Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sat Feb 23, 2002; substantive revision Tue Nov 28, 2006

The word ‘cosmopolitan’, which derives from the Greek word kosmopolitês (‘citizen of the world’), has been used to describe a wide variety of important views in moral and socio-political philosophy. The nebulous core shared by all cosmopolitan views is the idea that all human beings, regardless of their political affiliation, do (or at least can) belong to a single community, and that this community should be cultivated. Different versions of cosmopolitanism envision this community in different ways, some focusing on political institutions, others on moral norms or relationships, and still others focusing on shared markets or forms of cultural expression. The philosophical interest in cosmopolitanism lies in its challenge to commonly recognized attachments to fellow-citizens, the local state, parochially shared cultures, and the like.

1. History of Cosmopolitanisms

1.1 Greek and Roman Cosmopolitanism

The political culture idealized in the writings of Plato and Aristotle is not cosmopolitan. In this culture, a man identifies himself first and foremost as a citizen of a particular polis or city, and in doing so, he signals which institutions and which body of people hold his allegiance. He would then be counted on for help in defending the city from attacks, sustaining its institutions of justice, and contributing to its common good. In this way, his own pursuit of a good life is inextricably bound to the fate of the city and to the similar pursuit carried out by other inhabitants of the city. By contrast, the good person would not be expected to share with or serve any foreigners who live outside the city. Any cosmopolitan expectations on a good Athenian extended only to concern for those foreigners who happen to reside in Athens.

It would, however, be wrong to assume that Classical Greek thought was uniformly anti-cosmopolitan. Actively excluding foreigners from any ethical consideration or actively targeting foreigners for mistreatment goes one step beyond focusing one's service and concern on compatriots, and in fact, the targeting of ‘barbarians’ is historically linked with the rise of panhellenism and not with the more narrow emphasis on the polis. It would be more accurate to call the Classical emphasis on the polis uncosmopolitan.

Yet even as Plato and Aristotle were writing, other Greeks were issuing cosmopolitan challenges. Perhaps the most obvious challenges came from the traveling intellectuals who insisted on the contrast between the conventional ties of politics and the natural ties of humanity. Notice, for example, the way Plato has the Sophist Hippias address the motley crew of Athenians and foreigners present at Callias' house in Plato's Protagoras (337c7-d3):

Gentlemen present … I regard you all as kinsmen, familiars, and fellow-citizens — by nature and not by convention; for like is by nature akin to like, while convention, which is a tyrant over human beings, forces many things contrary to nature.

Socrates, too, it can be argued, was sensitive to this more cosmopolitan identification with human beings as such. At least as Plato characterizes him, Socrates avoids traditional political engagement as much as he can, in favor of an extraordinary career of examining himself and others, and he insists that these examinations are both genuinely political (Gorg 521d6-8) and extended to all, Athenians and foreigners alike (Apol 23b4-6). Of course, Socrates chose not to travel widely, but this decision could well have been consistent with cosmopolitan ideals, for he may have thought that his best bet for serving human beings generally lay in staying at home, on account, ironically, of Athens' superior freedom of speech (Gorg 461e1-3; cf. Apol 37c5-e2 and Meno 80b4-7). Whether Socrates was self-consciously cosmopolitan in this way or not, there is no doubt that his ideas accelerated the development of cosmopolitanism and that he was in later antiquity embraced as a citizen of the world. In fact, the first philosopher in the West to give perfectly explicit expression to cosmopolitanism was the Socratically inspired Cynic Diogenes in the fourth century bce. It is said that “when he was asked where he came from, he replied, ‘I am a citizen of the world [kosmopolitês]’” (Diogenes Laertius VI 63). By identifying himself not as a citizen of Sinope but as a citizen of the world, Diogenes apparently refused to agree that he owed special service to Sinope and the Sinopeans. So understood, ‘I am a citizen of the cosmos’ is a negative claim, and we might wonder if there is any positive content to the Cynic's world-citizenship. The most natural suggestion would be that a world-citizen should serve the world-state, helping to bring it about in order to enable the later work of sustaining its institutions and contributing to its common good. But the historical record does not suggest that Diogenes the Cynic favored the introduction of a world-state. In fact, the historical record does not unambiguously provide Diogenes any positive commitments that we can readily understand as cosmopolitan. The best we can do to find positive cosmopolitanism in Diogenes is to insist that the whole Cynic way of life is supposed to be cosmopolitan: by living in accordance with nature and rejecting what is conventional, the Cynic sets an example of high-minded virtue for all other human beings.

