Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Nov 23, 2005; substantive revision Fri Jun 16, 2006

Pleasure, in the inclusive usages most important in moral psychology, ethical theory, and the studies of mind, includes all joy and gladness — all our feeling good, or happy. It is often contrasted with similarly inclusive pain, or suffering, which is similarly thought of as including all our feeling bad. Contemporary psychology similarly distinguishes between positive affect and negative affect.[1]

Everyday thinking of pleasure as good and as attractive may be consistent with pleasure's including very diverse experiences, perhaps having in common only that they are one or both of these. However, we often say that some things give us more pleasure than others, even where the experiences are otherwise diverse and the relevant difference does not seem one only of strength of desire. Philosophers have accordingly often taken pleasure to be a general kind or feature of experience that enters into explanations of why its instances are good or at least attractive and to what extent. Pleasure has, in this way, often been thought of as a simple uniform feature of momentary conscious experience that is obviously good in itself and consequently attractive to whoever experiences it. This simple picture of pleasure and of its effects in the mind, which seems to make self-explanatory how pleasure can be an ultimate object of correct valuing and wanting, has often been associated with more sweeping normative and psychological claims, all ambiguously called “hedonism”. These result from extending the explanatory use of the simple picture of pleasure (and also a similar use of a corresponding picture of pain) to (between them) explain all of human value or motivation. According to various hedonist normative claims, all human value, moral norms, or normative reasons for action derive all their goodness and justification ultimately from pleasure and pain — from which, similarly, on various hedonist motivational claims, all ends people seek, in some way or other, derive all their motivating power. Pleasure and pain would, if all such views were true, be the only ultimately good- and bad-making features of human (and relevantly similar animal) life and also the only ultimate ends of all our voluntary pursuit and avoidance. The simple picture and related simple hedonistic explanations of all motivation and value were widely accepted by psychology, economics, and philosophy in the nineteenth century but also widely rejected by them in the twentieth.

Contemporary affective science partly restores pleasure's importance, but also suggests that pleasure's nature and relations to awareness and motivation are not simple and that pleasure itself may divide into several different, but often causally related, biological kinds. Contemporary philosophers argue over what in the simple view should be retained and what rejected, often with an eye to more intentional, representational, and holistic views of mind than the empiricist, bottom-up views with which the simple picture was historically associated. How we should now think of pleasure and how large a role it has to play in the cognitive, behavioral, and affective sciences and in ethics are open questions. Whether pleasure, as we come to understand it scientifically, will aid in integrating our views of mind and value, as it did on the simple picture and also on views such as Aristotle's, also remains to be seen.

Guide to the Contents: §1 begins by emphasizing the diversity of views about pleasure's nature and proceeds to raise difficulties for some of these, leading toward the simple picture (of two paragraphs above) and its more tenable experiential core (§1.1). (Those hurried or hungry for other views may skip the following detailed discussion and go from there directly to Helm's contrasting holistic view in the last paragraphs of §1.2 and from there directly to §2. The notes also may be omitted; see the advice that precedes these.) §1.3 suggests that the objections may be mitigated sufficiently to save the simple picture's experiential core as a live theoretical possibility. Recent science that may explain the difficulty of introspecting affective states is tentatively appealed to. §2.3.2 discusses the contemporary attitudinal approach in the form developed by Fred Feldman. Its difficulties are discussed at length and both neoAristotelian and more simple-picture-like alternatives (§2.3.3) suggested. More complex medieval accounts of pleasure's intentional relations are also noted (§2.3.1). §3, especially, attempts to integrate philosophical and scientific, historical and contemporary contributions. Sometimes there, as also at the end of §1.3, we are near the cutting edge of science, where results are incomplete and their interpretation provisional.

1. Is Pleasure an Isolable Experience?

Human life, grown reflective, asks what it is for — what in it is ultimately good or worthwhile. “Pleasure” is among the oldest, simplest, and most enduring of answers. It endures also as part of many plausible, more complex answers, even if value hedonism, on which it is the whole answer, is rejected. But these answers provoke the further question, “What is pleasure?” Pleasure seems something obvious and even intimate to us when we see it in someone's smile, posture, or manner and when we can say right off that we are having a good time and enjoying ourselves. Yet it may seem puzzling when we try to place it in the preconceived categories of some metaphysics of mind, as philosophers have often done, following their own and their times' views of the mind and its science. One major Western tradition maintains that pleasure requires an act of the will (Augustine, CD, XIV,6), but another that at its best it supervenes on the pure activity of the intellect alone (Aristotle, NE X,vii). Modern philosophers in the grip of the simple picture (see ¶2 above) tended toward the limit of supposing pleasure a simple and undescribable feeling in momentary consciousness and nothing more. Yet Brentano claimed that inward perception reveals pleasure to have a complex relational structure (§2.3.1, ¶2 and n. 25.); Ryle, writing when behaviorism ruled in psychology, maintained that pleasure is never any episode of conscious experience at all (1949, IV,6); and Fred Feldman nowadays (2004) maintains that it is a pure propositional attitude of which feeling is no essential part. Other opponents of the simple picture have maintained that pleasure requires a much larger psychological context than this picture allows, some claiming that pleasure involves coherent patterns of motivation or concern (§1.2, ¶¶4ff.). Elizabeth Anscombe accordingly objected to hedonistic utilitarianism on the ground that pleasure is incapable of providing a bottom-up, cognitively-unmediated account of good, based in the bare momentary felt experience of pleasure, as empiricist proponents of that view had presupposed. She thus helped refocus philosophers' attention on the key foundational question that uncritical acceptance of the simple picture had led many modern philosophers to neglect, What is pleasure? Nevertheless we seem to share a common subject, even without agreeing on what, if any, kind of thing pleasure is.

1.1 Pleasure as a Simple but Powerful Feeling

Pleasure may stably or frequently background the experience of someone cheerful by temperament, in a good mood, or enjoying an activity; be salient during an acute emotional episode of joy, as in response to good news or a happy thought; or wax and wane with a passing sensory experience, as of a fragrance that wafts by too quickly for one's pleasure to be fully noted before it is gone. While “happiness” has sometimes been reserved for prolonged, stable, or completed well-being or success in life, pleasure is thought of as present in any moment in which we ‘feel happy’ — and just to the extent that we feel happy then.

Thinking about pleasure responds to the divergent pulls of different kinds of salient example. Attending to ‘sensory pleasure’, as when tasting something sweet, leads to thinking of pleasure as a form of sensation or perception — if not of something's sweetness or warmth, then of its tasting or feeling good (cf. Aristotle, DA III,7:431a10-12). Seeing emotions as involving pleasure or distress may make pleasure seem a genus or constituent of these (Aristotle: Rhetoric II,1-11; NE II,5:1105b21-23; EE II,2:1220b12-14; Cooper 1996a; Gosling 1969, pp. 153-56). And, when reflecting on one's total engagement in enjoyed activities, pleasure seems nothing distinct from those (Aristotle, NE, VII,11-14 and X,1-5; Ryle 1954b). But attending in these ways to salient perceptual experiences, reactions, passions, and activities leads us to neglect the background or baseline affect or mood from which these more conspicuous affective phenomena arise and also the much more frequent but less conspicuous smaller deviations from this. Both seem to belong to the same larger psychological kinds as the more conspicuous affective phenomena and to cumulatively matter much more to the quality of life (Watson 2000; Diener, Sandvik, and Pavot  1991; cf. Coan and Allen 2003, Rachels 2004).

Pleasure, although it sometimes seems to share a thought's content, is not easily assimilated to mere thought and resists any analysis in terms of belief or judgment, despite the claims of ancient Stoics (Long and Sedley 1987, §65, B, C and D) and their followers (opposed by Hamlyn 1978; Sorabji 2000; Helm 2000, ch. 2). Where evaluative belief or judgment are present, one's taking pleasure in something may go against these, much as the way things look in visual illusions may do. Aristotle exploits this analogy in regarding pleasure as similarly presenting a fallible appearance of goodness differing from rational belief (Cooper 1996b/1999, pp. 101-2/269-70) and, we may wish to add, from conceptual representation of anything as good, at least in some cases. Psychologists who write of appraisal or evaluation being always involved often concede that this is sometimes cognitive only in that some fast, automatic neural information processing is involved.[2] Pleasure is also thought to be present in very young infants and animals, even by many who deny them rational belief, judgment, and fully conceptual thought. In many relaxed moods of adults, as sometimes when listening to music (cf. Madell 1996, 2002), pleasure seems to be independent of these, too.

Some of the same cases further suggest that pleasure sometimes lacks even the intentional aboutness, or direction upon an object or content, that our ordinary concepts not only of thought, belief, and judgment but also of desire or wanting count as essential to these — and that some philosophers hold to belong to all conscious or even to all mental states (see Siewert 2003, Jacob 2003, and §2.34 below) and some specifically to pleasure (§§2.3.1 and 2.3.2). At the very least, in many pleasant moods and meditative states, no object is salient and reportable, as an object of conscious belief, thought, judgment, or desire characteristically is. Even when one takes pleasure in something, one's pleasure is often less bound to its object than belief is in that it may easily shift to others or even spread promiscuously, as not only particular beliefs but also belief in general cannot. Someone may be easy to please with almost anything and may seem pleased about everything in general but about nothing in particular, whereas someone‘s similarly undiscriminating credulity about everything and its negation would strain not only our belief but also the very logic of belief itself. (If all feeling good, having a good time, or being in a good mood in some way of their own discovered by cognitive science turn out to have representational content, perhaps often nonconceptually or inaccessibly to their subjects, that would still leave the differences noted between pleasure and states such as belief.)

Neither does pleasure easily fit the standard paradigms of sensation, whether of qualities of outward things or of those of either localized or diffuse bodily sensation, since it seems any typically pleasant sensory state or quality may be enjoyed less or even not at all on occasions, while its sensory quality and intensity remain much the same (Ryle 1949, p. 109; 1954a, p. 58; 1954b, p. 136). The pleasantness of tastes is modulated by nutritional state and experience (Young 1959, Cabanac 1971, Bolles 1991). And differences in mood, temperament, personal history, and how one feels toward a particular person in a specific social context may make all the difference between feeling great pleasure or great distress from what seems the same sensation of touch (cf. Helm 2000 pp. 93-94; 2002, pp. 23-24). Both science and reflection on everyday experience thus distinguish mere sensation proper from hedonic reaction (cf. Aydede 2000). Allowing that there may be ‘sensations of pleasure’, its occasionally accompanying somatic symptoms, seems consistent with this distinction between sensation, narrowly conceived, and affective response that ordinary reflection respects, recent psychology mainly accepts, and neuroscience in large part confirms. Locke's picture of pleasure and pain as “simple ideas” learned and understood “only by experience” of “what we feel in ourselves”, distinguishable from any “sensation barely in itself” they may accompany, seems consistent with the distinction between affective feeling and sensation proper made more explicitly in the following centuries.[3]

Locke and many of his followers may be interpreted as sharing the simple picture (of this entry's second introductory paragraph, on which pleasure is a simple kind of momentary experience, the ultimate goodness and motivating power of which are self-evident or observationally obvious) in an unqualified form, in the context of early modern empiricist philosophy and associationist psychology. The view that pleasure is an isolable event in consciousness had counterparts among those ancient hedonist materialist philosophers who thought of pleasure as some smooth or gentle stimulation, motion, or physiological change (see Gosling and Taylor 1982, pp. 41, 394) and also among some nowadays who regard it as a kind of very short-term neural activity in discrete areas or systems of the brain. A very similar picture, thus, is separable from dualist conceptions of conscious experience and the associated view that pleasure has a nature wholly transparent to conscious inspection. What is most central to the simple picture is that pleasure is a kind of ‘momentary’ experience that, in principle, requires nothing much more extended in order to exist. We shall call this the simple picture's experiential core.

Like real pictures, this simple picture is vague by nature and, like many other simple cognitive models, it not only engenders illusions of complete understanding and obviousness but also has multiple unobvious obscurities that may be resolved in incompatible ways. Does the good-making feature belong to the experience itself or, rather, to an experiencer's relation or response to it? Or should the very distinction be rejected, as on a ‘Humean’ view that denies any basic distinction between experience and subject of experience and may seek to construct the subject from experience not, in itself, owned? And, similarly, does the basic connection with motivation involve pursuing one's own future pleasure or does one's present pleasure in thoughts and prospects constitute one as desiring, for their own sake, other things as well (as in Schlick 1930/1939, Ch. II)? Gosling (1969) argued that the enduring attractiveness of the simple picture and also of hedonist theses depends, in large part, on switching between conflicting resolutions of the picture that are appealing in different contexts. The simple picture, however, may be accepted without accepting any universal hedonist thesis, such as are indicated in this entry's second introductory paragraph. And its experiential core is separable from strong empiricist views about learning the concept of pleasure (§1.3) and the justification of knowledge or belief concerning it — and also from simple views of introspection and consciousness that do not distinguish between phenomenal experience and cognitive awareness or accessibility (§2.3.4).

