond the later distinction between particulars and universals in seeking definitions; he seeks an answer that points to something with real explanatory power.

The remaining four answers are better candidates and come (as in the Euthyphro) from Socrates, though in this case he attributes them to his alter ego. They are that the fine is the appropriate, the able, the beneficial, and pleasure through sight and hearing. These represent a single strategy, which tries to tease out the deeper meaning in the intuition that good things, such as whatever is fine, are beneficial. The appropriate and the able are attractive answers, but only when they are taken to imply that the fine is beneficial. This answer, however, leads to an odd result: if to be fine is to be productive of the good, then it would appear that the fine cannot be good, which is unacceptable. The conclusion invites us to ask whether a good can be beneficial in being able to replicate itself. (See the section on instrumentality.) The last answer attempts an aesthetic construction of the fine, and founders on the problem of disjunctive definition. “What's fine is hard,” Socrates concludes, resigned to be unable to judge what is fine or foul in a speech until he learns what the fine is.

17. The Authenticity of the Hippias Major

The authenticity of the dialogue has been in doubt since the middle of the nineteenth century; although most scholars accept it as genuine, there are notable exceptions such as Charles Kahn and Holger Thesleff. The argument against authenticity is based partly on the silence of classical sources about it, and partly on the style. Aristotle's reference to a dialogue called simply the Hippias is plainly to the Hippias Minor (Metaphysics 1025a6-13). The style is most likely from the fourth century BCE (Plato's century), but some have argued that its vocabulary places the dialogue late in the fourth century, too late for Platonic authorship. The argument in favor of authenticity follows the presumption in favor of the ancient canon of Thrasyllus (which is right in most cases) and appeals to the unique and inventive features of the dialogue, which betray more artistry than could be expected from a forger. As with a number of dialogues from the canon, however, the case must be left not proven.

18. Hippias Minor

The Hippias Minor shows Socrates defeating a sophist on an ethical matter: whether it is better to do wrong voluntarily or in ignorance. Socrates concludes, somewhat unhappily, that it is better to do wrong voluntarily. The issue arises in the context of Hippias' multiple claims to expertise; he can win speaking contests on any topic, and he has excelled in many different arts, from shoemaking to the art of memory (363cd, 368be). Socrates asks a question that at first appears to be about Homer—which is the better man, Achilles or Odysseus? The tradition has been to regard Achilles as honest, and Odysseus as given to lying, but it is this tradition that Socrates intends to bring into question. He argues, by example, that an expert in any given field is best able to speak false in that field, since an amateur liar might stumble on the truth. It follows that a good liar will be an expert in the subject of his lies, and he will also be a good truth teller in that field, and vice versa. So if Achilles is a good truth teller, he will be a good liar as well, and if Odysseus is a good liar, he will be a good truth teller also.

Hippias rejects this conclusion. He argues that Homer shows Achilles to be honest and Odysseus to be a liar through the speech at Iliad 9.308, ff., which Achilles addresses to Odysseus: “I hate like the gates of hell that man who says one thing and has another in his mind.” Hippias is doubly mistaken in using this passage as evidence for his view. At most this would show that Achilles (not Homer) takes Odysseus to be a liar, but in fact the text clearly refers to Agamemnon. Achilles takes Odysseus' word for what Agamemnon has promised him, but he does not believe that this is a truthful promise.

Homer cannot be interrogated on the matter, so Socrates will investigate only the opinion of Hippias (365cd), although he will cite Homeric texts in support of his position. Socrates argues that Achilles is more deceptive than Odysseus, because on several occasions he does not stay true to what he has said. Hippias rightly points out that Achilles had no intention to deceive; he merely said what was in his heart at each moment. Because his falsehood is involuntary, argues Hippias, Achilles is the better man. Socrates disagrees: the voluntary liar knows his subject better and has the better mind. He is therefore the better man of the two.

This leads Socrates to his main theme: whether one who does wrong voluntarily is better or worse than someone who does wrong involuntarily (373c). Again arguing by example, Socrates shows that any failure, ethical or otherwise, would be better if it came as the result of a deliberate choice, because that would imply that the person who erred had the power to do the thing right if he or she wanted to. He concludes: “Then he who voluntarily goes wrong (hekon hamartanon), doing shameful and unjust things, if indeed he exists, would be no other than the good man” (376b). Hippias cannot accept this line of reasoning, and Socrates admits he is uncomfortable with it (“No more can I concede the point to myself”).