A fuller exploration of positively committed philosophical cosmopolitanism arrives only with the Socratizing and Cynic-influenced Stoics of the third century CE. These Stoics are fond of saying that the cosmos is, as it were, a polis, because the cosmos is put in perfect order by law, which is right reason. They also embrace the negative implication of their high standards: conventional poleis do not, strictly speaking, deserve the name. But the Stoics do not believe that living in agreement with the cosmos — as a citizen of the cosmos — requires maintaining critical distance from conventional poleis. Rather, as the traces of Chrysippus' On Lives make clear, the Stoics believe that goodness requires serving other human beings as best one can, that serving all human beings equally well is impossible, and that the best service one can give typically requires political engagement. Of course, the Stoics recognize that political engagement will not be possible for everyone, and that some people will best be able to help other human beings as private teachers of virtue rather than as politicians. But in no case, the Stoics insist, is consideration of political engagement to be limited to one's own polis. The motivating idea is, after all, to help human beings as such, and sometimes the best way to do that is to serve as a teacher or as a political advisor in some foreign place. In this fashion, the Stoics introduce clear, practical content to their metaphor of the cosmopolis: a cosmopolitan considers moving away in order to serve, whereas a non-cosmopolitan does not.

This content admits of a strict and a more moderate interpretation. On the strict view, when one considers whether to emigrate, one recognizes prima facie no special or stronger reason to serve compatriots than to serve a set of human beings abroad. On the moderate view, one does introduce into one's deliberations extra reason to serve compatriots, although one might still, all things considered, make the best choice by emigrating. The evidence does not permit a decisive attribution of one or the other of these interpretations to any of the earliest Stoics. But if we think that Chrysippus was deeply attracted to the Cynics' rejection of what is merely conventional, then we will find it easy to think of him as a strict cosmopolitan.

Things are a bit different for at least some of the Stoics at Rome. On the one hand, the cosmopolis becomes less demanding. Whereas Chrysippus limits citizenship in the cosmos to those who in fact live in agreement with the cosmos and its law, Roman Stoics extend citizenship to all human beings by virtue of their rationality. On the other hand, local citizenship becomes more demanding. There is no doubt that the Stoicism of Cicero's De Officiis or of Seneca's varied corpus explicitly acknowledges obligations to Rome. This is a moderate Stoic cosmopolitanism, and empire made the doctrine very easy for many Romans by identifying the Roman patria with the cosmopolis itself. But neither imperialism nor a literal interpretation of world-citizenship is required for the philosophical point. The maximally committed cosmopolitan looks around to determine whom he can best help and how, knowing full well that he cannot help all people in just the same way, and his decision to help some people far more than others is justified by cosmopolitan lights if it is the best he can do to help human beings as such.

Stoic cosmopolitanism in its various guises was enormously persuasive throughout the Greco-Roman world. In part, this success can be explained by noting how cosmopolitan the world at that time was. Alexander the Great's conquests and the subsequent division of his empire into successor kingdoms sapped local cities of much of their traditional authority and fostered increased contacts between cities, and later, the rise of the Roman Empire united the whole of the Mediterranean under one political power. But it is wrong to say what has frequently been said, that cosmopolitanism arose as a response to the fall of the polis or to the rise of the Roman empire. First, the polis' fall has been greatly exaggerated. Under the successor kingdoms and even — though to a lesser degree — under Rome, there remained substantial room for important political engagement locally. Second, and more decisively, the cosmopolitanism that was so persuasive during the so-called Hellenistic Age and under the Roman Empire was in fact rooted in intellectual developments that predate Alexander's conquests. Still, there is no doubting that the empires under which Stoicism developed and flourished made many people more receptive to the cosmopolitan ideal and thus contributed greatly to the widespread influence of Stoic cosmopolitanism.