Hedonist views that explain human value, motivation, and concepts of good and evil in terms of such supposedly simple affective feelings of pleasure and pain (e.g., Locke 1700/1979, Essay II,xx and xxi) were widespread, especially among writers in English, in the following two centuries. Pleasure was widely taken for granted as foundational in this way in theories of the nascent behavioral and social sciences, until more demanding standards, first for stricter introspection and later for more objective (in this use: not based in experimental subjects' judgments on the topic) methods, were adopted. Late nineteenth and early twentieth century introspectionist psychology had aimed to discover the supposed basic introspectible elements of conscious experience and validate them using reports of specially trained subjects. But such reports had proved too plastic and easily biased by different laboratories' training to settle contested questions, such as whether pleasure and pain are specific sensations, elements of mind of a kind distinct from sensations, or ‘hedonic tones’ incapable of independent existence but qualifying other introspected elements of mind (Beebe-Center 1932; Alston 1967, pp. 333-34).

In time the project of distinguishing invariant kinds of basic element given as such in conscious experience was rejected as untrue to the contextual plasticity shown by experiential reports. Not long afterward introspection as a formal method of academic psychological inquiry was abandoned, too. Having rejected the claims of introspection to be the one true method for experimental psychology, and lacking the methodological pluralism that now allows us to seek a consilience of convergent information from a wide variety of methods and sources (as when we now use together brain imaging and self-report), psychology and related areas of economics and philosophy took a sharp behaviorist turn (Beebe-Center 1951, pp. 255-59).

1.2 Rejections of the Simple Picture

The last of the great nineteenth century utilitarian moral philosophers, Henry Sidgwick, failed to find any constant felt feature in his experience of pleasure. He therefore proposed that “pleasure” picks out momentary experiences not by any specific introspected quality but rather by their intrinsic desirability, as may be apprehended at the time of experiencing (Sidgwick 1907, pp. 125-31). Mid-twentieth-century British and American philosophers departed farther from Locke's empiricist tradition, influenced by behaviorism in psychology, Wittgenstein's contextual approach to the understanding of mental terms, and also by their reading of Aristotle (§2.2.2 below), who seemed to offer an alternative to the kind of mind/body dualism inherited from early modern European views of mind.

Gilbert Ryle argued that “pleasure” designates no occurrent experiences at all, but (in a central use) heedfully performed activities fulfilling unopposed dispositional inclinations and (in others) equally dispositional disturbances of, or else liabilities to, such dispositions.[4] The preferred first of these was a near transposition of Aristotle's account of pleasure (in NE VII) as the unimpeded conduct of activities into the language of dispositions to behavior or action (since heed, or attention, was also taken dispositionally). Ryle's logical dispositionalism was soon rejected (Nowell-Smith 1954, Penelhum 1957, Armstrong 1968, Lyons 1980). His constructive suggestion that pleasure be understood as a form of heed, attention, or interest survived longer and points forward toward the neuroscience to be discussed in §3.2 below. This view of pleasure has roots in Aristotle's observation that pleasure strengthens specific activities in competition with others and his arguing from this that pleasure varies in kind with the different activities on which it depends (NE X,5:1175b1-24). A century and a half before Ryle, James Mill, Bentham's disciple, in the utilitarian movement's major work of psychology (1829/1869, p. 364), wrote similarly: “Having a pleasurable or painful sensation, and attending to it, seem not to be two things, but one and the same thing.... [T]he feeling and attention are the same thing.” However, their intentions could not have been more opposite. James Mill was trying to construct attention and motivation out of the experience of pleasure and its interactions with others (on a liberalized associationist model) while Ryle discarded such explanations for ones in terms of behavioral dispositions. Ryle's complete rejection of the simple picture persisted, even among those who rejected his behavioral disposition view of pleasure, as also did his emphasis on enjoyment of activities and the like, to the point of ignoring or denying pleasant occurrent moods (e.g., Taylor 1963).

Justin Gosling, insightfully appraising the Ryle-inspired ordinary language philosophy literature toward the end of its run, argued that it had largely missed the ethical and psychological importance of pleasure by neglecting the really conceptually central cases of positive emotion and mood. He concluded that our being pleased in these ways shows pleasure to be, in a relaxed way of speaking, a feeling, after all, and that the concept is extended from these cases to include enjoyments that may please one at the time or else cause or dispose one to be pleased later. Wanting things for their own sake, which hedonists often seek to explain in terms of their being pleasant, is actually connected to the central cases through its often being caused by being pleased at some prospect. While Gosling used such distinctions to block arguments for hedonist theses, he also defended the importance of pleasure in both psychology and ethics (1969, chapters 9 and 10). Pleasure and theories involving it came to be increasingly disregarded by philosophers nevertheless, despite defenses of aspects of historical hedonism by Richard Brandt (1979, 1982, 1993) and Irwin Goldstein (1980, 1985, 1989) and neuroscientific discoveries widely taken to suggest that pleasure might be a motivatonally powerful isolable experience, much as the simple picture had supposed. (Scientists: Olds and Milner 1954; Olds 1958, 1965, 1977; Wise 1982. Philosophers: Puccetti 1969, opposed by Fuchs 1976; Katz 1982 on Wise 1982. For later scientific developments and philosophical interpretation, see §§3.2ff. below.) While this neglect was in part owing to the legend that Ryle and behaviorist psychology had shown pleasure lacking in psychological importance, more focused concerns over pleasure's explanatory role were also influential, both directly and through their undermining of hedonism in ethics.

Elizabeth Anscombe, like Ryle and his followers, rejected any account on which pleasure is a context-independent ‘internal impression’, whether affective or sensory. But while Ryle substituted a neoAristotelian account of enjoyments to fit his ‘anti-Cartesian’ philosophy of mind, her main reason was that any such feeling or sensation would be quite beside what she took to be the concept's explanatory and reason-ascribing point. She influentially judged the concept so obscure and problematical that theories placing weight upon it, such as hedonistic utilitarianism, should be rejected out of hand. John Rawls, quoting her even more influentially, also did just that, abandoning utilitarianism for a more constructivist and less realist approach to ethics.[5] Late twentieth century British and American philosophers' accounts of a person's good and reasons for action emphasized life plans, projects, interpersonal justifiability, deliberation, and agents' perspectives. Contemporary philosophy of mind also found little room for the simple experience picture of pleasure. Those writing in the wake of behaviorism and of Wittgenstein often privileged outside-in functionalisms that identified all psychological states with or through causal roles wholly defined, however indirectly by way of other psychological states, ultimately in terms of environmental stimulation and behavior. These tendencies eclipsed the bottom-up perspective centered on the intrinsic nature, value, and motivating powers of short-lived experiences that had characterized the hedonist tradition.[6]

Anscombe (interpreting and expanding on her very brief remarks on pleasure, guided by the larger context of her 1963/1957 and also by her later 1981d/1978) reasoned that since pleasure gives a reason for action, and reasons for action are intelligible only given a context of intelligible evaluation and motivation that no mere qualitative impression could supply, pleasure cannot be anything individuated only by how it feels in the moment and regardless of its larger context. Attributing pleasure to a subject, rather, involves understanding what it is for a subject to regard and behave toward something as good (however nonconceptually) and this in turn involves background knowledge of the ways something may intelligibly be considered good and an object of voluntary pursuit. The possession of the concept of pleasure thus presupposes the presence of a rich and contextually embedded concept of the good in its possessor that no mere momentary qualitative experience could supply. The concept of pleasure therefore cannot serve as a foundation for a concept of the good, nor can it even be itself founded on mere momentary qualitative experience, both of which empiricists accounting for the concept of good in terms of a feeling of pleasure had suppposed.

A philosophical friend of the simple picture of pleasure may, at this point, wish to jettison Lockean empiricism about the concept and, taking either reasons for action or goodness as conceptually basic, say that we pick out feeling states as pleasant, in part, by way of one or the other of these (e.g., Goldstein 2000, 2002, to some extent following Sidgwick's views, on which see n. 5 above and §2.3.1, ¶1 and n. 35 below). Taking pleasure so, as good feeling or feeling good, may do almost as well as one can, in brief, for the common adult conception, and has the advantage of using what may be culturally universal semantic elements (Wierzbicka 1999, pp. 279-82, 292-93). Still, such a realist about pleasure's goodness gone nativist about the concept's normative component will, if like Goldstein true to the hedonist tradition's bottom-up perspective on human value, wish to keep pleasure itself ontologically independent of explicitly normative and concept-involving attitudes, but have these rather respond to pleasure's value. Further, if pleasure is picked out by description as good feeling or as feeling good, one would presumably need also a concept of feeling, phenomenal consciousness, or the like to distinguish what special domain of good things is being picked out or in what special way good things are being indicated. And it is hard to see how these concepts can be formed without any help from experience. If so, it would seem more simple and direct to allow some role to Lockean ostension to experience or some other form of direct reference in our acquiring the concept of pleasure. This may also be more developmentally plausible than the child's triangulating to a concept of pleasure solely by way of general concepts. But far more holistic alternatives, far less in the spirit of the simple picture, are also on offer.

Bennett Helm, beginning in the 1990s, developed a positive view of this kind, pushing farther the tendency of Anscombe's sparse critical remarks, perhaps farther than she would want to go.[7] For Helm, pleasures and pains alike are ‘felt evaluations’ that impress themselves on our feeling (in contrast to our activity in evaluative judgment) by virtue of the larger patterns of evaluation they partially constitute. Our feeling pleasure or pain is just our having our attention and motivation directed in this way. A holistic and largely coherentist view of justificatory warrant seems here called upon to serve as a model for a causal account of motivation and for an account of the experience of pleasure as well.

While Helm's view of pleasure and pain accommodates Anscombe's constraint that pleasure provide holistically intelligible reasons for action and also fits his larger agenda, it implausibly makes a kitten's or an infant's hurting from a bruised limb or deriving pleasure from nursing depend causally on their having appropriate broad patterns of background concerns including, as he tells us, in cases of bodily pain, background concerns for the integrity of their bodies (2002, pp. 24-27). And if such a larger pattern of concern for one's body is really necessary for the affective component of pain, then this should fade in terminally ill people as they give up on life and come to want only a speedy natural death, rather than the continued relative functional integrity of their diseased bodies. To the extent that someone has predominantly such a pattern of desire and emotion, it would seem on this view that sensory pain (or, as Helm has it, the stimulation that would otherwise have been painful) must, as signaling the approach of the desired end, be if not purely then at least on balance pleasant. And in the unconflicted limiting case, we need not offer even palliative analgesia for relief of pain, since experiencing pain is supposed to be unintelligible lacking an appropriate larger pattern of desires and emotions. Lacking this, as Helm claims about torture, one‘s writhing and screaming fail to signify that one is suffering pain (2002, p. 24). But as Helm perhaps acknowledges by deferring in passing to biological constraints, we are not as unitary and governed by coherence among our feelings, desires, and evaluative judgments as he seems officially to propose. The same linkage with biology more than with any enduring pattern of concerns seems evident also in the case of pleasure, since mood tends to rise from morning to midday, with body temperature, and more generally with the availability of energy, as also often after eating (Thayer 1989, 1996), while one's pattern of concerns and even the degree to which they are held are presumably more constant through the course of a day. Pleasure and pain thus seem often to impose themselves on us unmediated by any large pattern of evaluations we can identify with, but rather from below, by partly autonomous mechanisms the output of which we typically learn to regulate and cognitively discount in the course of growing up, but whose own evolution-conferred implicit evaluations and goals may still influence our feeling and behavior out of proportion to their role in our more holistically-mediated and cognitive evaluations, even as we recognize that their appraisals may differ from the more considered ones we may consider more our own. We accordingly may feel and act outside of, as well as in, character, by having drives, feelings, and emotions we sometimes find it hard to own.

Holistic views of pleasure's constitution face plausibility problems in holding larger patterns of preexisting concerns and standing desires always behind spontaneous pleasure in a fragrance, sunset, or landscape — or someone's just being in a good mood. Holistic standards that are more appropriate in epistemic justification and as conditions on third person ascription of linguistic or conceptual competence seem stretched here, when called on to serve as constraints on the nature of pleasure itself. The possibility remains that our concerns and practical reasons begin very small, with pleasure and pain, rather than these coming always embedded in a much larger package deal. If a mere phenomenal feel seems not enough to be pleasure on account of its leaving unexplained or even inexplicable why we pursue it (§3.2, ¶2 and n. 34 below) and if a rational perception of its goodness (Goldstein 1980, 1989, 2002) seems too old-fashioned or ad hoc to supply this lack (see §3.2, ¶2), perhaps these backed by a physiological nature with its full complement of causal powers will do. It has been claimed (Moran 2002, pp. 209-14) that the kinds of normativity and of mental activity implicated in our finding pleasure in things show pleasure to be nothing physiological of the kind that could be directly caused by a drug; one could always just not like its results. But it seems rash to conclude, on such grounds, that simple and manipulable brain chemistry changes cannot directly cause (as even transient depression of mood, such as can be caused by serotonin depletion, seems to suppress) our taking pleasure in things or that pleasure always requires a cognitively complex condition or cause. As cases of our own simple good moods (including ones caused by morphine drips, that may not only make one pleasantly relaxed but also dispel any mental resistance to being so) and those of a dog or cat enjoying lying in the sun suggest, questions about the subject's normatively governed exercise of skill or connoisseurship in finding pleasure, and about what reasons the subject acquires consequent on experiencing pleasure, may be irrelevant to the basic question of whether pleasure is had. Even if pleasure is or involves a functional state of some kind, this may be a relatively small and local one of a kind shared with far simpler animals. And this, it seems, may be constituted by intrinsic functions of mind, brain, and body rather than one constituted, however indirectly through other psychological states, by environmental connections through perception and action (as on more standard functionalist views) or constitutively embedded in a cognitively complex normative space of skills and reasons (as Moran apparently holds).

