Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue Apr 20, 2004

Motivational hedonism is the claim that only pleasure or pain motivates us. It is the most significant form of psychological hedonism. Normative hedonism is the claim that all and only pleasure has worth or value, and all and only pain has disvalue. Jeremy Bentham endorsed both sorts of hedonism in the ringing passage that opens his An Introduction to the Principles of Morals and Legislation: “Nature has placed mankind under the governance of two sovereign masters, pain, and pleasure. It is for them alone to point out what we ought to do, as well as to determine what we shall do” (Bentham 1789). Other major contributors to debate about hedonism include Plato, Aristotle, Mill, Moore, Sidgwick, Ross, and Broad. The discussion below nevertheless proceeds analytically rather than historically, discussing each main form of hedonism in turn.

Pleasure will here be understood broadly, to include all pleasant feeling or experience, such as elation, ecstacy, delight, joy, and enjoyment. Pain will be taken to include all unpleasant feeling or experience: aches, throbs, irritations, anxiety, anguish, chagrin, discomfort, despair, grief, depression, guilt and remorse. Ordinary language must be stretched to accommodate these broad usages. Pleasure and pain themselves might be states, states of affairs, things, events or properties. Below, ‘pleasurableness’ and ‘painfulness’ will be used when talk of properties is intended; and ‘pleasure’ and ‘pain’ will do duty for all the other options. The intention is to avoid commitment as to which category pleasure and pain fit into. Further economy will often be secured by making ‘pleasure’ do duty for ‘pleasure or pleasurableness’.

1. Motivational Hedonism.

Bentham's claim that pain and pleasure determine what we shall do makes him a hedonist about the determination of action. The more modest view that pleasure and pain determine our motivation to act will instead be the focus below. It can accommodate cases in which hedonistic motivation fails to generate hedonistic action, and cases in which, though it does generate such action, that action itself fails in hedonist terms. Indeed, the ‘paradox of hedonism’ is, roughly, the claim that those motivated in favour of pleasure get less of it, and those motivated against pain get more of it (see Sidgwick 1907, 48f).

Motivational hedonism will here be construed as the egoistic claim that one is motivated by one's own pleasure or pain, and as including the claim that one is motivated for pleasure and against pain. Being motivated ‘for’ pleasure and ‘against’ pain will be construed in ‘productivist’ terms, as a matter of producing pleasure or reducing pain, rather than, for example, expressing these things. The further idea will also be built in that one is always and only motivated by the greatest balance of pleasure over pain for oneself; that is by maximization of the net amount or value of pleasure minus pain for oneself.

Various objections might be made to motivational hedonism: that we are often motivated by things that do not in fact maximize our pleasure, such as motivation to step under a shower that one takes to be suitably warm but which is in fact scalding hot; that not every pleasure that our options for action make available to us motivates us; or that the very idea of maximum ‘pleasure over pain’ or ‘pleasure minus pain’ or ‘net pleasure’ assumes a common measure which cannot be had. Motivational hedonists can reply that one is always and only motivated by what one takes to maximize one's pleasure over pain. There is no implication that one always gets this right, or that any option one takes to be hedonistically non-maximizing motivates one, or even that the idea of maximizing the balance of pleasure over pain itself makes ultimate sense.

Now consider this argument for motivational hedonism. We sometimes are motivated to maximize our balance of pleasure over pain, every case can be explained in these terms, and the more unified the explanation the better; hence motivational hedonism is true. One response to this argument is that motivational hedonism lacks other explanatory virtues. Aspects of this issue are revisited below.

Another argument for motivational hedonism runs as follows. We are motivated to maximize what we regard as value for ourselves, and we believe maximal value consists in maximal balance of pleasure over pain; therefore, we are motivated by what we regard as maximal balance of pleasure over pain for ourselves. This argument claims that our motivation is egoistic and our value commitments are hedonistic. Both claims are questionable, but these issues will not be pursued further here.