Nowhere was Stoic cosmopolitanism itself more influential than in early Christianity. Early Christians took the later Stoic recognition of two cities as independent sources of obligation and added a twist. For the Stoics, the citizens of the polis and the citizens of the cosmopolis do the same work: both aim to improve the lives of the citizens. The Christians respond to a different call: “Render therefore unto Caesar the things which are Caesar's; and unto God the things that are God's” (Matthew 22:21). On this view, the local city may have divine authority (John 19:11; cf. Romans 13:1,4,7), but the most important work for human goodness is removed from traditional politics, set aside in a sphere in which people of all nations can become “fellow-citizens with the saints” (Ephesians 2:20).

This development has two important and long-lasting consequences, which are canonized by Augustine. First, the cosmopolis again becomes a community for certain people only. Augustine makes this point most explicitly by limiting the citizenship in the city of God to those who love God. All others are relegated to the inferior — though still universal — earthly city by their love of self. These two cities of the world, which are doomed to coexist intertwined until the Final Judgment, divide the world's inhabitants. Second, the work of politics is severed from the task of building good human lives, lives of righteousness and justice. While Augustine can stress that this allows citizens in the city of God to obey local laws concerning “the necessaries for the maintenance of life,” he must also acknowledge that it sets up a potential conflict over the laws of religion and the concerns of righteousness and justice (e.g., Civitas Dei XIX 17).

For hundreds of years to come, debates in political philosophy would surround the relation between ‘temporal’ political authority and the ‘eternal Church.’ But emphasis on the cosmopolitan aspect of the Church waned, despite its ideal of a religious community comprising all humans. In a nutshell, the debate now opposed the secular and the religious, and not the local and the cosmopolitan. To be sure, this debate often had cosmopolitan ramifications, which are clear enough in Dante Alighieri's plea for a universal monarchy in De Monarchia (ca. 1314). But his case draws from Aristotle and Roman history, not explicitly from the ideal of a cosmopolis or of world-citizenship, and he remains deeply concerned to adjudicate between the pope and the Holy Roman Emperor.

1.2 Early Modern and Enlightenment Cosmopolitanism

Cosmopolitanism slowly began to come to the fore again with the renewed study of more ancient texts, but during the humanist era cosmopolitanism still remained the exception. Despite the fact that ancient cosmopolitan sources were well-known and that many humanists emphasized the essential unity of all religions, they did not develop this idea in cosmopolitan terms. A few authors, however, most notably Erasmus of Rotterdam, explicitly drew on ancient cosmopolitanism to advocate the ideal of a world-wide peace. Emphasizing the unity of humankind over its division into different states and peoples, by arguing that humans are destined by Nature to be sociable and live in harmony, Erasmus pleaded for national and religious tolerance and regarded like-minded people as his compatriots (Querela Pacis).

Early modern natural law theory might seem a likely candidate for spawning philosophical cosmopolitanism. Its secularizing tendencies and the widespread individualist view among its defenders that all humans share certain fundamental characteristics would seem to suggest a point of unification for humankind as a whole. However, according to many early modern theorists, what all individuals share is a fundamental striving for self-preservation, and the universality of this striving does not amount to a fundamental bond that unites (or should unite) all humans in a universal community.

Still, there are two factors that do sometimes push modern natural law theory in a cosmopolitan direction. First, some natural law theorists assume that nature implanted in humans, in addition to the tendency to self-preservation, also a fellow-feeling, a form of sociability that unites all humans at a fundamental level into a kind of world community. The appeal to such a shared human bond was very thin, however, and by no means does it necessarily lead to cosmopolitanism. In fact, the very notion of a natural sociability was sometimes used instead to legitimate war against peoples elsewhere in the world who were said to have violated this common bond in an ‘unnatural’ way, or who were easily said to have placed themselves outside of the domain of common human morality by their ‘barbaric’ customs. Second, early modern natural law theory was often connected with social contract theory, and although most social contract theorists worked out their views mostly, if not solely, for the level of the state and not for that of international relations, the very idea behind social contract theory lends itself for application to this second level. Grotius, Pufendorf, and others did draw out these implications and thereby laid the foundation for international law. Grotius envisioned a “great society of states” that is bound by a “law of nations” that holds “between all states” (De Iure Belli ac Paci, 1625, Prolegomena par. 17; Pufendorf, De Iure Naturae et Gentium, 1672).