Hedonists in the grip of the simple picture regard pleasure-seeking as uniquely intelligible and demand that all motivated action and all reasons for action be fitted to this mold. Opponents who privilege a holistic model of evaluation and deliberation may demand, instead, that all feeling be made intelligible in its terms. We should be equally skeptical of both demands and also of the claims for special and exclusive intelligibility on which they trade. Probably, as in perception, both top-down and bottom-up processes have roles. Our naive concept of pleasure seems to leave open where exactly in the vast territory between Helm's holism and Locke's internalist mental atomism pleasure and pain lie. But it appears that some level of affective pleasure and pain are present in very young infants who as yet have no large pattern of desires and concerns and also in dying people who have permanently lost the capacity for them. The default presumption seems to be that in many cases such as these and of ordinary ‘simple pleasures’ and of elevated mood as well no large integrated pattern of evaluative attitudes or of aesthetic aptitudes need obtain. If so, and if this is any indication of what pleasure's nature is on the whole, we have some reason to return to something closer to the simple picture that retains its experiential core.

1.3 More Modest Roles for Experience

More of the thrust of Anscombe's complaint about philosophers' use of the concept of pleasure and of the simple picture may be turned by purging these of early modern empiricism's view of such concepts as formed solely by ostension to mental items discovered exclusively and known exhaustively by introspection and substituting a more developmentally plausible and epistemologically modest direct reference in its place. The child acquiring the ability to refer to pleasure may surely look to more than unaided inward recognition when learning to sort together sweets, hugs, and play and to name something common these typically cause or sustain. The great medieval lyric poet Walther von der Vogelweide paraphrases joy as “dancing, laughing, singing”.[8] And Darwin writes, “I heard a child a little under four years old, when asked what was meant by being in good spirits, answer, ‘It is laughing, talking, and kissing.’ It would be difficult to give a truer and more practical definition.”[9] As Darwin observes, “[W]ith all races of man, the expression of good spirits appears to be the same, and is easily recognized.”[10] The contrast with the negative affects develops very early in the expressive behavior of the child and is also early and easily perceived. While a mature conception will distinguish behavioral expression from its inward cause (as Walther does, in lines 28-29, quoted in note 8), the very young child may possess a less differentiated conception in which the salient contrasts between smiling or laughing and crying (Walther, line 29), and generally between the external expressions of the positive and negative affects, are prominent. Labeling and reporting one's own states may then develop alongside attribution to others.

Our basic ability to refer to pleasure presumably develops, given normal social experience, from innately prepared capacities for affective feeling, expression, and perception that must work together already to facilitate early emotional communication and bonding between infant and mother and, later, mutual understanding with others.[11] These capacities, then, would prepare the way for adults and children, hedonists and skeptics about pleasure's claims all to communicate about pleasure even when they differ on whether pleasure is really good or merely appears to be so, whether only pleasure is good, and whether there is any invariable, internal, or necessary connection between pleasure and desire. The mature common conception, at least, is not a purely behavioral one, since occurrent inward affect, beyond any behavior or behavioral disposition, is at least part of its intended referent. And since that conception of pleasure serves not only to explain expressive behavior but also to justify as well as explain action, a connection to value or at least to some kind of evaluation, however implicit, seems close to that conception's importance and point. Still, our shared ability to refer to pleasure should not be so closely connected to any concept of good as to make inconsistent the Stoic denial that pleasure is good, as Sidgwick observed (1907, p. 129), or to deny our ability to disagree with Stoics about a common subject. (G.E. Moore inflated Sidgwick's point into the discovery of a distinct nonnatural property of goodness; Moore 1903, pp. 5-21, 60-61. His supposed proof that pleasure and good are different has been more recently understood as showing only a distinction between concepts [e.g., Gibbard 2003, ch. 2, pp. 21-37, especially 31-32] or meanings [e.g., Brink 1989, pp. 151-54, 162-67, especially 163] that leaves open what relations, including identity and difference, may hold between any referents the concepts may have. For citations of earlier criticism of Moore, predating the developments in semantics c. 1970 due to Kripke and Putnam, see Darwall, Gibbard, and Railton 1992, n. 2.) Sidgwick suggested we and the Stoics share a conception of pleasure as involving not its goodness but only the prima facie appearance that pleasure is good. We may, more modestly, appeal merely to our basic capacity to refer to pleasure, without any such sophisticated cognitive mediation — a capacity that we, Stoics, and very young children without distinct and developed conceptions of goodness, appearance, and reality may alike share.

To a slightly older child, pleasure may signify at once feeling that is good and behavior expressing it and goodness of life no more than these. From such a liberalized Lockean basis, not wholly experiential but not arrived at without experience, a child may, with further experience and learning, progress to a more mature conception of good and thence to the common adult conception of pleasure as feeling that is good. Following Sidgwick further, we may say that reflective older children and adults who can distinguish between appearance and reality may then find their way to a still more liberalized conception that allows the possibility that pleasure's appearance of goodness may sometimes or even always mislead, despite the commonsense presumption that this appearance is at least in large part and often true. (Even Stoic sages, after all, were once children, too.) But through our shared basic ability to refer to pleasure, preserved since childhood, Stoics and hedonists continue to disagree about a shared subject, without the Stoics sharing in our common conception that pleasure is feeling that is actually good. And so can Fred Feldman, who cheerfully denies that pleasure feels like anything at all (§2.3.2).

Saving the core of the simple picture, pleasure as a relatively unmediated momentary experience, as an ingredient in a tenable view, in this way, however, abandons the obviousness of pleasure's nature, goodness, and explanatory role in motivation that complete introspective transparency was supposed to give. Experience of pleasure may play a role in allowing direct reference to it and also in forming our conception of the good without its giving us any deep knowledge of these. Even whether there actually is such a kind as pleasure, as there appears to be, is open to refutation by new science. But if introspection is thus fallible, then Sidgwick's failing to find a single feeling of pleasure, Ryle's finding it a behavioral disposition, and Feldman a pure propositional attitude like belief (§2.3.2) separable from having any feeling at all, are not decisive objections to pleasure feeling like something in particular. The immediacy of phenomenal experience need not make for obviousness to cognition, as on the full-blooded empiricist construal of the simple picture. (Related distinctions between different kinds of consciousness are discussed in §2.3.4, ¶3)

There is some scientific reason to believe introspection of affective, as opposed to, for example, sensory, experience, is especially prone to errors of omission. Focal awareness of specific informational content and the experience of affect have long been thought to compete with each other — and not merely as different sensory or cognitive contents do. Competitive alternation between the two modes of experience was a commonplace of past psychology and is receiving increasing confirmation.[12] Important recent research by Marcus Raichle and his collaborators indicates a default, monitoring mode of brain activity, plausibly interpreted as including representations of one's current hedonic state, in the ventromedial prefrontal and posterior cingulate cortices, that is turned down by attention-demanding tasks, even by ones involving introspection into one's current affective state (Gusnard et al. 2001, Gusnard and Raichle 2004, Fox et al. 2005). Paradoxically, the very focusing of introspective scrutiny on pleasure, provoked by the demand to accurately report it, may, thus, turn down the gain on systems involved in representing it. The problem is analogous to that of attending to the periphery of one's visual field, likewise represented in Raichle's default mode system; such experience can be had only by looking sidewise. But peripheral vision, when it becomes salient, tends to automatically cause eye movement leading to foveal vision of the salient stimulus, rather than to introspective awareness of the distinctive qualities and deficiencies of peripheral vision, of which many of us remain unaware. Pleasure seems, similarly, often to attach attention to salient stimuli and activities rather than to itself, compatibly with what philosophers seeking to explain pleasure's ability to motivate desire ultimately directed toward other objects have proposed (e.g., Schlick 1930/1939, Ch. II, §§4-10, pp. 36-55). Such a perspective would also answer the objection of Geoffrey Madell (2002, pp. 90-93), to views of pleasure such as the simple picture's, that if pleasure were non-intentional feeling it would divert our attention from what we are enjoying, such as music, to itself. It seems, rather, that as task demands increase, these automatically and progressively cut off our ability to introspectively focus on our affective state, so that when engaged in demanding activities (whether athletic or musical) the pleasure we experience is out of (the limited-capacity cognitive awareness of our) mind (cf. §2.3.4, ¶3).

This new science, together with the individual differences between subjects it shows, may also explain the remarkable failures of introspectionist psychologists (n. 3, ¶ 3) and of philosophers to agree on whether pleasure has one phenomenal feel, a diversity, or none at all and why bodily sensations (which are not similarly resistant to inspection) may show up instead. If introspectively attending to momentary feeling tends to make affect cognitively inaccessible, then that people (including Henry Sidgwick, §1.2, ¶1, Fred Feldman, §2.3.2, and some practitioners and subjects of the introspectionist psychology reported in n. 3, ¶3) who have conscientiously sought to introspect their pleasure sometimes sound as if they have discovered they have no qualitative hedonic experience should not be so surprising. Such introspection may often be a worse guide than untutored experience as to what pleasure is. But if pleasure is nevertheless, in a phenomenal way (see §2.3.4), an immediate experience, that and what else it is and does in the mind need not be (cognitively) obvious. Simplistic pictures of consciousness that render the mind throughly transparent to itself may be separated from the experiential approach to pleasure at the simple picture's core. However, that one can, thus, ultimately, save the simple picture's core, of pleasure as an immediate momentary experience, requiring little or nothing by way of context or intentional content, is, even if true, also not obvious. Neither need pleasure's value always be (cognitively) obvious. If such an epistemically modest direct reference succeeds, pleasure may turn out to be just whatever, in a correct psychology and biology, it turns out to be, brain state, feeling, attitude or something with features of all three. It may do this because it has not, in our acquiring our natural basic capacity to refer to it, been assigned permanently to any essential and essence-limiting category a priori. Ancient philosophers, who shared a more modest view of immediate experience's cognitive claims than the early moderns', accordingly made freer use of the biology of their day (regardless of whether they were dualists or materialists in their metaphysics) in their thinking about what kind of thing pleasure is. Contemporary philosophers may still have much to learn from their example.

2. Theories Reconciling Pleasure's Unity with Diversity

On the simple picture, pleasure itself is always the same; when it comes, variously, from sweets, music, running, or relaxation, it is only caused in different ways. Philosophers' theories have often aimed to respect, more equally with pleasure's obscurely felt unity, also the diversity manifest in its occasions, by capturing both theoretical generality and specific difference in a principled way. Thus Plato speculated that pleasure is a sensing, perceiving, or awareness of improvement, in varying respects, in one's condition; Aristotle, that it arises in the unimpeded functional fulfillment of varying life capacities in their characteristically different activities (e.g.; perceiving things, theorizing about their natures); and recent writers that it is a welcoming attitude (had toward different contents) or stance that may waver between having different objects and having none at all. Such questions have been explicitly contested at least since Plato had his Socrates suggest that pleasure is so extremely heterogeneous that no simple ethical generalizations about it will hold. His challenge was that different kinds of people take pleasure in such different things that the burden is on the hedonist to show that all cases of pleasure really have some form, component, or natural kind in common, by which they are all in the same way good. Without reason to believe something of this sort we would also have no reason to believe, just because some cases of pleasure are good, that others will be good as well (Philebus 12C-13B). Plato, although no hedonist, took up his own challenge of finding an account that unifies all pleasure while respecting its specific differences. Aristotle followed him in attempting this. Philosophers are still at it today, as in the views that make pleasure a single kind of attitude or stance taken toward different things.

2.1 From Diversity toward Universality

There are four chief pleasures, a saying among Afghan men goes: of the hot bath, of a youth with his friends, of a man with a woman, and of seeing one's son grown to manhood. May these all be ways of freeing animals of our kind from bodily tension, stressful isolation, drive, or worry into potentially prolonged relaxation, security, intimacy, openness to experience, or release from cares? Are all these transitions into some relevantly common state? And what about the experiences relished by the gourmet and by lovers of thrills, adventure, frights, and hot spice? Can these be brought in, with the hot bath, too?

