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The Principle of Beneficence in Applied Ethics

First published Wed Jan 2, 2008

Beneficent actions and motives occupy a central place in morality. Common examples are found in social welfare schemes, scholarships for needy and meritorious students, communal support of health-related research, policies to improve the welfare of animals, philanthropy, disaster relief, programs to benefit children and the incompetent, and preferential hiring and admission policies. What makes these diverse acts beneficent? Are beneficent acts obligatory or rather the pursuit of moral ideals? Such questions have generated a substantial literature on beneficence in both theoretical ethics and applied ethics. In theoretical ethics, the dominant issue in recent years has been how to place limits on the scope of beneficence. In applied ethics, a number of issues have been treated in the fields of biomedical ethics and business ethics.

1. The Concepts of Beneficence and Benevolence

The term beneficence connotes acts of mercy, kindness, and charity, and is suggestive of altruism, love, humanity, and promoting the good of others. In ordinary language, the notion is broad; but it is understood still more broadly in ethical theory, to include effectively all forms of action intended to benefit or promote the good of other persons. The language of a principle or rule of beneficence refers to a normative statement of a moral obligation to act for the benefit of others, helping them to further their important and legitimate interests, often by preventing or removing possible harms. Many dimensions of applied ethics appear to incorporate appeals to beneficence in this sense, even if only implicitly. For example, when apparel manufacturers are criticized for not having good labor practices in factories, the ultimate goal is to obtain better working conditions, wages, and benefits for workers.

Whereas beneficence refers to an action done to benefit others, benevolence refers to the morally valuable character trait—or virtue—of being disposed to act for the benefit of others. Traditionally, acts of beneficence are done from obligation, but they may also be performed from nonobligatory, optional moral ideals, which are standards that belong to a morality of meritorious aspiration in which individuals or institutions adopt goals that do not hold for everyone. Exceptional beneficence is usually categorized as supererogatory, a term meaning paying or performing beyond what is owed or, more generally, doing more than is required. The term usually refers to moral ideals of action, but it has links to virtues and to Aristotelian ideas of moral excellence. Such actions need not rise to the level of the moral saint or moral hero. Not all supererogatory acts of beneficence are exceptionally arduous, costly, or risky. Examples of less demanding forms include generous gift-giving, uncompensated public service, forgiving another's costly error, and complying with requests made by other persons for a benefit when these exceed the obligatory requirements of ordinary morality or professional morality.

Saintly and heroic beneficence and benevolence are at the extreme end of a continuum of beneficent conduct and commitment. This continuum is not merely a continuum mapping the territory beyond duty. It is a continuum of beneficence and benevolence itself, starting with duty. The continuum runs from strict obligation (grounded in the core norms of beneficence in ordinary morality) through weaker obligations (the outer periphery of ordinary expectations of persons, such as great conscientiousness in attending to a friend's welfare) and on to the domain of the morally nonrequired and exceptionally virtuous. The nonrequired starts with lower‑level acts of supererogation such as helping a stranger find a desired location; here an absence of beneficence constitutes a defect in the moral life, even if not a failure of obligation. The continuum ends with high-level acts of supererogation such as heroic acts of self-sacrifice to benefit others. Beneficence and benevolence are therefore best understood as spread throughout the moral life across this continuum. However, there is considerable controversy about where obligation ends and supererogation begins.

A celebrated example of beneficence that rests somewhere on this continuum, though it is hard to locate just where, is the New Testament parable of the Good Samaritan. In this parable, robbers have beaten and left half-dead a man traveling from Jerusalem to Jericho. A Samaritan tends to his wounds and cares for him at an inn. The Samaritan's actions are clearly beneficent and the motives benevolent. However, they do not seem—on the information given—to rise to the level of heroic or saintly conduct. The morally exceptional, beneficent person, then, may be laudable and emulable, yet neither a moral saint nor a moral hero.

2. The Historical Place of Beneficence in Ethical Theory

The history of ethical theory suggests that there are many ways to think about beneficence and benevolence. Several landmark ethical theories have embraced these moral notions as central categories, but in very different ways. Prime examples are found in the moral-sentiment theory of David Hume, where benevolence is the central “principle” (of human nature) in his moral psychology, and in utilitarian theories, which are normative accounts in which the principle of utility is itself a strong and demanding principle of beneficence. Beneficence in these writers is close to the essence of morality. Other writers, including Kant, have given less dominance to beneficence, but still strongly endorse it.