The argument for this conclusion assumed from the outset that it is possible to go wrong voluntarily; this was Hippias' proposal in the case of Odysseus. But Socrates has stated the contrary, and in the same terms. The argument also assumes that people do good and bad actions on the basis of techne; it is reasonable to suppose that the techne that could lead to good actions could also lead to bad ones. But techne can be taught, so that if good and bad action are due to a techne, then people could be given by teaching the power to act well or poorly. But Socrates does not believe that virtue can be taught (Protagoras 319a-320c). In sum, the awkward conclusion would follow from premises that Hippias supports, but not from the views Socrates elsewhere affirms.

19. Euthydemus

The Euthydemus is more complex in structure than the other dialogues in this group. A substantial framing dialogue between Socrates and Crito surrounds and intrudes upon a reported discussion involving Socrates and two brothers, Euthydemus and Dionysodorus, traveling teachers who have much in common with the sophists, and who claim to teach virtue, rather than the forensic rhetoric expected of such experts (274d). The discussion takes place at the Lyceum, for the benefit of the boy Clinias and his admirer Ctesippus. The main question in both the frame and the embedded dialogue concerns education: To what sort of teaching should the young be entrusted?

Socrates challenges the brothers to show that, in addition to teaching virtue, they can convince a pupil that he should learn virtue from them. Instead of rising to this challenge directly, the brothers entangle Clinias in two verbal traps and are preparing a third when Socrates interrupts with the diagnosis (obviously correct) that these traps depend on ignoring the careful use of verbal distinctions (277d-278a).

Socrates then demonstrates his method of attracting a young person to the pursuit of virtue and wisdom, which, by the end of the passage, have been conflated into wisdom. With Clinias, he lists various good things: Wealth, health, good looks, and honor comprise one list, while courage, sound-mindedness, justice, and wisdom comprise another. Then Socrates surprises the boy by claiming that good fortune simply is wisdom; he defends the claim by arguing that no good thing is beneficial unless its use is guided by wisdom. It follows that the items on the first list are neither good nor bad in themselves (281d), and that the principal good to pursue is wisdom. We are probably left to suppose that the virtues on the second list are identical to wisdom. In any event, Clinias now expresses his wish to acquire wisdom.

The brothers intervene with new and more disturbing arguments: it is not possible to speak false or to hold a false view or to contradict, they say, possible echoing theses of the sophist Protagoras (link).

The second conversation between Socrates and Clinias treats wisdom as a techne (link) and explores the subordination of one techne to another, as the art of the general (winning battles) is subordinate to the art of politics (making use of victories). The supreme techne he calls kingly, and this is the techne that guides the use of all others (291c), but this line of inquiry founders on a question that appears unanswerable: What is the specific knowledge that is given by the kingly techne? A techne is supposed to have a well defined subject matter, but the techne that is wisdom would oversee all subject matter and therefore would seem to have no subject matter proper to itself. Perhaps Socrates thinks the subject is good and evil, or perhaps virtues, but he does not say this, nor does he explain how these could be the subjects of a techne. Because a techne is, by definition, teachable, Socrates would have to establish that such knowledge can be taught, but as we see from the Protagoras Socrates has grave doubts on this score.

A few more traps are set by the brothers, who exploit the similarity between complete (or absolute) and incomplete (or relative) predication: the dog is a dog in any semantic context, but he is a father in relation to his puppies only, and not to his master.

Socrates returns to his framing discussion with Crito on the overarching theme of the dialogue, the question what sort of study should be pursued as philosophy, and this is left as a challenge for Crito. The dialogue ends, as do most in this group, inconclusively.

20. Protagoras

The Protagoras is the most substantial dialogue in this group. It's general theme is the question whether virtue can be taught, and this leads to the question whether virtue is wisdom or knowledge. Other topics treated in the dialogue are the unity of virtue, the instrumentality of virtue for pleasure, and the denial of acrasia.

The two main speakers divide on these questions in an unexpected way: Socrates, who believes that virtue cannot be taught, and that he does not teach it, defends the unity with wisdom of virtues such as courage; Protagoras, who believes that virtue can be taught, and that he teaches it, denies that courage is any sort of knowledge. Moreover, Socrates, who elsewhere rejects hedonism, seems to identify virtue with a hedonic calculus in this dialogue, in the argument that leads to his famous claim of the impossibility of acrasia (weakness of will).

The setting of the Protagoras is striking: the cast of characters is the same as that in the Symposium, but here they are gathered for exhibitions of the skill of the sophists, especially of Protagoras. Socrates, speaking on behalf of a prospective student, prompts Protagoras to say what it is that he teaches. It is, says Protagoras, good judgment, so that one may act and speak most effectively both in private and in public matters (318e).