Song and poetry celebrated salient pleasures and lamented their loss, psychological truisms remarked their attractions, elders and moralists cautioned against their indulgence, and libertine hedonists responded by rejecting prudence, competitive ambition, and social norms for the daily joys of sensation, society, sex, and parental love, long before theorists asked what pleasure is, what its place is in human nature and in nature more generally, and whether its attraction is a mark of something universally and truly good.[13] When pleasure was first distinguished from pleasures (the particular or generic occasions, such as walking home or seeing a sunset, on which pleasure often depends) it was not always seen as a mere psychological state. In the Taittirîya Upanishad (India, roughly 700 B.C.E.) pleasure is identified with the ultimate Divine principle Brahman, with which the experiencer might be thought of as communing or unified.[14] And in the West Empedocles (Greek Sicily, c.492 B.C.E.-c.432 B.C.E.) naturalized the Greek goddess Aphrodite by identifying both her and pleasure with his cosmic attractive force of Love, foreshadowing both medieval Christian theologians (§2.3.1; ¶2) and those recent writers who think of pleasure as a unitary attitude (§2.3.2) or stance (§2.3.3).[15]

2.2 Two Classical Accounts: Functional Unity with Difference

Plato and Aristotle offer the earliest surviving arguments and systematic discussions about the nature of pleasure. They aimed at understanding pleasure's value, biology, and place in psychology and experience in an integrated way, in the context of the dawning and largely speculative science of their day. Their shared method of dividing generic natural kinds into specific subkinds suggested theoretically general ways to capture at once pleasure's unity and diversity.

2.2.1 Plato: Fulfilling Different Needs

Plato built on the ancient common sense that connected pleasure with the satisfaction of felt longing or desire and also on early scientific speculation equating pleasure with the fulfillment of bodily needs. He observed that such simple motivational accounts fail because we may experience pleasure without any previously felt distress, desire, or relevant bodily need, as sometimes when looking, listening, smelling, or learning, and also that one may fulfill physiological needs without experiencing pleasure in the process of so doing.[16] He therefore refined and generalized the current physiologically-influenced account of pleasure as restoration of bodily imbalance or deficiency, on the model of hunger and thirst, to make it instead the sensation, perception, or consciousness (all aisthêsis in Greek) of return from a (possibly unnoticed) state of deficiency into a naturally healthy state.[17] The ‘pure’ (‘unmixed with pain’) pleasures of knowing and perceiving were apparently construed as signaling the satisfaction of needs we are unaware of, and so not pained by, in acquiring or having. A unified account of all pleasure was thus achieved, as awareness of processes of fulfilling very diverse needs, systematically accounting for both pleasure's unity and diversity. Pleasure could be accorded a place in the best life attainable for beings like ourselves, imperfect enough to have recurrent needs but sometimes aware of their however partial and temporary satisfaction. But the absolutely best life would be a divine one of permanent perfect knowing without the possibility of further learning or any other improvement, and in which there would therefore be no pleasure at all — and presumably we would do well, insofar as we are able, to approximate to this. Descartes' views of the function or content of pleasure and Spinoza's official definitions of pleasure as an affect of transition to greater perfection are close to Plato's, as also are one of Kant's characterizations,[18] one of Elijah Millgram's (2000, pp. 122-26), and Timothy Schroeder's (2001, 2004, discussed in §3.2). Such Improvement Indicator Views may account for diversity within pleasure by the different species of improvements indicated. But they need not attribute explicit awareness of needs or of their fulfillments as such to the experiencing subject. A modern version might attribute only biological functions, without requiring any explicit representation of depletions or repletions at either personal or subpersonal levels.

2.2.2 Aristotle: Perfecting Different Activities

Aristotle rejected Plato's assimilation of enjoying sights, sounds, smells, and intellectual activity to the satisfaction of homeostasis-serving appetites and also his view of the highest, divine life as one of pleasureless cognition. Yet he adopted as his own the project of finding a unitary account of pleasure that would fit the teleological metaphysics and intellectualist value theory he inherited from Plato — and also Plato's strategy of giving a generic formal account that allows for specific variation. He therefore rejected Plato's repletion process account totally to substitute his own equally general account of pleasure as arising from the activities of animals, or of their parts or faculties, when these are, at least in part, already in a good condition (which, even when prepared by an earlier process of repletion, is not identical to that). This freed pleasure from the taint of imperfection attached to processes aiming at ulterior goals within the value-laden teleological biology he shared with Plato.

Aristotle's account of life as a teleologically and hierarchically unified system of capacities allowed him to give a unified account of pleasure while discriminating systematically among different kinds and instances according to their ranks in his value-laden hierarchy of life capacities and their functionings. Activities when unimpeded and perfected, on his view, each includes within itself its own specific ‘supervenient’ pleasure, differentiated in kind from others according to the kind of activity (NE X,5). The different pleasures thus have a generic unity, as belonging to perfected activities of developed life capacities — a unity ultimately deriving from the generic unity of life itself. The differing causal powers of different kinds of pleasure, each supporting engagement in its own specific activity, but interfering with others, could thus be accounted for, and their higher level functional similarities as well, by regarding instances of pleasure as expressions and experiences of the success of one's life's, or soul's, fulfillment in particular activities of its constitutive capacities — but in different activities that, according to the differing teleological ranks of their life capacities and objects, have correspondingly differing degrees of pleasure and value. Pleasure is thus no accidental addition to life; it naturally reflects and tracks success in living and its value. This value is teleologically explanatory of our biological development and of the lower animal desires in which we share, but also gives to human life and rational human action their own higher ultimate goal and point. Living a life that brings our biologically highest capacities to their complete development and then exercises them without impediment upon their naturally best and most suitable objects brings the most pleasant pleasure with it. Trivial or ignoble pleasures are sought instead by those who are stunted in their capacities or opportunities for higher activities, or else fail to develop the intellectual and moral virtues needed to use these well, and consequently fall short of the natural human goal. That is the fully human happiness which consists in using reason well, which at its best approximates to the best and pleasantest life form of all, the changeless purely intellectual activity of God. Our pleasure tracks the perfection of our current activities and thus our proximity to this, life at its cognitively clearest, most awake, and best.[19]

Aristotle's theory, which we may call a Perfection in Functioning View, accommodates both pleasure's generic unity and specific diversity by making pleasantness and value vary together, with the nature and value of the various life activities of animals, and these, in turn, with those of the objects they cognize or accomplish. It has had a deservedly great influence on later accounts, from later antiquity to recent philosophy and welfare economics.[20] Recently the prolific social psychologist Mihaly Csikszentmihalyi's studies mainly of self-reports of the ‘flow experience’ of engaged absorption in activities have provided some empirical support for flow's connection with enjoyment, but also, perhaps, for its not, despite its advertising, being the very same thing — as he, like Aristotle, in his improving exhortation, sometimes seems to want it to be.[21]

John Stuart Mill followed Aristotle in endorsing a rational preference for ‘higher’ pleasures over those we share with ‘lower’ animals, but objected to Aristotle's tying pleasure to objective functional standards. He and more recent writers have posed simple counterexamples to these being even sufficient or necessary conditions for pleasure, using perceptual examples such as Aristotle used in expounding his theory. Mill's objection may be interpreted and expanded on as follows. Aristotle's theory, as developed and applied to such cases, seems to require that the perception of the most perfectly perceptibly discriminable tastes (which, it seems, may be unpleasant) by the most acute sensory systems in their best condition and unimpeded operation be pleasant in corresponding degree, since pleasure is supposed on Aristotle's theory to correspond to the excellence of the perfected activity and this, in turn, to the excellence of the faculty and object concerned and their mutual suitability (NE X,4:1174b14-1175a3). So this Aristotelian condition seems insufficient for pleasure, if excellence of object is filled out in cognitive or functional rather than in hedonic terms. Neither is this condition necessary for pleasure, since even a slightly sweet taste may yet be pleasant (and even, one might add, when one's taste buds are not at their very best or proportionally to the quality of the stimulus and of organ or act of perception as such). If we do not, as Aristotle may, downgrade or upgrade objects and activities ad hoc (counting those we enjoy as excellent and those we dislike and suffer from as the opposite), thus making the theory trivially true by making pleasure (occurrent or typical) the standard of excellence, we are left with an unadorned cognitive or functional account of the excellence of human perceptual and cognitive functionings in terms of their success in gaining information about their objects (and of their objects in terms of their suitability to this). This seems to be, when all such extraneous (by our lights) evaluative standards are removed, what is left of Aristotle's view; but this seems, again, to count acute but unpleasant sensations as pleasant. (Similar but less crisp counterexamples can be constructed in other domains; Aristotle seems committed to the perfected highest and clearest cognitive activity always being the pleasantest.) We must, Mill concludes, test such theories by experience and then reject them on that ground — or else move in the direction of defining excellence of faculties and objects by their disposition to yield pleasure when they work together, in which case we move in a small circle and offer no independent characterization of pleasure.[22] But a quasi-Aristotelian may acknowledge all this and abandon the claims that led to the falsified predictions, while still believing pleasure is some kind of way activities are performed (to be filled out empirically). How far nature will cooperate in affording some appropriate unitary, nondisjunctive way that fits our use of cases in attempting direct reference to pleasure remains to be seen. The same holds all the more for whether anything of Aristotle's ambition of explaining pleasure's value by some more basic value in living (as on his view, by the ultimately worthwhile activity of cognitive life capacities) may be filled out in a more modern and scientific way.

2.3 Pleasure's Place in the Intentional Structure of Mind

Many ordinary mental states recognized by common sense, such as belief and desire, are, as states of those kinds, necessarily directed upon some object or content. And the cognitive sciences, in using information-processing models, seem to attribute further representational content inaccessible to explicit awareness. Interest in the representational powers of mind goes back to the beginnings of Western philosophy (Caston 2003). Such intentionality, or aboutness, has suggested further ways to reconcile pleasure's unity with its involvement in human life's experienced diversity. According to a Christian philosophical tradition, pleasure constitutively depends on a mental act of loving that may be directed toward different cognitively presented things. To some contemporary analytic philosophers influenced by them, pleasure itself is a single propositional attitude, like belief, that, similarly, may be directed toward diverse propositional contents. The tenability of such accounts concerns not only philosophers primarily interested in pleasure but also those more generally concerned with the nature of mind. Brentano claimed that all mentality is intentional and some recent analytic philosophers that the phenomenal character of experience is constituted by its representational content (Lycan 2005). If there are representationally contentless but phenomenally conscious pleasant moods, such claims and theories cannot be correct.

2.3.1 Pleasure as Involving Liking or Loving

The lack of a precise theory of pleasure's nature presented no scandal so long as pleasure was thought of as an experience, however variable and generic, typical causes of which might be roughly characterized but for which no verbally explicit real definition was to be expected (Locke and Kant, cited in n. 3; Mill 1872/1979, p. 430). Perhaps, indeed, this is may be all any account short on biological or computational detail, and on the functional insight these offer, can provide. However, taking introspection to be a source of scientific knowledge led to disquiet when introspectors failed to agree about what, if any, distinctive introspectible item they had found in experiencing pleasure. Even before this had run its course in psychology (§1.1, last paragraph; see also the last three paragraphs of §1.3), the philosopher Henry Sidgwick had failed to find any distinctive and uniform quality in his own experience of pleasure. His more complex and at least cognitively normative relational definition of quantity of pleasure, in terms of strength of hypothetical desire based in errror-free comparisons of “feeling, apprehended as desirable by the sentient individual at the time of feeling it” (1907, p. 129; see n. 5 above), led C.D. Broad to suggest, in passing, that the pleasant experiences might be just those we like.[23]

Franz Brentano, Sidgwick's close contemporary, had made concern with such intentional (act/object or attitude/content) structure once more central to Western psychology and philosophy. The involvement of pleasure and emotions with beliefs and desires was a starting point for discussions in Plato (Philebus 36ff.) and Aristotle (Rhetoric II, 2-11). In their tradition pleasure was often regarded as, in part, a bodily phenomenon not belonging to our true, nonbodily, self or true good.[24] Scholastic philosophers of the Western Christian high middle ages accordingly regarded bodily pleasure as occurring in a sensory soul or power, caused directly by sensory awareness. They debated competing views concerning the causation and intentional relations of thought-mediated pleasure, regarded as occurring in the intellectual soul or power. On William of Ockham's account, such pleasure causally depends directly on the will's loving acceptance, as good in itself, of an object intellectually presented. For Ockham, this pleasure is distinct from the loving acceptance on which it depends, as is shown by cases (for example, of depressed mood) in which the normally resulting pleasure fails to occur. Others denied these two were distinct. Some of them allowed, however, a distinct second-order loving taking the original loving as its object and as that of its pleasure; another thought this higher-order loving and pleasure might be included in the original act of loving.[25] Descartes rejected this dualism, regarding all pleasure (as all else mental) as essentially thought (and, specifically, as at least often involving thinking that some good pertains to oneself) and sensory, or bodily, pleasure as pleasing the immaterial thinking mind by informing it of its body's sufficiency to withstand the mild challenge to its integrity that the sensory stimulation presents (see n. 3, ¶2, for references). For Brentano, sensory pleasure takes as its intentional content, rather, the sensuous experiencing of sensory qualities. It is a loving directed toward a sensory act. In intellectually-caused pleasure, our purely spiritual (nonbodily) loving (as it seems: nonaffective liking, approving of, or being pleased by) the content of a thought causes us to affectively love a sensory experiencing — i.e., to experience bodily sensory pleasure.[26]

2.3.2 Pleasure as a Content-Bound Attitude, Like Belief

Fred Feldman, among other contemporary philosophers, influenced by Brentano and Roderick Chisholm's championing of his views, identifies pleasure (in the relevant inclusive use) with an occurrent attitude (comparable to Broad's liking, Sidgwick's apprehension as desirable, and Brentano's loving) rather than, as Sidgwick, with the experiences that are such an attitude's objects.[27] If such an act/object analysis applies uniformly to all pleasure, and if we must choose between mere occurrences in the mind and how we take them, opting thus for how we take them would seem the correct choice. Then the act or attitude type, rather than its diverse objects, would be what all episodes of pleasure have in common and, presumably, be what makes them such, while its objects, including instances of ‘sensory pleasure’ (in use 2 of n. 1, ¶8), are brought together only through their relation to it (cf. Feldman 1997a, 2004).