2.1 Hume's Theory

Hume's moral psychology and virtue ethics make motives of benevolence all important in the moral life. He argues that natural benevolence accounts, in great part, for what he calls “the origin of morality.” A major theme is his defense of benevolence as a principle in human nature, in opposition to theories of psychological egoism. Much of Hume's moral theory is directed against Mandeville's (and perhaps Hobbes's) theory that the motive underlying human action is private interest and that humans are naturally neither sociable nor benevolent. Hume argues that egoism rests on a faulty moral psychology and maintains that benevolence is an “original” feature of human nature. Benevolence is Hume's most important moral principle of human nature, but he also uses the term “benevolence” to designate a class of virtues rooted in goodwill, generosity, and love directed at others. Hume finds benevolence in many manifestations: friendship, charity, compassion, etc. Although he speaks of both benevolence and justice as social virtues, only benevolence is a principle of human nature (rules of justice being not principles of human nature, but rather normative human conventions).

In his inquiries into the principle of self-love, Hume does not reject all aspects of the egoists' claims about the absence of benevolence in human motivation. He acknowledges many motives in human nature and uses metaphors of the dove, wolf, and serpent to illustrate the mixture of elements in our nature. Principally, he sees human nature in the domain of moral conduct as a mixture of benevolence and self-love. Whereas the egoist views human nature as limited to motives such as fear and ambition, Hume regards persons as motivated by a variety of passions, both generous and ungenerous. He maintains that these elements vary by degree from person to person. Lacking distinctive information about a particular individual, we cannot know whether in that person benevolence typically dominates and controls self-love, or the converse.

2.2 Utilitarian Theory

In Utilitarianism, John Stuart Mill argues that moral philosophers have left a train of unconvincing and incompatible theories that can be coherently unified by a single standard of beneficence that allows us to decide objectively what is right and wrong. The principle of utility, or the “greatest happiness” principle, he declares the basic foundation of morals: Actions are right in proportion to their promotion of happiness, and wrong as they produce the reverse. This is a straightforward, and potentially very demanding, principle of beneficence: That action or practice is right (when compared with any alternative action or practice) if it leads to the greatest possible balance of beneficial consequences or to the least possible balance of bad consequences. Mill also holds that the concepts of duty, obligation, and right are subordinated to, and determined by, that which maximizes benefits and minimizes harmful outcomes. The principle of utility is presented by Mill as an absolute or preeminent principle—thus making beneficence the one and only supreme principle of ethics. It justifies all subordinate rules and is not simply one among a number of prima facie principles.

2.3 Kant's Theory

Kant notoriously rejects the utilitarian understanding of a supreme principle of beneficence, but he still finds a vital place in the moral life for beneficence. He seeks universally valid principles of duty, and beneficence is one such principle. A motive of benevolence based on sentiment—so admired by Hume—is morally unworthy in Kant's theory unless the motive of benevolent action is a motive of duty. Kant argues that everyone has a duty to be beneficent, i.e. to be helpful to others according to one's means, and without hoping for any form of personal gain thereby. Benevolence done from friendly inclination he regards as “unlimited” (a term subject to different interpretations, but meaning “having no boundaries in potential scope”), whereas beneficence from duty does not place unlimited demands on persons. This does not mean that the limits of duties of beneficence are clear and precise. While we are obligated to some extent to sacrifice some part of our welfare to benefit others without any expectation of recompense, it is nonetheless impossible to fix a definite limit on how far this duty extends. We can only say that every single person has a duty to be beneficent, according to that person's means and that no one has an unlimited duty to do so.

Kant here anticipates, without developing, what would later become one of the most difficult areas of the theory of beneficence: How, exactly, are we to express the limits of beneficence as an obligation?

3. Is Beneficence Obligatory or Merely a Moral Ideal?

Deep disagreements have emerged in moral theory regarding how much is demanded by obligations of beneficence. Some ethical theories insist not only that there are obligations of beneficence, but that these obligations demand severe sacrifice and extreme generosity in the moral life. Some formulations of utilitarianism, for example, appear to derive obligations to give our job to a person who needs it more, to give away most of our income, to devote much of our time to civic enterprises, etc. It is likely that no society has ever operated on such a demanding principle, but it does seem embraced, at least abstractly, by a number of moral philosophers—arguably even on Kant's theory of the categorical imperative (although, as already mentioned, Kant also seems to deny such scope to obligatory beneficence).