The historical context of the philosophical resurgence of cosmopolitanism during the Enlightenment is made up of many factors: The increasing rise of capitalism and world-wide trade and its theoretical reflections; the reality of ever expanding empires whose reach extended across the globe; the voyages around the world and the anthropological so-called ‘discoveries’ facilitated through these; the renewed interest in Hellenistic philosophy; and the emergence of a notion of human rights and a philosophical focus on human reason. Many intellectuals of the time regarded their membership in the transnational ‘republic of letters’ as more significant than their membership in the particular political states they found themselves in, all the more so because their relationship with their government was often strained because of censorship issues. This prepared them to think in terms other than those of states and peoples and adopt a cosmopolitan perspective. Under the influence of the American Revolution, and especially during the first years of the French Revolution, cosmopolitanism received its strongest impulse. The 1789 declaration of ‘human’ rights had grown out of cosmopolitan modes of thinking and reinforced them in turn.

In the eighteenth century, the terms ‘cosmopolitanism’ and ‘world citizenship’ were often used not as labels for determinate philosophical theories, but rather to indicate an attitude of open-mindedness and impartiality. A cosmopolitan was someone who was not subservient to a particular religious or political authority, someone who was not biased by particular loyalties or cultural prejudice. Furthermore, the term was sometimes used to indicate a person who led an urbane life-style, or who was fond of traveling, cherished a network of international contacts, or felt at home everywhere. In this sense the Encyclopédie mentioned that ‘cosmopolitan’ was often used to signify a “man of no fixed abode, or a man who is nowhere a stranger.” Though philosophical authors such as Montesquieu, Voltaire, Diderot, Addison, Hume, and Jefferson identified themselves as cosmopolitans in one or more of these senses, these usages are not of much philosophical interest.

Especially in the second half of the century, however, the term was increasingly also used to indicate particular philosophical convictions. Some authors revived the Cynic tradition. Fougeret de Montbron in his 1753 autobiographical report, Le Cosmopolite, calls himself a cosmopolitan, describes how he travels everywhere without being committed to anywhere, declaring “All the countries are the same to me” and “[I am] changing my places of residence according to my whim” (p. 130).

Despite the fact that only a few authors committed themselves to this kind of cosmopolitanism, this was the version that critics of cosmopolitanism took as their target. For example, Rousseau complains that cosmopolitans “boast that they love everyone [tout le monde, which also means ‘the whole world’], to have the right to love no one” (Geneva Manuscript version of The Social Contract, 158). Johann Georg Schlosser, in the critical poem ‘Der Kosmopolit’ writes, “It is better to be proud of one's nation than to have none,” obviously assuming that cosmopolitanism implies the latter.

Yet most eighteenth-century defenders of cosmopolitanism did not recognize their own view in these critical descriptions. They understood cosmopolitanism not as a form of ultra-individualism, but rather, drawing on the Stoic tradition, as implying the positive moral ideal of a universal human community, and they did not regard this ideal as inimical to more particular attachments such as patriotism. Some, like the German author Christoph Martin Wieland, stayed quite close to Stoic views. Others developed a cosmopolitan moral theory that was distinctively new. According to Kant, all rational beings are members in a single moral community. They are analogous to citizens in the political (republican) sense in that they share the characteristics of freedom, equality, and independence, and that they give themselves the law. Their common laws, however, are the laws of morality, grounded in reason. Early utilitarian cosmopolitans like Jeremy Bentham, by contrast, defended their cosmopolitanism by pointing to the “common and equal utility of all nations.” Moral cosmopolitanism could be grounded in human reason, or in some other characteristic universally shared among humans (and in some cases other kinds of beings) such as the capacity to experience pleasure or pain, a moral sense, or the aesthetic imagination. Moral cosmopolitans regarded all humans as ‘brothers’ (though with obvious gender bias) — an analogy with which they aimed to indicate the fundamental equality of rank of all humans, which precluded slavery, colonial exploitation, feudal hierarchy, and tutelage of various sorts.