Motivational hedonism is a thesis about ‘us’. Who counts as one of us? The obvious answer is ‘all and only human beings’; a rival answer is ‘all entities whatever’. Many entities are incapable of motives, but this second form of motivational hedonism implies merely that if an entity is motivated by anything, it is by pleasure or pain. It also implies that all entities that have motives — perhaps including humans, parrots, sharks, and alpha centaurians — are also capable of pleasure or pain. However, according to some views in the philosophy of biology and psychology, differences of biological form or evolutionary history make many species incapable of such humanistic mental states. To sidestep issues of this sort, it will here be assumed that motivational hedonism is a thesis about all and only human beings.

Any confirmed case of an individual being motivated by something other than pleasure or pain would refute motivational hedonism. Here are some standard candidates: the soldier with no belief in the afterlife who opts for a painful death for himself to save his comrades, the parent motivated to give her or his child a good start in life, the walker motivated to kick a stone just ‘for the hell of it’. The standard response to such cases is to conjecture a suitably hedonistic rival motivational story. Despite himself, the soldier was really motivated by the underlying belief that it would secure him a joyful afterlife, or at least a half-second's sweet pleasure of heroic self-sacrifice. The parent was really motivated only by his own pleasurable intention to give the child a good start in life. And so on. If one already accepts motivational hedonism, one might be convinced by such re-interpretations. They show that hedonist rival conjectures can generally be made, even when humans seem clearly to be motivated by other and more diverse things, but they do not show that the hedonist re-interpretations are the more plausible ones.

Hedonists have a further problem. Their re-writes grant, in effect, that saving the comrades, or giving the child a good start in life, does motivate. But they insist that all such motivation is ultimately only for the sake of that individual's own pleasure or pain. Motivational hedonists might mean to claim here that ‘favors pleasure or disfavors pain’ in part defines ‘motive’. That would make their central claim a definitional truth, but only a trivial and uninteresting one. Further, if this stipulation about ‘motive’ is made, then critics of motivational hedonism need only restate their central point in different terminology; for example, that we are often moved to act by matters other than pleasure or pain. But perhaps hedonists are instead making the empirical conjecture that motivation by pleasure and pain underlies and generates all apparently non-hedonistic motives, such as to become competent with more recipes, make one's spouse happy, preserve the New Zealand tuatara, and so forth. The difficulty motivational hedonists must then confront is to make literal sense of this talk of ‘underlying’, such that it would be possible to tell what sort of psychological evidence would be needed to confirm or refute their claim.

The above reflections raise a wider issue about motivational hedonism. Is it a contingent claim, about an aspect of our psychology that could have been otherwise? Or does it posit a law of our psychological nature, or a necessary truth about all metaphysically, conceptually, or logically possible worlds? These questions also bear on the sort of evidence and argument we need if we are to appraise motivational hedonism. If it is a claim about the common-sense pleasure concept, for example, then it is problematical to stipulate, as was done above, that ‘pleasure’ includes all positive experience. If it is instead a contingent psychological thesis, philosophical work would still be needed, to weed out incoherent ideas, to help work out clear and well-directed questions for empirical inquiry to answer, to separate out different motivational hedonist theses, and so forth, but we would reasonably expect to use the methods and evidence of empirical psychology and social inquiry to do the main work of appraising it.

2. Normative hedonism

Normative hedonism is the claim that only pleasure has value and only pain has disvalue non-instrumentally, that is, independently of the value of anything they might cause or prevent. On this view, our friendships, actions, and achievements, our states of understanding, insight and character, have only instrumental worth, through the pleasure they cause or the pain they diminish. Things can of course have both instrumental and non-instrumental value. Where they do so, their overall value is a function of both. The two can pull in opposite directions. The pain of being once bitten has non-instrumental disvalue, for example, but it might also have instrumental value, through the further pain you avoid by its making you twice shy.