Skepticism about Obligatory Beneficence. Some moral philosophers have claimed that we have no obligations of beneficence at all—only obligations deriving from specific roles and assignments of duty that are not a part of ordinary morality. These philosophers hold that beneficent action is virtuous and a commendable moral ideal, but not an obligation, and thus that persons are not morally deficient if they fail to act beneficently. An instructive example is found in the moral theory of Bernard Gert, who maintains that there are no moral rules of beneficence, only moral ideals. In this theory, the only obligations in the moral life, apart from duties encountered in professional roles and other specific stations of duty, are captured by moral rules that prohibit causing harm or evil. In Gert's theory, the general goal of morality is to minimize evil or harm, not to promote good. Rational persons can act impartially at all times in regard to all persons with the aim of not causing evil, he argues, but rational persons cannot impartially promote the good for all persons at all times.

Those who defend such a beneficence-negating conclusion do not hold the extreme view that there are no obligations of beneficence in contexts of role-assigned obligations, such as those in professional ethics and in specific communities. They acknowledge that professional and other roles carry obligations that do not bind persons who do not occupy the relevant roles; but they insist that the actions obliged within the roles are moral ideals outside of the roles. That is, these philosophers see beneficence not as a general obligation, but as wholly role-specific.

In rejecting principles of obligatory beneficence, Gert himself draws the line at obligations of nonmaleficence. That is, he embraces rules that prohibit causing harm to other persons, even though he rejects all principles or rules that require helping other persons, which includes acting to prevent harm. Thus, he accepts moral rules such as “Don't kill,” “Don't cause pain or suffering to others,” “Don't incapacitate others,” “Don't deprive others of the goods of life,” and the like.

However, the mainstream of moral philosophy has been to make not-harming and helping both to be obligations, while preserving the distinction between the two. This literature can be confusing, because some writers treat obligations of nonmaleficence as a species of obligations of beneficence. This conflation is unfortunate, since the two notions are very different. Rules of beneficence are typically more demanding than rules of nonmaleficence, and rules of nonmaleficence are negative prohibitions of action that must be followed impartially and that provide moral reasons for legal prohibitions of certain forms of conduct. By contrast, rules of beneficence state positive requirements of action, need not always be followed impartially, and rarely, if ever, provide reasons for legal punishment when agents fail to abide by the rules.

The contrast between nonmaleficence and beneficence notwithstanding, there are some rules of beneficence that we are obligated to follow impartially, such as those requiring efforts to rescue strangers under conditions of minimal risk. Even some legal punishments for failure to rescue strangers may be justifiable. Significant controversies have arisen in both law and moral philosophy about how to formulate and defend such requirements.

4. The Problem of Over-Demanding Beneficence

Some philosophers defend an extremely demanding and far-reaching principle of obligatory beneficence. Peter Singer's theory has been the most widely discussed such theory in recent decades. In his early work, Singer distinguished between preventing evil and promoting good and contended that persons in affluent nations are morally obligated to prevent something bad or evil from happening if it is in their power to do so without having to sacrifice anything of comparable moral importance. In the face of preventable disease and poverty, for example, we ought to donate time and resources toward their eradication until we reach a level at which, by giving more, we would cause as much suffering to ourselves as we would relieve through our gift. While Singer leaves it an open question what counts as of moral importance, his argument implies that morality sometimes requires us to make large sacrifices to rescue needy persons around the world.

This claim implies that morality sometimes requires us to make enormous sacrifices. It would appear that the demand is placed not only on individuals with disposable incomes, but on all reasonably well-off persons, foundations, governments, corporations, etc. For all of these parties, there is a duty to refrain from spending resources on nonessential items, and to provide the available resources or savings to lend assistance to those in urgent need. Frills, fashion, luxuries, and the like are never to determine expenditures, and one is to give to the needy up to the point that one (or one's dependent) would be impoverished. Singer did not regard such conduct as a significant moral sacrifice, only the discharge of an obligation of beneficence.

Singer's proposals have struck many as far too demanding, as impracticable, and as a significant departure from the demands of ordinary morality. This assessment generated a number of criticisms, as well as defenses, demanding principles of beneficence such as the one proposed by Singer. Critics continue today to argue that a principle of beneficence that requires persons, governments, and corporations to seriously disrupt their projects and plans in order to benefit the poor and underprivileged exceed the limits of ordinary moral obligations and have no plausible grounding in moral theory. They argue that the line between the obligatory and the supererogatory has been erased by such a principle; in effect, the claim is that an aspirational moral ideal has replaced real moral obligation.