In a substantial comment (319a-320c), Socrates understands this to mean that Protagoras teaches the techne of good citizenship, which he takes to be the virtue of citizens, and to include political wisdom. Socrates argues that such virtue cannot be taught; if it could, Pericles would have imparted it to his sons, but he failed to do so. This argument might convince Socrates' audience, but it cannot have convinced Socrates, who was no great admirer of Pericles.

Protagoras responds with an enormous speech, often called the “great speech,” (320c-328d), which is divided into a myth and an account. Many scholars accept the content of the speech as Protagorean, although the setting surely belongs to historical fiction. In sum, Protagoras thinks that the political virtues of justice and reverence or sound-mindedness are necessary to human communities, and that all normal human beings therefore have the capacity to acquire those virtues to some extent (although not all to the same extent), just as all human beings have the capacity to learn a language. As in the case of language, the community teaches the political virtues to its citizens from early childhood on, and Protagoras discusses in some detail the traditional stages in education which he believes lead to this result. He also provides a theory of punishment as educational.

Socrates does not take on Protagoras' claims in the great speech directly. Instead, he takes another tack and engages Protagoras in three rounds. In the first round, he asks about the unity of virtues, arguing for the unity of justice and piety, of wisdom and self-control, and of self-control and justice (328d-334c). The series of arguments is inconclusive; Protagoras' consent to them is grudging, and scholarly opinion is divided as to their soundness. The series breaks down over the issue of sound-mindedness and injustice. It would appear that one could apply a sound mind to unjust actions (say, by not letting sensual pleasures distract one from a life of theft). But Socrates seems about to say that both justice and sound-mindedness aim at what is beneficial to human beings, and this provokes Protagoras to affirm the incompleteness of the word “advantageous”: different things are advantageous to different species, and in different applications.

There follows a discussion on how to discuss such issues, and Protagoras starts a new line of conversation, this one dealing with the interpretation of a poem by Simonides that seems to deal with the acquisition and retention of virtue (338e-48a). Protagoras finds what looks like an inconsistency in the poem, but Socrates introduces distinctions (foreign to the text) that allow him to read the poem as supporting the Socratic views that (1) it is difficult to acquire perfect virtue and (2) no one does wrong voluntarily. Socrates does not believe, however, that it is wise to discourse upon poets who are not present to explain themselves. It is far better for them to present their own opinions (347c-348a).

Socrates brings the discussion back to the unity of virtue, here arguing for the unity of courage and wisdom (348b-351b). Socrates argues that knowledge leads to confidence, but Protagoras insists that this is irrelevant, because not all confident people are courageous.

Socrates then approaches the wisdom-virtue question from another angle, that of acrasia (weakness of will) (351b-358d), seeking to show that there is a kind of wisdom that is sufficient for virtue. This turns out to be a hedonic calculus that gives full value to temporally distant pleasures and pains. Socrates' argument is targeted on those who think that wisdom can be overpowered by pleasure, as is the case with someone whose knowledge of the ill-effects of certain foods eats them anyway because of the pleasure they afford. If the scale of pleasures is the only scale of good, however, and if the agents in this case have the wisdom to calculate correctly the pleasure the agents may reasonably expect from each choice, then they cannot be led by pleasure to choose the worse, or less pleasurable course. The popular explanation for eating what we know is bad for us turns out, on this showing, to be incoherent. Some philosophers have thought Socrates simply overlooked the psychological facts of such cases, but Aristotle makes distinctions that allow him to retain the Socratic view that ethical failure implies cognitive failure without sacrificing common ideas about human motivation (Nicomachean Ethics 7). The matter was and still is controversial among philosophers.

Does the passage imply that Socrates is a hedonist? Protagoras does not accept the narrow hedonism of Socrates' premise, so it appears that the hedonism is Socrates' own. It is not anyone else's. And yet we know that Socrates is elsewhere opposed to hedonism; his solution to the ethical problem of the Crito is based not on pleasure but on what, after serious consideration, he believes justice to require. There is no consensus on how to solve the puzzle. Could Socrates defend his doctrine here without the hedonist premise?

The dialogue ends with a renewal of the discussion on wisdom and courage (358d-360e). Socrates presses upon a reluctant Protagoras his idea that courage is the knowledge of that which is and is not to be feared (360d), a doctrine that, in effect, he refutes as a definition for courage in the Laches. The dialogue ends inconclusively with agreement that the matters at issue require more discussion.


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definitions | episteme and techne [= scientific knowledge and expertise] | Plato | Socrates | Sophists, The | wisdom