Unlike Brentano, for whom human intellectual pleasure turns out, in the end, to be sensory, bodily, and affective, Feldman, in attempting a similarly unifying account, moves in the opposite direction; his attitudinal pleasure is not supposed to essentially involve any feeling at all. (For this reason, his saying it is an attitude like belief communicates his intention more clearly than his going on sometimes to add hope and fear, without making explicit that he intends these latter, also, to be pure propositional attitudes not essentially or centrally involving feeling, as he presumably does.) Friends of the simple picture's experiential core, of pleasure conceived as involving felt momentary affective experience, will want to resist not only this denial of the centrality of feeling in pleasure but also the claim that intentional stucture is alway present (although they may accept that there is often a distinction between sensory or cognitive causes or objects and the pleasure that consists in how one affectively takes, or responds to, them). There are also other grounds for skepticism about the uniform attitude approach, since an act/object or attitude/content account, again, seems not to fit the phenomenology of someone enjoying a pleasant nap, daydream, or diffuse good mood, as it must if it is to be an account of inclusive pleasure — as seems necessary given Feldman's larger aim of discussing hedonism as a view of ‘the good life’ in ethical theory. Taking all pleasure to be a single special kind of propositional or de se (directly attributing a property to oneself) attitude, as in Feldman 1997c/1988, in all human and animal pleasure alike, also strains intuitive plausibility by requiring cognitive powers of propositional representation or self-reference even in young children and animals (as in Feldman 2002, p. 607), if these are not to be denied pleasure. And the belief we must choose between pleasure feeling like something and its having intentionality also seems questionable. Bennett Helm, as we have seen (§1.2), and also other contemporary philosophers, including Geoffrey Madell (2002, chs. 5 and 6) and Timothy Schroeder (§3.1), reject this exclusive disjunction of the two in proposing accounts on which both belong to pleasure, as did many medievals and, following them, Brentano. (Believing we must here choose between feeling and intentionality derives, presumably, from some questionable philosophical beliefs: first, that it is illicit, at least in philosophy, to discuss something without providing criteria of individuation for the thing in question; and, further, that propositional attitudes, individuated purely by their kinds, subjects, and contents, clearly provide these and are the only remaining option once feelings or sensations, individuated purely by their feel or qualitative character, are ruled out. The first belief is criticized near the beginning of Saul Kripke's widely circulating and cited “Lectures on Identity through Time”, which I here cite from memory of their oral delivery in a lecture class at Princeton; it was already rejected at the end of §1.3 above, where it was suggested that we may leave such matters to the world and future science.)

The single uniform attitude approach also faces a problematic tension between its intuitive motivation and its technical adequacy. The natural and intuitive assignment of contents that first makes plausible construing pleasure as an attitude with content runs into problems when it is extended to a uniform attitude theory of the content of all pleasure, as Anscombe (1981c/1967) first observed. To use and develop further her line of reasoning using her original example, her enjoying riding with someone is different and separable from her enjoying reflecting then on the fact that she is and (if it is distinct from that, also from) her being pleased then that this is the case. But on a single uniform attitude analysis, applied in what seems a natural and intuitive way, it seems these should consist in her directing the same attitude on the same proposition or, better, on her self-attributing the same property. But this won't do to keep these distinct and allow that she might enjoy one but not the other, as she surely may. We could assign different more finely individuated states of affairs or whatever as contents, but intuitively it seems that the content may be the same in some such cases. At this point we may be tempted to propose a further technical fix, by individuating still more finely, in terms of modes of presentation or the like, to account for the multiplicity without multiplying attitude types and contents, although it may become obscure just what, if anything, such relocation of the embarrassing multiplicity accomplishes.[28] But perhaps one may thus regard the activity of reflecting as a different mode of presentation of the same riding that Anscombe more directly enjoys. However, it seems more natural and intuitive to say the attitude is directed, instead, primarily toward these different activities, including some naturally described as having propositional or de se contents, such as Anscombe's reflecting that she is riding with someone, but also to others, such as her just riding, that apparently do not.

Anscombe's earlier work, apparently provoked by earlier proposals similar to Feldman's, suggests such a way out. As she noted, cases described as enjoying a proposition or fact seem to involve our thinking about it or being in some state or the like (1981c/1967). These seem to be activities or experiencings that we may (following Aristotle) regard as activities, at least for present purposes. We may, then, let the different activities make the needed distinctions, by saying that enjoying riding is one thing and enjoying reflecting that one is riding is another. Such an approach also handles the pleasure of prancing puppies and of suckling babies without seeming to ascribe to them the general and logically combinatorial representational capacities that may be involved in having attitudes toward propositions, attributing properties to oneself, or the like — capacities that puppies and babies may lack and that even human adults may not always exercise when enjoying a nap or a warm bath.

Feldman, in an encyclopedia treatment that perhaps presents the attitudinal approach to pleasure more broadly than the works cited above presenting his own version, allows attitudinal pleasure to take among its objects or contents activities and sensations as well as facts (2001, p. 667). In his own view he allows nonactual states of affairs among the objects of attitudinal pleasure (2002, p. 608). Presumably he will need distinct impossible ones as well, so that Hobbes' pleasure in contemplating the (supposed) geometrical fact (actually, a mathematical impossibility) that the circle can be squared may be distinguished from his pleasure in his having (equally impossibly) discovered this. (Surely the magnitude of his taking pleasure in these two may change in opposite directions, as his focus shifts, as he first loses all thought of himself in the mathematics, but later fills with self-regarding pride.) Whether there are such distinct impossible facts or states of affairs or propositions (between which Feldman may not distinguish) seems especially controversial. (However, distinguishing less problematical nonactual but possible facts, and even actual ones, from each other also presents technical problems that give some ground for skepticism about making precise sense even of these. [Oliver 1998 introduces these problems and their literature.]) Feldman tells us that pleasure is an attitude like belief, so it may seem we may rest content to have pleasure no worse off than belief and leave it to theorists of belief to solve such shared problems generally. But pleasure must be even more general than belief if, as in Feldman 2001, it takes as its objects not only the contents of belief (often thought of as abstract entities, which as we have seen need to at least represent, if not include, nonactual and even impossible objects) but also sensations and activities that, for us to enjoy them, must be not only actual and concrete but also present and our own. The supposedly single attitude of pleasure seems to come apart along this line, in part corresponding to one between sensory and intellectual pleasure that many medievals and Brentano respected, by complicating their theories at this point, as Feldman does not. Similarly, if I mistakenly but enjoyably eat your sandwich, I then enjoy (the activity of) eating your sandwich without enjoying (thinking I am) eating your sandwich (under that description) in the way someone might even if mistaken, while I cannot (in the way I do) enjoy eating your sandwich without the eaten sandwich really being yours. It seems the attitude must assume, as needed, very different logical properties. How one attitude can do this is not clear; the theoretical grasp we have on Feldman's supposed sui generis (of a kind of its own) attitude seems not to clarify the unity of pleasure it is supposed to explain, but rather to be parasitic on whatever grasp we pretheoretically had on this. The move from Locke's positing a special feeling to Feldman's positing a special attitude thus does not obviously help with the unity problem for pleasure it is supposed to solve; similar doubts may be raised in the two cases both about the posited entities' unity and about how we can know it to obtain.

Further, pleasure differs from belief and similar nonaffective propositional attitudes in seeming to be more locally biological. It may, again (§1.1, ¶4), spill over promiscuously from one object to another as belief logically cannot; it is generally suppressed by depressed mood, as belief is not; a diminished capacity for pleasure may be restored by antidepressant drugs, while there are neither specific deficits affecting all and only beliefs nor specific remedies for them. Belief and the like are plausibly thought of, at least in large part, as globally functional states neither simply localized in any single discrete neural system nor susceptible to being caused directly by any simple chemical intervention. If psychological realism and parsimony are to constrain our theory, the evidence would seem to favor an account more like Ockham's on which objects presented by thought may be loved consequently, with pleasure often resulting. We may then theorize that sophisticated intentionality belongs primarily to the cognitively representational powers of mind, also to the loving that uses these in referring to and acting toward its objects, but is ascribed to pleasure only derivatively through functionally appropriate causal connections by way of these. The most natural and uniform attitudinal view of pleasure would seem to be one on which to enjoy a sensation is just to enjoy sensing it and that similarly to enjoy any cognitive content or object of thought as such is just to enjoy thinking about it or the like — and that these are all actual activities. Then we can distinguish Hobbes' two pleasures and also Anscombe's riding from her reflecting on it, whatever (if any) view we have about thought's contents. Determining the extent to which any such specific uniform attitude proposal is different from, and any better or worse than, an ‘adverbial’ (activity-dependent) neoAristotelian view on which particular instances of pleasure are modes of their activities (without the need for any special single kind of attitude) would require further consideration.

2.3.3 Pleasure as a Welcoming-Whatever Stance

To the extent that our real reason for believing (with Feldman) that pleasure is some single attitude or else (with Aristotle) that there is some generic ‘way’ we do things we enjoy is that we seem to recognize some unity in our occurrent engagement with whatever, it is tempting to think that what we find in common may also obtain freestanding (as sometimes when we seem to have pleasure when doing nothing at all and attitudinizing toward nothing at all) — and that it is this itself that pleasure is. Perhaps, then, pleasure is a stance (for lack of a better place-holding term) of affective openness, welcoming, or immediate liking with which we engage in the activities and experiences we enjoy, from thinking to swimming to just lying about and ‘doing nothing’, but that may also (unlike ordinary propositional attitudes or de se [reflexively-centered] attitudes) obtain without having any object or content at all. Such a stance, might, perhaps, be realized in or organized by some core process of our minds and brains or by some larger pattern of brain functioning that is involved in our performance of activities when we enjoy them — but also is capable of switching its and our direction from one activity to another and even of being active on its own when not so directed. While instances of attitudes such as belief and desire are individuated by their contents, such a stance's instances could instead be individuated more intrinsically and perhaps more like stuff or process than as particular intentional mental acts. Rather than being an attitude of taking pleasure in some specific or particular content or other, pleasure itself could be a central state independent of such attitudes which they arise from or include as their common inner ground.

There is empirical evidence that affect can exist separated from what under normal conditions would have been its object that supports thinking of it in such less object-bound ways. In experiments the nonconscious mechanisms that bind pleasure to objects can be fooled about the pleasure's source (which presumably they evolved to track), resulting in personal-level ignorance or error about this and even the unconscious formation of arbitrary new preferences. For example, experimental subjects may be caused to like a beverage better by initial exposure to it after a photograph of a smiling face under conditions in which there is no awareness of the face being seen or of one's affective response it caused. This presumably works by pleasantness being ‘misattributed’ by unconscious cognitive mechanisms that, ignorant of any more appropriate cause for the positive affect, attribute pleasantness to the next salient stimulus they find, with an enduring liking for the beverage resulting from this. (The phenomenon may reflect the working of adaptive general mechanisms that form our individual tastes and affections according to their hedonic consequences.) Similar spillover of affect from unattended sources, for example, of unattended physical discomfort leading to anger at a salient target, may be widespread and better supported in everyday life. The phenomenon, however supported, and not its frequency or distribution, is what matters here. And it is presumably explained by affective processes being detachable from what would have been their objects under more cognitively optimal conditions.[29]

On the basis of this and other science (e.g., Shizgal 1997, 1999) it seems that affect, may, like color and many other features, be processed separately in the brain from representations of any objects to which the feature in question (e.g., color or pleasantness) really belongs or is later assigned. Such assignment presumably requires active binding to object representations, however fused with these in our experience of liking or hope our affect may often seem. Cases of objectless ‘diffuse’ mood in which, rather than the binding of affect being displaced to an object that did not cause it, the affect rather remains objectless and unbound (if only for lack of a suitable cognitively accessible object), seem clear and common enough not only in unusual experiences but also in everyday dreamy life to establish object-independence at the personal level, even if the experimental evidence for misplaced affect is rejected. That positive affect is often diffuse (objectless) seems uncontroversial in the psychology of mood (Watson 2000; Thayer 1989, 1996). That pleasure is in itself objectless is sometimes supposed in theorizing in behavioral neuroscience, as well (Robinson and Berridge, 1993, pp. 261ff.). The same assumption is the basis for the psychologist and emotion specialist James Russell's notion of core affect, which places an in-itself objectless feeling good at the ground level of the construction of more complex positive emotion (Russell 2003).