Singer attempted to reformulate his position so that his theory of beneficence does not set an overly demanding standard. He proposed that there is no clear justification for the claim that obligations of ordinary morality do not contain a highly demanding principle of beneficence, most notably a harm prevention principle. He apparently would explain the lack of concern often shown for poverty relief as a failure to draw the correct implications from the very principles of beneficence that ordinary morality embraces. Later in his career Singer has attempted to take account of objections that his principle sets an unduly high a standard. He has not given up his strong principle of beneficence, but he has suggested that it might be morally wise and most productive to publicly advocate a lower standard—that is, a weakened principle of beneficence. He therefore proposed a more guarded formulation of the principle, arguing that we should strive for a round percentage of income, around 10 per cent, which means more than a token donation and yet also not so high as to make us miserable or into moral saints. This standard, Singer proclaimed, is the minimum that we ought to do to conform to obligations of beneficence.

Controversy continues today about how to cast the commitments of a principle of beneficence, including how to formulate limits that reduce required costs and impacts on the agent's life plans and that make meeting one's obligations of beneficence a realistic possibility. Various writers have noted that even after persons have donated generous portions of their income, they could still donate more; and, according to any strong principle of beneficence, they should donate more. There seem to be no theoretical or practical limits of donation and sacrifice. However, it does not follow that we should give up a principle of beneficence. It only follows that moral limits of the demands of beneficence is a very difficult moral problem.

Liam Murphy has proposed to fix the limits of individual beneficence to meet global problems of need by a cooperative principle of fairness in which, in any given circumstance, it is first to be determined what each reasonably affluent person must do to contribute a fair share to an optimal outcome. In this conception, an individual is only required to aid others beneficently at the level that would produce the best consequences if all in society were to give their fair share. One is not required to do more if others fail in their obligations of beneficence. Unlike act-consequentialism, this theory does not demand more of agents whenever expected compliance by others decreases.

Murphy's cooperative principle is intuitively attractive, but it is not clear whether it is a principle with the necessary moral punch to address issues such as global poverty. Murphy seems right to suggest that large-scale problems requiring beneficence should be conceived as cooperative projects. But his limit on individual obligations seems unlikely to increase international aid much beyond present levels. Moreover, if, as seems likely in virtually all situations of global poverty, others will not comply with their obligations of beneficence, it is not clear why each person's obligation is set only by the original calculation of a single fair share.

In his 2007 Uehiro Lectures on Global Poverty, Singer defended his lines of argument about beneficence including the public advocacy thesis (see the Other Internet Resources). However, a difference of emphasis is present, together with a sympathetic response to Murphy. Singer is concerned with which social conditions will motivate people to give, rather than with attempting to determine obligations of beneficence with precision. Singer responds to critics such as Murphy by conceding that perhaps the limit of what we should publicly advocate as a level of giving is indeed no more than a person's fair share of what is needed to relieve poverty and the like. Unless we draw the line here, we might not be able to motivate people to give at all. A fair share would be a considerably lower threshold of one's obligations than the obligation Singer originally envisaged, but far more realistic. The emphasis on motivation to give is a more subtle and convincing approach to the nature and limits of beneficence.

Wherever the line of precise limits of obligatory beneficence is drawn, the line is likely to be revisionary, in the sense that it will draw a sharper boundary on our obligations than exists in ordinary morality. Singer's proposals, unlike Murphy's, have generally been taken as representing a revision of ordinary morality's requirements of beneficence, despite the faint presence in the history of Western morality of religious obligations of tithing. A variety of proposals of limits of beneficence have been made by philosophers, but no agreement even on a general principle exists, thus prompting many to doubt that it is possible for ethical theory or practical deliberation to set precise, determinate conditions of beneficence.

5. Liberty-Limiting Beneficence: The Problem of Benefit Paternalism

A much-discussed issue about beneficence descends historically from Mill's On Liberty, a work in which Mill inquired into the nature and limits of justifiable social control over the individual. A central line of argument in this book is that the measure of a person's liberty—or autonomy—is the measure of the person's independence from influences that control the person's preferences and behavior. As Mill was aware, various principles assumed to be moral principles have been advanced in order to justify the limitation of individual human liberties. Joel Feinberg, who was philosophically close to Mill's views, has called them “liberty-limiting principles.” Mill defended the view that only one principle validly limits liberty. Feinberg called it the harm principle: A person's liberty (or autonomy) is justifiably restricted to prevent harm to others caused by that person. Mill and Feinberg agreed that the principle of paternalism, which renders acceptable certain attempts to benefit another person when the other does not prefer to receive the benefit, is not a defensible moral principle.