Some cosmopolitans developed their view into a political theory about international relations. The most radical of eighteenth-century political cosmopolitans was no doubt Anacharsis Cloots (Jean-Baptiste du Val-de-Grace, baron de Cloots, 1755-1794). Cloots advocated the abolition of all existing states and the establishment of a single world state under which all human individuals would be directly subsumed. His arguments drew first of all on the general structure of social contract theory. If it is in the general interest for everyone to submit to the authority of a state that enforces laws that provide security, then this argument applies world-wide and justifies the establishment of a world-wide “republic of united individuals,” not a plurality of states that find themselves in the state of nature vis-à-vis each other. Second, he argues that sovereignty should reside with the people, and that the concept of sovereignty itself, because it involves indivisibility, implies that there can be but one sovereign body in the world, namely, the human race as a whole (La république universelle ou adresse aux tyrannicides, 1792; Bases constitutionelles de la république du genre humain, 1793).

Most other political cosmopolitans did not go as far as Cloots. Immanuel Kant, most famously, advocated a much weaker form of international legal order, namely, that of a ‘league of nations.’ In Perpetual Peace (1795) Kant argues that true and world-wide peace is possible only when states are organized internally according to ‘republican’ principles, when they are organized externally in a voluntary league for the sake of keeping peace, and when they respect the human rights not only of their citizens but also of foreigners. He argues that the league of states should not have coercive military powers because that would violate the internal sovereignty of states, constitute a potential danger to individual freedoms already established within those states (if the federal authority were less respectful of human rights than some of the member states) and reduce the chances that states would actually join.

Some critics argued in response that Kant's position was inconsistent, on the grounds that the only way to fully overcome the state of nature among states was for them to enter into a federative unity of states with coercive powers. They transformed the concept of sovereignty in the process, by conceiving it as layered, and this enabled them to argue that states ought to transfer part of their sovereignty to the federal level, but only that part that concerns their external relations to other states, while retaining the sovereignty of the states concerning their internal affairs (the early Fichte). Romantic authors, on the other hand, felt that the ideal state should not have to involve coercion at all, and hence also that the cosmopolitan ideal should be that of a world-wide republic of ‘fraternal’ non-authoritarian republics (the young Friedrich Schlegel).

Kant also introduced the concept of "cosmopolitan law," suggesting a third sphere of public law — in addition to constitutional law and international law — in which both states and individuals have rights, and where individuals have these rights as "citizens of the earth" rather than as citizens of particular states.

In addition to moral and political forms of cosmopolitanism, there emerged an economic form of cosmopolitan theory. The freer trade advocated by eighteenth-century anti-mercantilists like Adam Smith and Dietrich Hermann Hegewisch took greater and greater hold. They sought to diminish the role of politics in the economic realm. Their ideal was a world in which tariffs and other restrictions on foreign trade are abolished, a world in which the market, not the government, takes care of the needs of the people. Against mercantilism, they argue that it is more advantageous for everyone involved if a nation imports those goods which are more expensive to produce domestically, and that the assumption that one's own state will profit if other states are unable to export their goods is false. They argue that the situation is quite the contrary: the abolition of protectionism would benefit everyone, because other states would gain from their exports, reach a higher standard of living and then become even better trading partners, because they could then import more, too. On their view, after trade will have been liberalized world-wide, the importance of national governments will diminish dramatically. As national governments currently focus on the national economy and defense, their future role will be at most auxiliary. In the ideal global market, war is in no one's interest. The freer the global market becomes, the more the role of the states will become negligible.

1.3 Cosmopolitanism in the 19th and 20th Centuries

Enlightenment cosmopolitanism has continued to be a source of debate in the subsequent two centuries. First, in the nineteenth century, economic globalization provoked fierce reactions. Marx and Engels tagged cosmopolitanism as an ideological reflection of capitalism. They regard market capitalism as inherently expansive, breaking the bounds of the nation-state system, as evidenced by the fact that production and consumption had become attuned to faraway lands. In their hands, the word ‘cosmopolitan’ is tied to the effects of capitalist globalization, including especially the bourgeois ideology which legitimatizes ‘free’ trade in terms of the freedom of individuals and mutual benefit, although this very capitalist order is the cause of the misery of millions, indeed the cause of the very existence of the proletariat. At the same time, however, Marx and Engels also hold that the proletariat in every country shares essential features and has common interests, and the Communist movement aims to convince proletarians everywhere of these common interests. Most famously, the Communist Manifesto ends with the call, “Proletarians of all countries, unite!” This, combined with the ideal of the class-less society and the expected withering away of the state after the revolution, implies a form of cosmopolitanism of its own.