Normative hedonism can take the non-egoistic form that was used to state it above; or instead the egoistic form that all and only one's own pleasure has value for oneself. Many other variants are also possible. For example, it can be specified as a claim about morality, well-being, rationality or aesthetics; as a claim regarding our beliefs, actions or feelings; or as a thesis about what is of value, what reasons we have, what we ought to do or be, what is good, or what is right. The discussion below aims for generality across these different forms of normative hedonism. For simplicity of expression, its points are made in ‘value’ terminology.

There are two rival normative hedonist accounts of the level or amount of pleasure's value. The quantitative approach, deriving especially from the work of Bentham (1789), claims that amount of value varies just with pleasure's quantitative features; its duration, and perhaps its intensity or strength. Responding espescially to the charge that the Benthamite approach amounted to a ‘pig philosophy’, J.S. Mill developed the rival ‘qualitative’ approach, according to which there is ‘higher’ and ‘lower’ pleasure (Mill 1863), and the amount of its value varies also with pleasure's quality. The standard objection to this is that pleasure's quality reduces either to its quantity, or to an anti-hedonist value claim. This supposes, questionably, that pleasure's quality cannot be amongst its intrinsic features. Also of importance to debate between these two forms of hedonism is whether there is enough in common within and between the kinds of pleasure and pain to support coherent claims about the net or balance amount or value of pleasure over pain. The simpler quantitative theory is perhaps better placed to deal with this issue, though even on Bentham's account, there are at least six ‘dimensions of value in a pleasure or a pain’: intensity, duration, certainty or uncertainty, propinquity or remoteness, fecundity, and purity (Bentham 1789, ch. 4).

Consider this argument: one is always and only motivated by one's own pleasure, all and only that which motivates one has value for one, therefore all and only one's own pleasure has value for one. This argument for normative hedonism appeals to a form of motivational hedonism, and to a motivation theory of value. Both are questionable. Motivational hedonism is also most plausibly stated in terms of what one takes to be pleasure, whereas it is more plausible that value is a matter of actual pleasure or of what one would reasonably take to be actual pleasure.

Most other forms of argument for normative hedonism are broadly reductionist, aiming to explain or justify in hedonist terms the appearance of non-hedonist value. One such thought is that because honesty, autonomy, achievement, friendship, and so forth generally produce pleasure, we tend mistakenly to think they have value of their own. This relies on the ungenerous claim that critics of normative hedonism already have a confused commitment to it. Another thought is that anti-hedonist value beliefs actually maximize net pleasure, and this enables us to justify them without having to think them true. But this does not give uncommitted parties any reason to favor the hedonist justification over the anti-hedonist one. A further reductionist thought is that pleasure clearly has value, nothing else clearly does, and in theory of value as elsewhere we should prefer more over less unified accounts. Again, however, unification is perhaps not the only virtue for normative theories.

One argument against normative hedonism proceeds as follows. If pleasure is valuable, so is expression or memory of it, and reflection on it. But such thought of pleasure is not necessarily itself pleasurable; and even where it is pleasurable, its value is not just a matter of this. Therefore, normative hedonism is false. Friends of normative hedonism will respond that thought of pleasure is valuable only insofar as it is pleasurable.

There are several kinds of standard objection to normative hedonism. The ‘none such’ objection (Sidgwick 1907, 127; and perhaps Aristotle 1175a22f) is that there is no unified sort of state, event, or property present in all instances of pleasure, and hence normative hedonism either fails even to state a determinate thesis, or attributes value only to something that does not exist, therefore implying that nothing has value. The ‘not all’ objection claims that pleasure has value only under certain conditions; perhaps when its subject has an intrinsic pro-attitude toward it, when it is a characteristic feature of human nature, or when it does not arise from and is not directed at a bad deed or character state or state of affairs. On this last form of the objection, see, for example, Moore (1903, 209-10) and Smart (1973, 25-26). The ‘not only’ objection claims that much else has value; perhaps creating a beautiful new fabric or giving a child a good start in life, being brave or generous, relating to others as a trustworthy friend or a constructive critic, or achieving any of these things in an autonomous way. This objection has taken many forms, from Plato's argument in his Philebus about the value of life as a ‘satisfied oyster’, through the charge that hedonism is a philosophy fit only for swine, to Robert Nozick's ‘experience machine’ argument (Nozick 1974, 42-5).