The term paternalism has its roots in the notion of paternal administration—government as by a father to administer in the way a beneficent father raises his children. The analogy with the father presupposes two features of the paternal role: that the father acts beneficently (that is, in accordance with the interests of his children) and that he makes all or at least some of the decisions relating to his children's welfare, rather than letting them make those decisions. On this model, “paternalism” may be defined as the intentional overriding of one person's known preferences or actions by another person, where the person who overrides justifies the action by the goal of benefiting or avoiding harm to the person whose preferences or actions are overridden. An act of paternalism, in short, overrides the value of autonomous choice on grounds of beneficence. (Both “benefiting” and “avoiding harm” should here be understood as forms of beneficence.)

Philosophers divide sharply over whether some restricted form of paternalism can be justified and, if so, on what basis. One plausible beneficence-based justification of paternalistic actions straightforwardly places benefit on a scale with autonomy interests and balances the two: As a person's interests in autonomy increase and the benefits for that person decrease, the justification of paternalistic action becomes less cogent; conversely, as the benefits for a person increase and that person's interests in autonomy decrease, the justification of paternalistic action becomes more plausible. Thus, preventing minor harms or providing minor benefits while deeply disrespecting autonomy lacks plausible justification; but actions that prevent major harms or provide major benefits while only trivially disrespecting autonomy have a highly plausible paternalistic rationale.

Though there is no consensus over the matter of justification, virtually no one thinks that benefit paternalism can be justified unless at least the following conditions are satisfied:

The interpretation and limits of each condition will need careful analysis to make this position attractive.

6. Beneficence in Biomedical Ethics

Since approximately 1975, beneficence has been a mainstay of the literature of biomedical ethics. Persons engaged in medical practice, research, and public health appreciate that risks of harm presented by interventions must often be weighed against possible benefits for patients, subjects, and the public. The physician who pledges to “do no harm” is not professing never to cause harm, but rather to strive to create a positive balance of goods over inflicted harms. It is now widely appreciated that beneficence in biomedical ethics cannot be reduced to obligations of nonmaleficence, but there is a much less clear vision of the distinction between obligations of social justice and obligations of social beneficence.

6.1 The Ends of Medicine

Beneficence has played a major role in a central conceptual issue about the nature and goals of medicine as a social practice. If the end of medicine is healing, a goal of beneficence, then arguably medicine is fundamentally and exclusively a beneficent undertaking. If so, beneficence grounds and determines the professional obligations and virtues of the physician. Authors such as Edmund Pellegrino write as if beneficence is the sole foundational principle of medical ethics. In this theory, medical beneficence is oriented exclusively to the end of healing and not to any other form of benefit. The category of medical benefits cannot for him include items such as providing fertility controls (unless for the prevention and maintenance of health and bodily integrity), performing purely cosmetic surgery, or actively helping a patient to effect a merciful death by the active hastening of death.

This characterization of the ends of medicine allows Pellegrino to limit severely what counts as a medical benefit for patients: Benefit in medicine is limited to healing and related activities such as caring for and preventing injury or disease. This thesis is controversial: Even if healing and the like are interpreted broadly, medicine does not seem this limited to many writers. If beneficence is a general moral principle, and if physicians are positioned to supply many forms of benefit, then there is no manifest reason why physicians' hands are tied to the single benefit of healing. The range of benefits that might be considered relevant is potentially much broader than healing. It could include prescribing pharmaceutical products or devices that prevent fertility (where there is no healing-related purpose), providing purely cosmetic surgery, helping patients write realistic living wills, complying with terminally ill patients' requests for physician-assisted suicide, and the like. If these are bona fide medical benefits, how far does the range of benefits extend? If a physician runs a company that manufactures wheel chairs for the elderly, is this activity one of supplying a medical benefit? When a physician consults with an insurance company about cost-effective treatments, is this the practice of medicine?

Controversy over the ends of medicine requires decisions about what is to count as the practice of medicine and what counts as medical beneficence. Controversy appears not only in the literature of biomedical ethics, but also in some recent split decisions of the U. S. Supreme Court—most notably in Gonzales v. Oregon, a case dealing with physician-hastened death. The majority decision in this case asserts that there is no consensus among health care professionals about the precise boundaries of the legitimate practice of medicine (a legal notion similar to the medical-ethics notion of proper ends of medicine). The court notes that there is significant disagreement in the community of physicians regarding the appropriate process for determining the boundaries of medical practice and that there is disagreement about the extent to which the government should be involved in drawing boundaries when physicians themselves disagree. This court opinion allows that, depending on state law, a physician legitimately may assist in various ways in helping to bring about the death of a terminally ill patient who has explicitly and competently requested this assistance from the physician.