We may call all views sharing the general approach on which pleasure is either a welcoming attitude (with instances individuated, in part, by their contents or objects) or a potentially freestanding welcoming stance, Welcoming Views — and only those latter, on which it is such a stance that can float free, Welcoming-Whatever Views.[30] These capture something of the connections biologists and psychologists have made with approach behavior, and past philosophers and common sense with desire, without making the connections too close by giving necessary or sufficient conditions in terms of these (§3.1 below). Such approaches leave open the possibility of nonhedonic desire, motivation, and approach behavior, which tighter analytic or theoretical connections (as have been made, for example, by some hedonists and behaviorists) may counterintuitively exclude. And positing a potentially freestanding stance, rather than an object-bound attitude, may also let pleasure be its own thing, even when divorced from content-directed thought and motivation, as especially in some moments of repose and meditation it seems to be. This would make pleasure in itself not intentional except in its potential for integration with other states, which may allow bringing in diffuse (objectless) pleasant moods (§1.1, ¶4), which attitudinal and adverbial Aristotelian views of pleasure may be unable to capture. Can the difference between pleasure's appearing good and its making other objects appear good be finessed or explained by supposing it a stance that is promiscuous and wavering in its attachment to objects because it is essentially bound to none? May pleasure thought of in this way yet turn out to be, in a way, a feeling, after all, and intrinsic enough to fit something like the simple picture or to preserve at least its experiential core?

2.3.4 Intentionality, Subjectivity, and Consciousness

There are additional reasons, beside the theoretical impulse toward a unified account, that have driven philosophers toward ascribing intentional structure to pleasure. Brentano influentially claimed that all mental phenomena exhibit intentionality and thus act/object or attitude/content structure (Jacob 2003). (The ancient roots of the philosophical concepts of mind and consciousness on which Brentano drew were cognitive.) Contemporary philosophers seeking a unified account of all phenomena covered by the inclusive modern Western notion of mind often follow Brentano in hoping to do this in intentional or representational terms. In this they may turn for support and guidance to neuroscientific accounts of the remapping of information from peripheral receptors to the brain and from one brain region to another. Thus Michael Tye, in discussing mood, appeals to Antonio Damasio's account of feelings as representing conditions of the body (Damasio 1994, 1999, 2003; Tye 1995, pp. 128-30).

Intentional structure has also been motivated by a subject/object duality that may seem metaphysically necessary or even given in subjective awareness itself. Naive hedonists often had no developed view of the relation between the subject of experience and the experience of pleasure. Perhaps on a Humean view on which the self is nothing beyond its separate experiences (Hume, Treatise i,iv,vi) or on a neoHumean view which includes the underlying biological processes and their causal powers, no separate experiencing subject exists so that one may speak indifferently of experiences or experiencings and nothing more need be said. But on any view that takes selfhood and consciousness in a less immanent and momentary way, one may puzzle just where, in the self or the pleasure or in their relationship, the experience and its value are to be found.

Pleasure has often been thought of as immediately, essentially, and even wholly conscious. However, some philosophers have distinguished pleasure from consciousness of pleasure. This may introduce a layer of intentional structure otherwise not found in pleasure itself. Seventh century India saw Nyâya and Vaisesika criticisms of the views of some self-denying Buddhists that all awareness, and therefore all pleasure, is self-disclosing, without any need for a higher-order cognitive act of an ulterior self. And G. E. Moore, following Plato, argued that we must decide whether pleasure or cognitive awareness (or, as Moore put it, “consciousness of pleasure”) is the locus of hedonic value and that this is properly located in the consciousness of pleasure rather than in bare pleasure itself.[31] Perhaps our concept of consciousness comes apart at this juncture and pleasure may be immediately or ‘phenomenally’ experienced while unnoticed and without its being generally cognitively accessible. Someone sympathetic to the simple picture who applies this distinction of Block's (Block 1995, 1997, 2002; Katz 2005b) might locate hedonic value in bare pleasure, rather than in any cognitive awareness of it. Scientists increasingly regard pleasure, like many cognitive states and processes, as separable from awareness and generally assume that all such processes have natures, whether physiological, computational, or both, that are not wholly revealed by introspection and of which biological and behavioral research may reveal more. Relevant research on the organization of affective experience and its regulation in the brain is in progress. So is research on the organization of conscious experience in the brain. Perhaps these two lines of research are ready to converge. Not only theoretical but even practical questions about the limits of rational concern for early fetuses and people (but are they no longer persons?) in persistent vegetative states may be at issue as we discover how pleasure (or, at least, features associated in our naive concept of pleasure) are organized in their brains — and discover or decide how much their pleasure (or whatever they have that shares some features with pleasure) matters.[32] More than a fish's? The same? Less? If such states are not owned by a person, are ours fundamentally unowned, too? Does their cortical representation, perhaps in the cingulate (e.g., Lane 2000, Schroeder 2004; cf. Katz 2005c) or medial prefrontal cortices, first make them conscious? Owned? Pleasant, too?

3. Pleasure, Motivation, and the Brain

Is pleasure something single-natured and unified? Or at least as a kind of similar or related kinds that can be regarded as one for some purposes, as Plato and Aristotle did? Does it constitute our lives as good to the extent that it is present — as we tend to believe when in the grip of its attractive power? And if not, does pleasure fall into several kinds, one of which — call it “true pleasure” — does? The simple picture of pleasure as valuable or at least attractive due to its own experiential nature may survive the objections considered so far, at least as theoretical possibility. It is not a groundless theoretical invention. Nor is the inclusive concept of pleasure on which it is based a mere conceptual confusion. Both are too deeply seated in ways we find it natural to speak, think, and theorize to be so easily dismissed. However, looking more closely at our experience of pleasure, its long-noted but variable connections to motivation, and at the sciences studying these raises further questions. Pleasure may come apart, on such closer analysis, into several kinds. The search for true pleasure, that is really as good as it seems, beyond taint of compulsive craving or biological illusion, now continues in the studies of the brain. These give us some reason to think that both pleasure itself and its relations to motivation are more heterogeneous than the simple picture allows.

3.1 Motivation-Based Analyses and Their Problems

Pleasure has traditionally been connected with motivation, although traditions differ on how. Plato (Charmides 167e1-3), Aristotle (Rhetoric I,11:1370a16-18; DA II,3:414b2-6 and II,9:4332b3-7; EE II,7:1223a34-35), and the common sense for which they speak are pluralist about human motivation. For all these, while one salient kind of motive involves longing for pleasure or pleasant things, people also have other ultimate goals. They compete for honors and other purely competitive goods, seek revenge, and pursue and avoid other things as well. And sometimes they do so because of evaluative judgments based in ultimately nonhedonic grounds. Hedonists argued that spontaneous pleasure-seeking is evidence of pleasure's unique status as our ultimate goal and good, as evidenced by the unenculturated and therefore uncorrupted appetites and values of infants. The ancient Stoics interpreted the phenomena so as to block this hedonist appeal to nature's authority: pleasure is rather a by-product of the achievement of other ends, starting right from the infant's innate impulses, not toward pleasure, but rather toward biological goods such as food, guided by a natural instinct directed toward its preservation, which rational motivation may later supersede (Long and Sedley, 1987, 65A3-4; Brunschwig 1986). Augustine influentially built on the Stoics in attributing pleasure to the will (CD XIV,6); later Western Christian thought mainly followed him.

Modern Western philosophers, following Aristotle's account of the unity of motivation (DA 433a30-b13) and Augustine's counting all motives as loves of the will (but often ignoring the pluralism about kinds of motive on which they and their traditions equally insisted), have often treated ‘desire’ as including all motivation and as of a single kind to be explained on the same pattern. Between 1600 and 1900 they often regarded desire as uniformly directed toward one's own pleasure, along lines suggested by the simple picture. Joseph Butler (1726) responded to this view of human nature as hedonistically selfish by renewing the Stoic insistence on the priority of motivation to pleasure and also the related medieval view that pleasure always consists in the satisfaction of appetites. He thus could argue that pleasure-seeking without prior motivation would be pointless — and, further, that enlightened hedonic self-interest is compatible with cultivating and acting on altruistic motives, since pleasure anyway always consists in the satisfaction of some motive (in his language, ‘passion’) and strategies that lead to altruistic motives having a large place in one's life are at least as likely to lead to a high level of fulfilled desire, and thus a pleasant life, as others.

There are, however, prima facie counterexamples to taking desire satisfaction to be a necessary condition for pleasure, as Plato long ago pointed out (Philebus 51A-52C): we often enjoy things such as sights, sounds, and fragrances that may surprise us without our wanting them before, clinging to them when they are with us, or craving them after they are gone. But Butler presumably followed Plato and his medieval successors in implicitly understanding unconscious internally represented needs as of a kind with desires. Timothy Schroeder does similarly today (2001, 2004), but in an account on which pleasure does not require the actual existence of desires or their satisfaction, but is rather a defeasible sensing of an increase in their net satisfaction.

However, we often don't enjoy things that we continue to desire, at least for a time. And distinguishing sensing getting what one wants from getting it doesn't obviously help with this problem. So it appears that it won't do to make either desire or its satisfaction or the sensing of increases in that satisfaction sufficient for pleasure, let alone identical to it, as various philosophers have variously proposed (e.g.; Davis 1981, 1982; Schroeder 2001, 2004), not even desire for the continuation of one's present experiences (Madell 2002, pp. 97-98). Madell's thinking there is that, while desires that will yield no pleasure at the time of their fulfillment fail to provide ultimate reasons for action, this will not be so with desires that are simultaneously satisfied. He proposes pleasure is affective desire for the continuation of experience one already has and is thus simultaneous with its own (at least partial) satisfaction; it is thus immune from intervening change of desire and therefore always ultimately-reason giving (and, presumably, valuable).

One cannot help suspecting that the attraction of desire satisfaction views of pleasure owes something to unconscious equivocation between someone's feeling satisfied (as one might, but need not be, when one's desire is) and one's desire being satisfied (i.e., fulfilled) merely by its satisfaction conditions coming to pass, as it might be long after one is dead and gone. (This latter is analogous to the way logicians speak of satisfaction, without any felt contentment or happiness of the linguistic objects considered being in question.) One may view someone's success in a way that makes mere project fulfillment count toward it, but it is hard to see why anything like that, or representing the likes of it (Schroeder 2001, 2004), should figure directly in an account of someone's pleasure. Some of Madell's desires for continuation of one's present experiences are affected by what is essentially the same point, although his restriction to simultaneously satisfied desires (to rule out desire change before satisfaction) avoids one salient kind of counterexample (Brandt 1982). To adapt the example of Plato's Socrates that scandalized his Gorgias (Gorgias 494A-495A) to apply to Madell, one may intensely and affectively desire to continue one's experience of scratching one's itch or rubbing oneself, which desire is simultaneously fulfilled, without oneself experiencing pleasure in so doing. Fulfilling compulsive or addictive cravings in their time need not be pleasant, as Madell's view seems to imply. Appropriately limiting the kind of desires, to avoid all such counterexamples, would likely require building a relation to pleasure into the desires, thus giving up the explanatory project of characterizing pleasure in terms of desire. Consonantly with the foregoing, decades of social psychological research using self-ratings of happiness (e.g., Strack, Argyle, and Schwarz 1991) indicates a hedonic component (or two, one for positive and one for negative affect) underlying such self-reports that tracks how good people feel but that is independent of the component tracking their beliefs about their achievement of desired or valued goals. People care about both, but for different reasons.

Problems also face analyzing pleasure in motivational terms other than “desire” more closely tied to behavior. Henry Sidgwick rejected simple relational accounts of pleasure as “a feeling we seek to bring into consciousness and retain there” or the “motive power” toward this as incapable of giving the correct ‘quantitative’, or (at least) ordinally comparative, answers demanded of any serious definition. He thought that, while “pleasures of repose, a warm bath, etc.” might be handled by moving to an account in terms of motivational dispositions, excitement often adds motivation disproportionate to pleasure — an objection that applies to very similar behavioral and motivational accounts current today.[33]

3.2 Connecting Pleasure and Desire

On the other hand, if there is no close connection between pleasure and motivation, why pleasure should be more likely to become an object of pursuit rather than of avoidance or indifference seems mysterious. Natural selection may explain why animals that already pursue pleasure and avoid pain should come to enjoy foods that are nutritious and to feel pain when they begin to be injured. But it's not clear how it could explain why animals pursue pleasure and avoid pain rather than the other way around. Philosophers are well acquainted with the problem of evil in a world created by an all-knowing, all-powerful and all-good God or in any similarly good-directed teleological order. It's hard to explain why there should be any evil in such a world. But on a completely nonteleological view of nature it seems as hard to see why animals especially pursue their own or any good (cf. Plato, Phaedo 97B8-99C6). Both problems depend on our having an independent grasp of the relevant normative notions. If evil were just whatever God won't will, and an animal's good or pleasure were just whatever it tends toward or has been naturally selected to pursue, the puzzles would dissolve.