Normative hedonism claims that all and only pleasure has value. To appraise this, it helps to know more about pleasure. The discussion below works through the main accounts, and in light of each, revisits the standard objections. One preliminary question is whether accounts of pleasure and pain are rival analyses of the meaning of the pleasure and pain concepts, or rival accounts of relevant scientific findings. They will here be treated as neither, but instead as rival normative accounts, whose point is to pick out valuable features of our psychology. Such accounts should stipulate usage of terms to facilitate the normative inquiry, without departing confusingly far from common usage. Our knowledge of potentially valuable aspects of our psychology comes mainly through reflection on our everyday experience, informed by scientific inquiry and literature that might identify things we have not noticed or have misunderstood.

2.1 The experience account

According to the experience account, pleasure is a distinctive conscious experience or element in such experience, and likewise pain. It is best not to assume it is a sensation, because this runs into difficulties, such as Ryle's argument (Ryle 1954) that any sensation must have a ‘felt location’ and pleasure has none such. Nor should the idea be built in that pleasure lacks intentionality, ‘aboutness’, or directness at an object, because this runs into the objection that intentionality is the mark of the mental. Two variants of the experience account are considered below.

The intrinsic experience account claims there is something distinctive in pleasure's intrinsic character; in its feeling, raw feel, phenomenology, quale, or hedonic tone, or in ‘what it is like’ to have such experience (see Moore 1903, 12-13; Broad 1930; Sumner 1996, 87-91). Presence of this ‘something’ distinguishes pleasure from all else, and amount of it gives us quantity of pleasure. This ‘something’ might or not be further specifiable, beyond its being simply pleasurable or painful. There is a natural fit between this sort of account and quantitative forms of hedonism.

In the context of the experience account, the ‘none such’ objection claims pleasure is so diverse that there is no experientially distinctive element common to all instances of, for example, new romantic love, slaking a powerful thirst, sexual orgasm, solving a hard intellectual problem, and fireside reminiscence amongst friends. It misses the point to reply that, in addition to such a single shared experiential element, pleasure also includes one or more experientially diverse elements. A more radical ‘none such’ objection derives from the eliminativist claim that there are no such things as conscious states, and thus no such pleasure and pain (eg., Dennett 1988; and for criticism, Flanagan 1992).

If normative hedonism has the intrinsic experience account built into it, then its claim is that there is value in all and only instances of a certain distinctive conscious experience or element within conscious experience. The Sidgwick-style ‘none such’ objection poses serious difficulties for this view, though perhaps least acutely for the claim that pleasurableness is a feature of experience that cannot be further specified. The ‘not all’ objection also has force, but perhaps not against all variants of this sort of normative hedonism. For example, the pleasures of sadistic activity lack moral value, but they do perhaps add to the sadist's well-being. The ‘not only’ objection is also a serious difficulty for any normative hedonism that includes an experience account. See the more detailed discussion of this below.

The extrinsic experience account claims that something is an instance of pleasure just in case it is a feeling or conscious experience or element in such, and its subject has a relevant pro-attitude toward it (see, for example, Brandt 1979; Sumner 1996, 90; Feldman 2001). This shares with the ‘intrinsic’ account the idea that pleasure is a conscious experience or element in such experience; but claims that the condition for such experience to be pleasure is the extrinsic matter of its being the object of a relevant pro-attitude. Which pro-attitude? The possibilities include a relevant: belief, supposition, apprehension, conjecture, desire, liking, delight, endorsement, enjoyment, want, or preference. One might, for example, regard: “Pleasure … as a feeling which … is at least implicitly apprehended as desirable…” (Sidgwick 1907, 127).