6.2 What Constitutes a Harm and a Benefit in Health Care?

A related issue starts with the fact that a health professional's understanding of both harm to and benefit for a patient can differ sharply from that of the patient. Alternatively, the health professional's understanding of a benefit can depend on the patient's view of what constitutes a benefit or a worthwhile risk. Different patients take different views about what constitutes a harm and a benefit, and it is implausible to maintain that the notions of benefit and harm are objectively independent of the patient's judgment.

Physician-hastened death by request of the patienttoday often characterized as physician-assisted suicide—is again a prominent example of this problem. Physicians and nurses have long worried that patients who forgo life-sustaining treatment with the intention of dying are killing themselves and that health professionals are assisting in their suicide. These worries have recently receded in significance in biomedical ethics, because there is now a consensus in law and biomedical ethics that it is never a moral violation to withhold or withdraw a treatment that has been validly refused; indeed, it is a moral violation not to withhold or withdraw a validly refused treatment. If death is hastened in this way by a physician's omission or action, there can be no moral objection to what has been done, and a physician's cooperation can rightly be viewed as merciful and benevolent.

However, this problem has been replaced by another: Is it harmful or beneficial to help a competent patient who has requested a hastened death? In addition to vexed questions about the purported distinction between killing and letting die, the issue presses the question of what counts as a benefit and what counts as a harm. Is requested death in the face of miserable suffering a benefit for some patients while a harm for other patients? When is it a benefit, and when a harm? Is the answer to this question determined by the method used to bring about death (e.g., withdrawal of treatment by contrast to use of lethal medication)?

6.3 Social Beneficence and Public Policy

A number of controversial issues in biomedical ethics concern how public policy could and should change if obligations of social beneficence were given more strength in policy formulation than they have traditionally been afforded. An example is found in the foundations of public policy regarding organ procurement. Established legal and policy precedents in many countries require express consent by a decedent before death or by the family after death. A near absolute right of autonomy to decide about the disposition of organs and tissues has been the prevailing norm. However, this approach impairs the efficient collection of needed tissues and organs, and many people die as a result of the shortage of organs. The scarcity of organs and tissues and the inefficiency of the system have prompted a spate of proposals for reform of the current system of procurement, with the goal of creating more space for social beneficence.

One policy proposal with a social-beneficence commitment is the routine retrieval of organs and tissues. In this system of procurement, a community is permitted to, and encouraged to, routinely collect organs from those who are dead, unless the dead person had previously registered his or her objection to the system with the state. The routine retrieval of tissues and organs from all dead candidates is not justified on traditional grounds of respect for autonomy. Rather, advocates of the policy argue that members of a community have an obligation to provide other persons with objects of lifesaving value when no cost to themselves is required. That is, the justification is in beneficence, not respect for autonomy.

The debate continues on whether beneficence or respect for autonomy should prevail in public policy governing organ retrieval. Advocates of the current system argue that individual and family rights of consent should retain dominance. Advocates of routine retrieval argue that traditional social priorities involving beneficence in conflict with autonomy have been wrongly structured. All agree that the present public-policy situation on organ-procurement is morally unsatisfactory.

6.4 Social Beneficence and Social Justice

Some of the most important issues in the ethics of health and health care today are classified as issues of social justice. However, at the hands of many writers, social justice looks fundamentally like social beneficence. The underlying moral problem is how to structure the global order and national systems that affect health so that burdens and benefits are fairly distributed and a threshold condition of equitable levels of health and access to health care is in place. Globalization has brought a realization that problems of protecting health and providing services are international in nature and that their alleviation will require a restructuring of the global system.

John Rawls's A Theory of Justice has been an enormously influential work in discussions of these problems in biomedical ethics. Rawls argues that a social arrangement forming a political state is a communal effort to advance the good of all in the society. His starting assumptions are layered with beneficent, egalitarian goals of making the unequal situation of naturally disadvantaged members both better and more equal. His recognition of a positive societal obligation to eliminate or reduce barriers that prevent fair opportunity and that correct or compensate for various disadvantages has implications for discussions of both beneficence and justice in health care, although Rawls himself never pursued these health issues.

Rawls's theory has influenced many writers on themes of health and biomedical ethics, including Norman Daniels and Thomas Pogge. One of Daniels' main questions is “How can we meet health needs fairly under reasonable limits to resources committed to the task?” The “fairly” part of this formulation may be justice-based, but the notion of “reasonable limits to resources” conforms to the problems of the limits of beneficence mentioned previously. Daniels argues that because health is affected by many social factors, theories of justice should not center entirely on access to health care, but also on the need to reduce health inequalities by improving social conditions that affect the health of societies, such as having clean water, adequate nutrition, and general sanitation.