This Problem of Good was, in the past century, raised specifically against views akin to the simple picture of pleasure, on which pleasure is valuable by virtue of its intrinsic nature, perhaps just because of the way it feels in its moment, and independently of our or other animals' actually desiring or pursuing it. It was argued that such a picture of pleasure leaves our pursuit of pleasure an apparently miraculous conicidence crying out for explanation. This was urged not in favor of theology or teleology, but rather in arguing that pleasure must be connected to animal impulse or desire by its very nature.[34] Some hedonists are inclined to answer that we and other animals' simply respond to pleasure's value by rationally apprehending, and accordingly pursuing, it (Goldstein 1980, 1989, 2002). While ancients and medievals inhabiting a teleological worldview (on which attraction toward the good required no further explanation) could answer thus, to that extent, it seems, they faced no Problem of Good, which arises to the extent one abandons unexplained teleology. It may help to see this puzzle as a human counterpart of Socrates' question to Euthyphro, about which comes logically first, the righteousness of pious acts or Divine love of them (Plato, Euthyphro, 6E11-11B1). Which comes logically first, hedonic value or desire? Perhaps science, by revealing the constitution of pleasure or of hedonic motivation and their mutual relations, will tell us which of these answers to give to this human Euthyphro question or else will suggest some third way out.

On Schroeder's (2004) approach pleasure is a sensing of an increase in one's intrinsic desires' net satisfaction, or fulfillment. Schroeder originally put forward this view in his 2001 on other grounds, but in his 2004 supports it by way of somewhat speculative claims about pleasure's localization in the brain (in the perigenual anterior cingulate cortex) and its thus being functionally downstream from the midbrain dopamine projection to the forebrain. Like desire satisfaction (i.e., fulfillment) views of pleasure, this makes desire prior to pleasure, with pleasure merely registering the output of a desire-controlled reward system over which it has no direct control. What we want, presumably, determines the only good we can have, and pleasure represents the achievement of this. Since it is part of Schroeder's theory that the relevant intrinsic ‘desires’ are all of them unconscious, and often aim at the objectives of evolved biological mechanisms within us rather than at those we more subjectively own (Katz 2005c), clearly applicable armchair counterexamples to the view, such as used against Madell (§3.1), may not be forthcoming. Perhaps an intentionalist account of the constitution of pleasure's experienced value (to which Schroeder is sympathetic but in his 2004 uncommitted) along such lines will solve or dissolve the Problem of Good.

An opposed similarly speculative picture of pleasure's relations to desire, likewise suggested by philosophers' reading of scientific literature concerning midbrain dopamine systems and their functions, had been advanced by Leonard Katz and Carolyn Morillo, in proposing hedonistic accounts of motivation and value more in the spirit of the simple picture. Their hedonistic approach, like Schlick's, allowed that pleasure typically directs desire not toward itself but rather toward other things (Schlick 1930/1939, pp. 36-55; Katz 1982 and 1986, Chs. III and V, especially pp. 75-83; Morillo 1990, 1992, 1995). But, in contrast to Schroeder, they placed pleasure prior to motivation, making motivation the contingent result of pleasure's causal connections and consequences. On such views, pleasure is ontologically independent of desire and need not be intrinsically representational (although it may be, perhaps in a minimal, reflexive way). On Katz's version, desire contains pleasure as a proper part. For both, the pleasure might exist alone and, then, contingently involve fully representational desire. Pleasure might, thus, be an affective stance, state, or process that, although not itself more than minimally or potentially intentional, may come to participate in fully intentional direction upon an object by being integrated with more cognitively sophisticated representational processes, as on the stance view of §2.3.3 above.[35] Such a functional architecture also coheres better with rationalist and realist construals of hedonic value, such as Goldstein's.

Appraising such speculative models or pictures would, in the current state of the science, be very premature. Their truth or fruitfulness, like that of other conjectures linking pleasure and moral psychology to accounts of brain function, remains to be seen. What is pleasure and what are its relations to desire and motivation? Can understanding its situation in the brain's neural mechanisms help solve or dissolve the Problem of Good? If so, in a way that comports best with realist, constructivist, or some more revisionary kind of value theory? Will a nondebunking understanding of the normative force of hedonic judgments and of the rationality of hedonic motivation be sustained or undermined by future affective neuroscience? Answers are premature but relevant scientific research can be indicated.

The dopaminergic systems that, in part, suggested these philosophers' differing views originate in the midbrain and are thought to selectively gate cortical inputs onto medium spiny neurons in the striatum, thus causing focusing on specific objects and options. Dopamine neurons are probably incapable of themselves representing propositions or objects, but capable of concentrating attention and motivation on salient cortically represented targets. On a simplified model, more specifically informed systems signal to the midbrain dopamine neurons the presence of novelty, uncertainty, or learned predictors of pleasure and also unpredicted pleasure.[36] The dopamine signal then engages attention and motivation by telling the striatum to attend and respond mainly to whatever signals came just before. This signal also selectively strengthens, in the longer term, synaptic connections whose signals predicted reward, which appropriately changes expectations going forward.[37] The striatum may ‘know’ more than the midbrain dopamine neurons that project to it, but still perhaps only that it should go for whatever it is that other systems are representing. Only the more specifically representational neocortical systems and the person may represent just what that is, if it is explicitly represented at all. While the specific bearing of dopaminergic activity on pleasure has become increasingly controversial, it or the activity of neural networks including or closely connected with it may still wholly or partly embody a stance of Welcoming Whatever (§2.3.3) — even if pleasure, or true pleasure, turns out to be something else (§3.3 below), in which case its contingent and variable connection with Welcoming-based motivation may seem not the miraculous preestablished harmony mocked by those who posed The Problem of Good, but only what a plausibly minimal functional or causal role for pleasure might lead one to expect.

Pleasure's being based in, or closely connnected with, some such nonspecific systems could explain its promiscuity, which sets its instances apart from particular beliefs and other attitudes inseparable from their contents. These presumably involve brain areas and connections storing and linking specific information, while mesolimbic dopamine and other neuromodulator systems supply nonspecific gain or error signals selectively strengthening, binding, and consolidating very recently activated representations in circuits competing with others to control attention, motivation, and action. If pleasure is some activity of this sort, its intentionality may be derived from that of more cognitive systems it is integrated with in its activity, rather than intrinsic to it. Feeling ourselves drawn toward things, options, or projects may be in part what pleasure, or this kind of pleasure, feels like, as Bennett Helm, for example, suggests is the case more completely (§1.2 above).

3.3 Dividing Pleasure

We are now beginning to understand how pleasure is organized in the brain (Panksepp 1998; Rolls 1999; Davidson, Jackson and Kalin 2000; Berridge 2003, Berridge and Robinson 2003). But these are very early days yet, so results should be taken only as illustrative of the space of live possibilities rather than as indicative of what pleasure is. And rather than there being any single local or distributed neural system for pleasure, there may well be a plurality of positive affective systems of mind and brain that do the job of engaging us in different activities in different ways. We should be careful not to overreify or overlocalize the possibilities. Differences between more global modes of brain functioning, perhaps ones that activity of more discrete neural systems of special interest cause or enter into, may better fit the intuitive difference between pleasure and pain. We should also be attentive to the possibility of finding confirmation for distinctions that have seemed important to thinkers in the past and to the possibility that pleasure fractures along such lines. Corresponding to the negative emotions, there may also be more than one positive emotion (Panksepp 1998; Fredrickson 1998; Haidt 2003; Hejmadi, Davidson, and Rozin 2000). We must be willing to discover that the diverse phenomena our subject studies have less in common than we have been led by the common concept and the simple picture of pleasure to suppose.

Plato had his Socrates argue that the dependence of some pleasures on the simultaneous presence of painful appetites, needs, or drives shows that pleasure and pain are not related as contraries or dimensional opposites each of which simply excludes the other to the extent that it is present, but more complexly and interdependently — so that pleasure cannot simply constitute our lives as good so far as we have it while pain similarly makes them bad.[38] In Plato and later Greek thinkers, as also among those of ancient India, discussion often turns on pleasure's role as a cause or object of desire and on the search for a true pleasure that involves no desire or need and hence none of the suffering, tension, or stress connected with these. Similar questions arise in interpreting the neuroscience of affect, motivation, and addiction today.

In Utilitarianism John Stuart Mill relevantly distinguishes between excitement and tranquillity as two sources of contentment, the first allowing us to tolerate pain and the second the absence of pleasure (1971, Ch. II, ¶13).[39] He thus draws on a distinction prominent in Hellenistic traditions, such as those of Epicurean and Stoic thought,[40] which (unlike Mill) advised against the more activated and desire-driven forms of pleasure and took the happiest life to be one of calm and tranquillity, which their opponents often saw as merely painless but lacking most of what makes life worth living. Such advice had antecedents in Plato's hostility to pleasure connected with strong desires and in Aristotle's ranking the calm pleasure of reviewing already possessed knowledge over those of attaining and producing new knowledge, of competitive achievement, and of satisfying worldly desires, to which he and his society were no strangers and which modernizing market-oriented societies, as they lose traditional consensus on other standards of human excellence, self-cultivation, and success in life, increasingly emphasize above all else.[41]

Indic traditions are rich not only in recommendations of nonattachment as a path to tranquillity but also in their long history of analysis of conscious states associated with traditional meditation practices designed to produce calm concentration. There is often disagreement or ambivalence as to whether the calmest and most aspired-to states should be classified as pleasant or as neutral. The Pali Canon of the Theravadin Buddhists, in multiple passages that have parallels in other Buddhist traditions, describes progressively deeper stages of meditative concentration (jhana), passing through which one loses first the abilities to initiate and sustain thought, then also joyful interest (pîti), and finally even the feeling of (perhaps nonintentional) pleasure, bliss, or ease (sukha, in a narrow sense) on which that depends, so that one then abides in a state of equanimous, all-accepting upekkha (etymologically, ‘looking on’), sometimes traditionally described as without pleasure (sukha) or pain (dukkha) but occasionally as true pleasure. (Similar ambivalence or silence often exists about enlightened states.) The difference between joyful interest and (mere) pleasure (traditionally classified as a feeling rather than with the predominantly intentional states such as joyful interest) is explained in the commentarial tradition by the contrast between the state of a hot and weary desert traveler when first hearing of, and then seeing, a pool of water in a shady wood and the state of one actually enjoying, or resting after, using it.[42] The latter is said to be preferred by the meditator as less coarse, presumably because it is a purer and more restful pleasure in that it is less mixed with eager interest and motivation, which seem tainted with stress, strain, or pain. Similar distinctions, between appetitive states that prepare animals for anticipatory, preparatory, or instrumental action and functionally later consummatory states that end these and initiate consummatory behaviors and end in repose, have been used for at least the past century in the scientific studies of behavior and mind (Sherrington 1906/1947, pp. 329 ff.; W. Craig 1918; Davidson 1994).

In contemporary affective neuroscience, similar interpretative questions arise. Here also we find a condition of activated interest and motivation that many have been tempted to identify with pleasure. Activation of the brain's mesolimbic dopamine system, which came up in §3.2, apparently organizes many especially of the instrumental pursuits that bring our lives not only ulterior rewards but also meaning and thus a way out of some forms of mental pain. However it seems also involved in most of our addictions and for the craving desire unrelieved by euphoria typical at times of withdrawn cocaine addicts. And about 14 percent of the dopamine neurons in the relevant midbrain area sometimes fire in response to aversive stimuli, such as tail pinch, rather than only in response to ones we seek out and enjoy, so that the system seems to some to respond to both pleasure and pain (e.g., Berridge and Winkielman 2003). Others (e.g., Eliot Gardner) have thought that there are two distinct subpopulations of midbrain dopamine neurons, one involved in pleasure-related appetitive responding and the other in pain-related aversive responding, rather than a single functional system responding to signals of both kinds (although more strongly to appetitive than to aversive signals). However, dopamine cells seem to respond to aversive stimuli only when these are represented as avoidable (Cabib and Puglisi-Allegra, 2004). If so, it seems possible to characterize mesolimbic dopamine function parsimoniously in a unitary way, as a response to behavioral opportunity or challenge (abstracting from whether the opportunity is to gain something pleasant or good or to avoid or escape something painful or bad). Such generality (in not distinguishing between pursuing good and avoiding bad) would fit a line of thinking present sporadically in the utilitarian tradition and culminating in the twentieth century behaviorist notion of positive reinforcement. Dopamine cell activity may be involved in reinforcement learning (Olds and Milner 1954) without thus constituting ‘pleasure centers’ (e.g., Olds 1965). The distinction between pleasure and pain may be made elsewhere in the brain.