The extrinsic account has some clear advantages over the intrinsic experience account. It does not claim that there is any experiential element intrinsic to all instances of pleasure. It can consequently accommodate pleasure's experiential diversity. It can also distinguish pleasure from other sorts of conscious experience, on extrinsic grounds of the distinctive attitude its subject has toward it. The Sidgwickian ‘none such’ objection consequently has no force against it. But these gains come at a considerable price, explored below.

Consider the ‘killjoy’ objection. In the present setting, this claims that we can take pro-attitudes to conscious states of ours that are no fun, delight, or joy; and it attributes to the extrinsic experience account the implausible claim that all such joyless states are instances of pleasure. In Jane Austen's Pride and Prejudice, for example, Mr Bennett approves of the shame he feels for having indulged his daughter Lydia. The extrinsic experience account implies that his shame is an instance of pleasure. In so doing, it omits pleasure's pleasurableness (Sprigge 1988, ch.V); it kills pleasure's joy. Proponents of the extrinsic experience account might respond that pleasure is a positive feeling or conscious experience towards which its subject has a pro-attitude, and that Mr Bennett's shame is not an instance of pleasure because it is not a positive feeling. But what might the ‘positive’ character of such a feeling amount to? Is it a distinctive experiential feel? That would invoke again the intrinsic experience account. The extrinsic experience account is thus confronted with a dilemma: either imply a killjoy account of pleasure, or revert to the intrinsic experience account.

The extrinsic experience account can characterize quantity of pleasure in terms of the strength of the subject's pro-attitude toward her or his own experience, or in terms of the quantity of the experience itself. The first approach wisely aligns pleasure's measure of quantity with its point of distinction from other conscious states, but thereby seems also to mis-locate pleasure's quantity, as a feature of the attitude its subject takes toward it, rather than as one of its intrinsic features. The second approach accounts for pleasure's quantity on a different basis from pleasure's distinctiveness, and that too is hard to justify. In sum, the extrinsic experience account has trouble characterising pleasure's quantity.

If normative hedonism has the extrinsic experience account built in, then its claim is that there is value in all and only conscious experience toward which its subject has a relevant pro-attitude. One common form of this view is often called ‘preference hedonism’. This term is used below.

Return now to the standard objections. The ‘none such’ objection lacks force against preference hedonism, but the killjoy objection is troubling, and so is the problem of characterising pleasure's quantity. According to the ‘not all’ objection, some conscious experience is not pleasurable, and its being the object of a pro-attitude is not enough to make it either pleasurable or valuable. Indeed, we sometimes have intrinsic pro-attitudes toward our unpleasant experience, as Mr Bennett did toward his feeling of shame.

Turn now to the ‘not only’ objection. Note first the cases treated as central by the intrinsic experience account, of conscious experience that has a pleasurable feel or tone, that might ot might not be approved by its subject. Normative hedonism that includes an extrinsic experience account cannot recognize value in such experience. Secondly, many of us have pro-attitudes toward aspects of ourselves other than our conscious states, including certain features of our bodies, our doings, and our relationships with others; and toward features of the wider world, perhaps including future peace in Palestine, contact with intelligent beings from other planets, or the maintenance of the Maori language. This being so, preference hedonists need to justify their claim that one's own conscious experience is the only valuable object of such attitudes. Might some further feature of the subject's conscious experience make its being that object a necessary condition for value? If its ‘positive’ experiential character is invoked, this again takes back us to the intrinsic experience account. There is a further problem with some specifications of the pro-attitude condition on value. Sidgwick's account, for example, excludes the valuable experience of many non-human animals, because they cannot apprehend their experience as valuable.

2.2 The attitude account

The attitude account claims that pleasure is an intentional state, such as a certain sort of belief or desire, directed at a feature of oneself or the wider world (eg., Millgram 2001; Feldman 2001). It identifies pleasure with this pro-attitude, not with its experiential object, as in the extrinsic experience account.