Pogge views the well-being of the worst-off members of global society as the proper starting point for a practical theory of justice, but his view might just as well be considered an argument from social beneficence. Pogge has been particularly concerned with the sweep of global poverty and its impact on health and welfare—an interest almost identical to Singer's. The consequences of extreme poverty for health are well-documented, and these consequences inform Pogge's theory of both basic goods and justice. He also assesses the degree to which institutional structures can be expected to fulfill the mandates of the theory. Pogge's theory demands that persons have access to basic goods of housing, food, and health care.

Recently, so-called “capabilities theory” has, at the hands of some writers, merged concerns of justice and beneficence. This type of theory focuses on distributions intended to enable persons to reach certain functional levels. The idea is to start with an understanding of health and individual well-being and then to connect that account to capabilities for achieving levels of functioning essential to well-being—through, for example, proper nutrition and access to health care. Amartya Sen and Martha Nussbaum are advocates of a capabilities theory. Some writers more closely connected to biomedical ethics have used the background of capabilities theory with a distinct twist toward beneficence. For example, Madison Powers and Ruth Faden, who acknowledge an intellectual debt to Sen and Nussbaum, start with a basic premise: Social justice is concerned with human well-being—not only health, but what they call six distinct and core dimensions of well-being. The six are health, personal security, reasoning, respect, attachment, and self-determination. Each of these dimensions is an independent concern of justice, and the “job of justice” is to secure a sufficient level of each dimension for each person. The justice of societies and of the global order can be judged by how well they effect these well-being dimensions in their political structures and social practices. The job of justice, they say, is to alleviate the social structures that cause these forms of ill-being, but this theory might just as well be stated as the job of beneficence.

7. Beneficence in Business Ethics

Business ethics is a second area of applied ethics in which questions about beneficence have emerged as central. Hume's immediate successor in sentiment theory, Adam Smith, held an influential view about the role and place of benevolence, as a number of writers in business ethics have noted. Smith argued that the wealth of nations is dependent upon social cooperation—fundamentally, political and economic cooperation—but that this realm is not dependent on the benevolence that characterizes moral relations. It would be vain for us to expect benevolence in market societies. In commercial transactions, he says, the only successful strategy is to appeal to personal advantage: Never expect benevolence from a butcher, brewer, or baker; expect from them only a regard to their own interest. Market societies operate not by concerns of humanity, but from self-love.

7.1 The Idea of Corporate Beneficence

Several problems in business ethics can be seen as attempts to come to grips with Smith's view. Discussions of the role of the corporation in society and the very purpose of a corporation as a social institution are examples. It is not disputed that the purpose of a for-profit corporation is to make a profit for stockholders, but there has been an intense debate about whether maximizing stockholder profits is the sole legitimate purpose of corporations—as Milton Friedman and others have argued—and whether truly beneficent corporate conduct is justifiable. This question is normative, but there is also the question of moral psychology raised by Smith: Is it reasonable to expect benevolent acts from the business community? Does beneficence have any place in the world of business?

Corporate social programs often appear to involve a mixture of limited beneficence and self-interested goals such as developing and sustaining relationships with customers. An example is found in public utilities' programs to help customers pay for electricity, gas, oil, phone service, and the like. These programs often decrease rather than increase corporate profits. They are, in effect, a form of corporate philanthropy. The programs locate and attempt to remedy the root causes of bill nonpayment, which typically involve financial distress. The programs also seek to rescue people in the community who are in unfortunate circumstances because of industrial injury, the ill health of a spouse or child, drug dependency, and the like. The company may even pay for consumer advocates, who are social workers trained to deal with customers and their problems. These programs, by design, make life much better for various members of the community who have suffered misfortune. They therefore have a strong appearance of beneficence. They may not be entirely motivated by benevolence, however, because they may also be designed to achieve a positive public image as well as payment of overdue bills.

Some firms have charitable programs that seem to be cases of pure beneficence—that is, not ones admixed with forms of outreach that will help the company. Money is taken directly out of profits, with no expected return of benefits. It has been questioned, however, whether programs of even this description are instances of pure benevolence. In the precedent U. S. case of A. P. Smith Manufacturing v. Barlow (1953), a judge determined that a beneficent charitable donation to Princeton University by the A. P. Smith Co. was a legitimate act of beneficence by responsible corporate officers. However, the judge acknowledged that such beneficence may not be pure beneficence, but rather an act taken in the best interest of the corporation by building its public image and esteem. In effect, the judge suggests that such a gift, while beneficent, may not derive from entirely benevolent motives. If beneficent acts by corporations are nothing more than clever ways to maximize profits, then these actions seem to satisfy Friedman's conception.