The apparent paradoxes facing a general pleasure interpretation of such dopaminergic activity have led many scientists studying these systems, including former advocates, to back off from that interpretation (e.g., Wise 1994). Perhaps most tellingly, these dopamine neurons seem insensitive to drive states, whereas, for example, our enjoyment of a food often depends on our not being already satiated on it. On the other hand, self-stimulation in the lateral hypothalamus and the orbitofrontal cortex is appropriately sensitive to hunger and satiety (Rolls 1999, pp. 33-35, 153-56). (Nevertheless, feeding when hungry seems to be dependent on dopaminergic activity [Nader, Bechara and van der Kooy 1997]). Another reason to doubt that mesolimbic dopamine release in the ventral striatum is in itself sufficient for pleasure (as many have thought) is that indiscriminate release of dopamine at inappropriate times, letting things grab attention at random, seems to lead to amphetamine psychosis and schizophrenia. The people in these conditions, cognitively overwhelmed by their attention being attracted at random, are notoriously not happy. However, dopamine-blocking antipsychotic drugs may lower interest generally and thus make such patients unhappy, too (Kapur 2003, Wise 1982). And an insufficiency of dopamine neurotransmission at D2 receptors seems implicated in depression, and its pharmacological correction as possibly a common path of action for antidepressant drugs, especially by the ongoing research of Paul Willner (e.g., 2002).

Perhaps pleasure, or some kind of pleasure, is the typical but not invariable very short-term consequence of dopaminergic activity, but only so long as the dopamine system is functioning within its normal dynamic range (cf. Voruganti et al. 2001) and there are not pathological changes downstream, as may be the case in some anxiety disorders and in some kinds of schizophrenia and depression. It is widely thought that some activity downstream from the dopamine neurons might more plausibly be identified with pleasure or with some kind of pleasure. The philosopher Timothy Schroeder (as was mentioned in §3.2) has one candidate in the anterior cingulate cortex; the psychiatrist/psychologist Richard D. Lane (2002) has a different view of how pleasure is organized there. However, the functions of this heterogeneous region, while clearly relevant, are not yet well understood; finer functional divisions into subareas are still emerging. And rather than pleasure being some very spatiotemporally localized activity, it may require extended activity in recurrent neural circuits (as all conscious brain activity does, on some views: e.g.; Lamme and Roelfsema 2000, Lamme 2003), perhaps involving pathways using dopamine but also others, perhaps even in large or far-flung areas of the brain.

The theoretically and conceptually sophisticated affective neuroscientist Kent Berridge, who suggests similar possibilities, has for years proposed that mesolimbic dopamine itself gives no true pleasure but only ‘sham reward’ (Robinson and Berridge 1993, p. 281; Berridge 1996; Berridge and Robinson 1998) that makes more salient stimuli that are thus made more likely to capture control of current behavior and also reinforces their ability to do the same in the future, without any invariable hedonic connection. And this, indeed, may be all it does for addicts who continue to crave and seek drugs stimulating this system even after these have ceased to yield euphoria (Berridge 1999; Robinson and Berridge 2000, 2001). For Robinson and Berridge, the neural core of true pleasure, or ‘liking’, is to be found not in dopaminergic ‘wanting’ but rather in the comfort or bliss mediated by other brain systems, such as some involving μ-opioid receptors.[43] These seem to be involved in the consummatory, satisfying, and relaxing phase of meals, sexual activity, and personal relations as well, and, conjecturally, of all our hedonic activities, even as the mesolimbic dopamine system seems prominent in the earlier and more exploratory, appetitive, instrumental, and approach phases of these (Depue and Morrone-Strupinksy 2005, especially §6.1.2, pp. 323-25). Perhaps the two are markers for fundamentally different affective and motivational states that should be separately designated by more scientific successors to our naive, natural, and undiscriminating common conception of pleasure. However, even if so, both kinds of neural system, and the states and behaviors they organize, are normally causally intermeshed and functionally integrated.

While it is tempting to regard opioid bliss as the undriven, pure pleasure that contemplatives and philosophers have long been seeking, even if so we may still, in practice, as Mill suggested (1871, Ch. II, ¶13)), need to alternate between the pleasures of pursuit and those of relaxation, as the views of others also imply (e.g., Tibor Scitovsky, see n. 41). Such a need for the pleasure (if it is that) of active engagement is, perhaps, confirmed by a line of research investigating the greater left-sided (than right-sided) prefrontal cortical activity found in positive affect (Davidson 1994, 2000, 2001; Davidson and Irwin 1999; Davidson, Jackson, and Kalin 2000). Because of the type of surface measurements mainly used, the precise brain areas concerned have remained uncertain. But there seems to be some overlap with Raichle's task-oriented system that turns down the default activity of the brain, discussed at the end of §1.3. Pleasure and approach seem to mutually facilitate each other, as do affective pain and withdrawal (Neumann, Förster, and Strack 2003). And Davidson has suggested that the prefrontal asymmetries he has done most to study concern a kind of pleasure that precedes the attainment of goals and relates to approach behavior (1994, 2000a, pp. 91-92). Dopamine, which is often involved in approach, seems to have something to do with Davidson's asymmetry (Cf. C. Berridge, España, and Stalnaker 2003). Such pre-goal-attainment pleasure may always involve, at least potentially, attention, action-readiness, and motivation, whereas post-goal-attainment pleasure (related to other, sometimes opioid, systems) may not. Beyond whatever it may indicate about current state, Davidson's left-greater-than-right prefrontal activity correlates especially with greater positive engagement in life activities as an enduring trait. This seems to lead to self-reported happiness of a kind, as does the well-established personality trait of extraversion, which Depue and Collins (1999) have linked to dopamine. The resulting self-ascribed happiness, however, seems to be a matter of judged satisfactoriness of (predominantly) other things in one's life rather than especially of how one feels, although the two are correlated (Urry et al. 2004). Minimally, things tend to go hedonically better for people who are actively engaged with people, activities, and projects rather than withdrawn or unmotivated. This may explain why dopamine deficits tend to make people not just motivationally depressed but also hedonically worse off, even if the positive affect dopamine most directly gives is not true pleasure. The relevant dopaminergic and μ-opioid systems seem so connected in the brain that sometimes in the short run and usually in the long run both are activated if either is, although in different activities, in different temporal phases of activities, and in different stages of life to differing degrees. Such connections may explain why the greatest left cerebral hemisphere activity asymmetry observed so far by Davidson's group (e.g., Davidson 2002, in results that are so far anedecdotal, but with further studies on the way) is in Buddhist monks specializing in mental exercises for the inculcation of compassion, which one would think of as more related to a μ-opioid-based affiliation trait (Depue and Morrone-Strupinsky 2004) than to one for dopaminergic, social-dominance-related agency (Depue and Collins 1999).

4. Conclusion: Looking Forward

There is currently an exponential growth of relevant scientific literature and of attempts to integrate the results of research using a wide range of methods and sources. (See, e.g.: Kahneman, Diener and Schwarz (eds.), Well-Being: The Foundations of Hedonic Psychology, 1999; Davidson, Scherer and Goldsmith (eds.), Handbook of Affective Sciences 2003.) Social psychologists collect subjects' self-reports of their experience (Argyle 2000, Ch. 2; Strack, Argyle and Schwarz 1991) and seek to infer from data on emotion words the dimensional structure of affect (Argyle 2000, Ch. 3; Diener 1999). Research into temperament and affective disorders (Davidson, Pizzagalli, and Nitschke 2002; Bruder 2003), their genetic risk factors, differential effects on the immune system, and pharmacological treatments also provides cumulatively increasing reason for thinking pleasure and pain have a deeply biological, and not a merely cultural or cognitive, reality. Research on the behavior and brains of animals continues at an acclerating pace. New methods in brain imaging bring information from intact human subjects, whereas earlier human neurological evidence was mainly from patients with brain damage. And genetically-engineered dopamine-deficient and μ-opioid receptor knockout mice expand further the experimental possibilities of dissociating the neurally intertwined contributions of dopamine and opioid systems. Other neural systems will likely prove highly relevant, too, perhaps diminishing the relative importance of the two kinds emphasized above. Some, for example, think a serotonergic system has some direct role in pleasure (Nettle 2005, Ch. 5, pp. 115-40, accessibly reviews some evidence; cf. Depue and Morrone-Strupinsky 2005, p. 326), but others plausibly regard serotonergic systems only as modulating both positive and negative affect, constraining them within functionally appropriate limits (see Depue and Collins 1999), rather than as more directly involved in either.

It is also posssible that affective neuroscience, properly interpreted, will find neither one nor two nor even three versatile neural pleasure systems in the brain, but rather discrete positive affects organized by relatively distinct neural systems serving different biologically-given functions and goals, such as the play of the young with their friends and the parental concern which figured in the short Afghan list of §2.1.[44] The recent near consensus that there is only one basic positive affect is vanishing (see n. 10 above). How we and our hedonic experience are situated or constituted in the brain remains to be seen.

Within this century we shall likely have a fairly complete biological account of the organization of affective phenomena in the brain, if only in the value-free and consciousness-uninformative style of post-Galilean science. We shall, however, also want to know what to make of this ‘construction’ of affect in more intimate terms: Is it a coming to reflective consciousness of subpersonal experience and value that were already there? The constitution of beings with a unified and real hedonic good? The fabrication of illusions of these? All of the above, but at different levels? And if some mixture, how are truth from confabulation, true pleasure from sham reward, hedonically intelligible desire from blind compulsive craving to be discerned? We should like first of all to be sure that these questions and distinctions make real sense, but we may not, however, be able to know this until we are close to answering them. And for this we will require both more science and also real skill in its interpretation.

In our attempts to answer all these questions we can try to capture what seems most promising in earlier views while keeping in mind that pleasure is something biological, psychological, and experiential which remains in large part unknown, the nature or category of which it is inappropriate to stipulate a priori. Perhaps pleasure expresses the successful unimpeded and Perfected Functioning of our capacity-fulfilling natural activities (Aristotle), is our Natural anxiety-free and pain-free State (Epicurus, plausibly; see n. 40 for other takes), is a Welcoming Whatever in which we are open to experience and ready to find and do good because we already feel good in ourselves and are therefore ready to reach outward from our affective core to engage with diverse and often more representational brain processes — and through these, with love, to all the world (Empedocles, updated with help from those cited in n. 31). But perhaps pleasure has a more complex reflexive intentional structure, as suggested in some of the medieval literature mentioned in §2.3.1 and n. 25  ad loc. Elements at least of these suggestions are compatible. And perhaps pleasure is an Improvement Indicator (Plato, Millgram 2000) or Good State Indicator (Millgram 1997, Damasio 2003, pp. 137, 314n1) in its proper function. Or perhaps both, because pleasure is an indicator that responds to either (as may be Ibn Sina's [Avicenna's] view [Knuuttila 2004, pp. 223-24]) or else because pleasure divides in two, as suggested in the preceding section, with one kind responding to each. In that latter case, dopaminergic reward might be seen as both indicating and organizing further pursuit of actual or potential need satisfaction while opioid bliss both responds to and favors consummatory activity, as when dopaminergic exploration and instrumental pursuit have prepared the stage for this and no more of these are needed. At a higher, less discriminating level of analysis pleasure may be functionally characterized simply as Awareness of Perfected Functioning, while still being Welcoming in its phenomenology. But such simple phrases, even if they give some insight, do not give complete theories of pleasure. And we should also not forget more humble biological facts: that mood varies with energy and thus with circadian rhythms affecting body temperature and also with the current availability of nutrients in the blood (Thayer 1989, 1996); that how much pleasure we experience also often depends on having had enough, and good enough, sleep; and that pleasure increases immune response (Rosenkranz et al. 2003). These are telling about its nature, which may, perhaps, turn out to be that of a syndrome of typically causally connected features rather than a more simple or unified psychobiological phenomenon, such as would better fit philosophers' penchant for simple kinds and simple explanations. Still, the central questions about hedonic value, motivation, and their connections, however complicated and multiplied by distinctions revealed or confirmed by science, would presumably remain.

The prospects seem good for new and deep understanding of pleasure and of on what manner of brain activity, from reverberating activity in large-scale circuits to more local specific chemical processes within neurons, it most specifically and immediately depends. We may have much to gain from the practical results of this new understanding — especially if, as Voznesensky says,

The main thing in living is human feeling: Are you happy? just fine? or sad?[45]

But pleasure should also be of special interest even to philosophers of mind not especially interested in value or affect, in part for the strong challenge that apparently contentless moods pose to representational accounts of mind. Deeply subjective or phenomenal aspects of our experience, that may more easily be ignored elsewhere in the philosophy of mind, seem to stare us in the face here, where what is at issue centrally seems no informational content or broad functional role but simply “whether you're happy or sad”. However, appearances of bare intrinsic fact and simple pictures taken for firm foundations have often proved misleading in the studies of mind. As the sciences of mind and brain mature, they will offer new evidence about pleasure and its roles in our and kindred minds and about whether and how these roles may pull apart, perhaps along the line between dopaminergic and opioid systems, making pleasure more than one natural kind. Real answers to major questions about the unity, diversity, and nature of pleasure and its relations to pain, motivation, awareness, and value must likely await further results of this new science and their scientifically informed and philosophically sensitive interpretation.


This will gradually be supplemented by linked lists of suggested readings divided by subject.

Canonical Religious Texts, by Tradition

References, by Author

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Aristotle, General Topics: ethics | consciousness: and intentionality | consciousness: representational theories of | emotion | hedonism


I am grateful to Ned Block, David Chalmers, and Daniel Stoljar for their suggestions during revision and to Arindam Chakrabarti and Arthur Stephen McGrade for the help acknowledged in notes 25 and 31, respectively.