The attitude account can distinguish pleasure from other intentional states, by saying it is a pro-attitude, an attitude in favor of this or that. It can consequently allow that instances of pleasure might be diverse in other respects. Pro-attitudes do obviously exist, so the ‘none such’ objection lacks force here. Quantity of pleasure can also be accounted for, in terms of the number, strength and duration of one's pro-attitudes. For example, one prefers this thing to that, or judges it more desirable. But the killjoy objection presents a difficult challenge to the attitude account. Some of our pro-attitudes are no fun, delight, or joy to have. Mr Bennett's approval of his feeling of shame, for example, was no pleasure of his. Any account that identifies pleasure with such a pro-attitude seems to leave out pleasure's pleasurableness.

Proponents of the attitude account might try various responses to the killjoy objection. One reply is that pleasure is an experientially positive pro-attitude. But this seems again to invoke the intrinsic experience account. Another reply is that one's pro-attitude counts as an instance of one's pleasure only if directed at one's own positive experience. This still leaves out pleasurableness, even as it requires pleasure to be directed at something pleasurable. In addition, it cannot account for the pleasure one takes in the world beyond oneself. A third reply is to say that one's pleasure is the whole comprising both one's experience of skiing or eating green curry or having sex, and one's pro-attitude toward that experience. This ‘two item’ account is distinct from the idea that pleasure is an experience that meets a pro-attitude condition, and from the idea that it is a pro-attitude that meets an experience condition. But this attitude-to-experience account still falls to the killjoy objection. Some of our conscious states, and some of our pro-attitudes, are no fun or delight or joy to have. It is hard to see how merely directing one joyless entity at another might constitute a joyful whole. And again, the pleasures we take in the wider world seem also to remain unaccounted for.

If normative hedonism has the attitude account built into it, then its claim is that all and only the relevant pro-attitudes have value. This form of hedonism can readily answer the ‘none such’ objection, but as is argued above, the price is serious vulnerability to the killjoy objection.

Not all one's pro-attitudes are valuable. Some are self-destructive or vindictive. Others are misguided, perhaps even favoring things that do not exist. Attributing value to all one's pro-attitudes is like attributing value to all one's feelings of conviction, even if some of those convictions are false (Millgram 2001). This makes the attitude account an awkward partner for normative hedonism. One might appeal to the ‘externalist’ thought that some things are pleasure-worthy and others are not, and a pro-attitude is an instance of pleasure, or is valuable, only if directed at something pleasure-worthy (Feldman 2001). The sound of Rostropovich at his cello is pleasure-worthy, for example, but the suffering of the innocent is not. This move either revises normative hedonism to acknowledge that not all pleasure is valuable, or revises the attitude account so only apt pro-attitudes count as instances of pleasure. It thereby makes either pleasure's pleasurableness or its level of value depend on an extrinsic or external property. It also raises a troubling question that threatens to undermine this sort of hedonism: might certain things be pleasure-worthy only because they are value-worthy (i.e., valuable)?

It seems that not only pro-attitudes have value. Certain of our doings, relationships, and character traits, together with the autonomous character of some of these, are equally promising candidates for value status. Each of these is more, or other, than a pro-attitude. The same seems to be true of some conscious states, other than just pleasurable or painful ones. It might be argued, for example, that there are undirected forms of elation or bliss that are valuable, and undirected forms of depression or anxiety that have disvalue, but which are neither attitudes nor intentional states of any other sort. Proponents of the attitude account must respond either that such cases have in themselves neither value nor disvalue, or that they are all intentional states after all, but directed rather non-specifically, perhaps at the world in general.

3. Concluding Remarks

Both motivational hedonism and normative hedonism remain worthy of serious philosophical attention. These two these also have wider significance, especially within the utilitarian and egoist traditions of ethical thought.


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consciousness: and intentionality | consequentialism | consequentialism: rule | egoism | intentionality | pleasure | qualia | value: intrinsic vs. extrinsic