Whatever the truth about business's motives, a separate question is whether businesses have any obligations of beneficent action. Stakeholder theory is an example of an approach that answers in the affirmative. In the classical profit-to-stockholder view, stockholders' interests were supreme, but what about the interests of other stakeholders, particularly those whose efforts are necessary for a firm's survival and flourishing? Who deserves to benefit? A stakeholder is any individual or group which can affect or benefit, or be affected by or benefited by, an organization. Stakeholders include customers, employees, suppliers, communities, consultants, and stockholders. Stakeholder theory is commonly regarded as a theory of corporate responsibility—the theory that managers of a firm have obligations to a specified group of stakeholders. Many of these obligations are ones of beneficence, especially with regard to employees and stockholders. Stockholder theory, by contrast, is the theory that managers have obligations—conceived as fiduciary duties—only to stockholder interests. In contemporary business ethics it is now widely held that corporate responsibility requires a stakeholder perspective, but that this perspective is still not broad enough, because there may be additional obligations of beneficence to contribute to various forms of social awareness and public policy even when the affected community is not truly a stakeholder.

But do corporations have obligations of beneficence to some larger community? Many corporations have answered yes to this question. In a statement of “The Johnson and Johnson Way,” the Johnson and Johnson Company credo, it is said that Johnson and Johnson is responsible to the communities in which it thrives, and indeed to the world community. The company asserts an obligation to be good citizens, including offering the support of charities, the encouragement of civic progress, the bettering of public health, and the improvement of education. Johnson and Johnson and many other companies assert that they have obligations to these ends, but to many writers in business ethics this claim of obligations is either misguided or overstated. They regard such moral demands as ideals or institutional commitments, especially if they reach out to the world community.

7.2 Corporate Benefit-Paternalism

Paternalism is often found in the practices of business and in government regulation of business. For example, many businesses require employees to deduct money from their salary for a retirement account; they may also deduct salary money to pay for a life insurance policy. If employees do not want these “benefits,” they are not free to reject them. Paternalism is here assumed to be an appropriate liberty-limiting principle. Another commonplace example comes from the construction industry and the chemical industry. If an employee wishes not to wear a particular suit, mask, or other protective device, the company (also the government) will compel it anyway, often (though not always) for paternalistic reasons.

An ongoing example of paternalism is the restriction of various pictures, literature, or information—often pornography or violent depictions—on the internet, in bookstores, and in video stores. Customers may wish to purchase or receive information about these products, but paternalism thwarts their preferences. Arguments are put forward maintaining that those exposed to pornography will harm themselves by such exposure—for example, pornography might reinforce their emotional problems or render them incapable of love and other distinctively human relationships.

A classic problem of paternalism in business ethics derives from the principle of caveat emptor—Latin for “let the buyer beware.” This property-law-derived principle is a general principle governing sales: A buyer is responsible for determining any unfitness in a product and is not due any form of refund or exchange unless the seller has actively concealed the unfitness. The buyer is free to make the purchase or not make it. Paternalistic restrictions on purchasing have the objective that buyers not harm themselves or will not fail to receive benefits that they otherwise might not receive. For example, the control of pharmaceutical products and controlled substances–through government policies and licensed pharmacies—has often been justified by appeal to paternalism. Many believe that the Food and Drug Administration (FDA) in the U.S. is fundamentally a paternalistic agency.

As the marketplace for products has grown complex and the products more sophisticated, buyers have become more dependent upon salespersons to know their products and to tell the truth about them. An enduring question in business ethics is whether a salesperson's role should be viewed as that of paternalistic protector of the buyer. Suppose, for example, that a consumer wants a sprinkler system in his yard to water his grove of evergreens. He loves the sound and look of sprinklers. However, these sprinklers are worthless for appropriate watering of the roots of his evergreens: The owner needs drip-hose for his large collection of pine, spruce, cedar, and cypress. Should a salesperson insist on selling only drip-hose, refusing to sell sprinkler heads; or should the salesperson acquiesce to the customer's strong preference for sprinklers?

Traditionally salespersons have not viewed their obligations of beneficence in this way, but perhaps paternalistic beneficence would be a commendable change of practice?


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consequentialism | cosmopolitanism | ethics, biomedical: justice and access to health care | ethics, biomedical: theory | ethics: business | Hume, David | justice | Kant, Immanuel | paternalism | public health: ethics