Debates about global capitalism and about an international workers' movement have persisted. Frequently economic cosmopolitanism can be found in the advocacy of open markets, in the tradition from Adam Smith to Friedrich von Hayek and Milton Friedman. Communist versions of cosmopolitanism also developed further, although the Leninist-Stalinist tradition kept using ‘cosmopolitan’ itself as a derogatory term.

The second inheritance from eighteenth century cosmopolitanism is found in the two centuries' worth of attempts to create peace. It has often been noted that there are parallels between Kant's peace proposal in Perpetual Peace and the structure of the League of Nations as it existed in the early part of the 20th century as well as the structure of the current United Nations, although it should also be pointed out that essential features of Kant's plan were not implemented, such as the abolition of standing armies. Now, after the end of the cold war, there is again a resurgence of the discussion about the most appropriate world order to promote peace, just as there was after the first and second world wars.

The International Criminal Court should be mentioned here as an innovative form of cosmopolitanism, going much beyond Kant's conception of ‘cosmopolitan law.’ The ICC itself represents an extension of the long trend, in international law, to do away with the principle of the absolute subjection of individuals to the state and develop the status of individuals under international law. Individuals are now the bearers of certain rights under international law, and they can be held responsible for crimes under international law in ways that cut through the shield of state sovereignty.

Third, moral philosophers and moralists in the wake of eighteenth-century cosmopolitanisms have insisted that we human beings have a duty to aid fellow humans in need, regardless of their citizenship status. There is a history of international relief efforts (International Red Cross and Red Crescent Societies, famine relief organizations, and the like) in the name of the reduction of human suffering and without regard to the nationality of those affected.

In addition, because cosmopolitan duty is not restricted to duties of beneficence but also requires justice and respect, cosmopolitan morality has often been invoked as a motivation to oppose slavery and apartheid, and to defend the emancipation of women, or, in the utilitarian tradition, to demand better treatment of animals.

Most past cosmopolitan authors did not fully live up to the literal interpretation of their cosmopolitan theories, and one can find misogynist, racist, nationalist, religious, or class-based biases and inconsistencies in their accounts. These shortcomings have often been used as arguments against cosmopolitanism, but they are not as easily used for that purpose as it may seem. Because the universalist potential in the discourse of ‘world citizenship’ can itself be used as a basis for exposing these shortcomings as problematic, one should say that they stem from too little, rather than too much, cosmopolitanism.

2. Taxonomy of Contemporary Cosmopolitanisms

Even this brief glance backwards reveals a wide variety of views that can be called cosmopolitan. Every cosmopolitan argues for some community among all human beings, regardless of social and political affiliation. For some, what should be shared is simply moral community, which means only that living a good human life requires serving the universal community by helping human beings as such, perhaps by promoting the realization of justice and the guarantee of human rights. Others conceptualize the universal community in terms of political institutions to be shared by all, in terms of cultural expressions to be appreciated by all, or in terms of economic markets that should be open to all.

The most common cosmopolitanism — moral cosmopolitanism — does not always call itself such. But just as ancient cosmopolitanism was fundamentally a ‘moral’ commitment to helping human beings as such, much contemporary moral philosophy insists on the duty to aid foreigners who are starving or otherwise suffering, or at least on the duty to respect and promote basic human rights and justice.  One can here distinguish between strict and moderate forms of cosmopolitanism. The strict cosmopolitans in this sphere operate sometimes from utilitarian assumptions (e.g., Singer, Unger), sometimes from Kantian assumptions (e.g., O'Neill), and sometimes from more ancient assumptions (e.g., Nussbaum), but always with the claim that the duty to provide aid neither gets weighed against any extra duty to help locals or compatriots nor increases in strength when locals or compatriots are in question. Among these strict cosmopolitans some will say that it is permissible, at least in some situations, to concentrate one's charitable efforts on one's compatriots, while others deny this — their position will depend on the details of their moral theory. Other philosophers whom we may call moderate cosmopolitans (including, e.g., Scheffler) acknowledge the cosmopolitan scope of a duty to provide aid, but insist that we also have special duties to compatriots. Among the moderate cosmopolitans, many further distinctions can be drawn, depending on the reasons that are admitted for recognizing special responsibilities to compatriots and depending on how the special responsibilities are balanced with the cosmopolitan duties to human beings generally. Anti-cosmopolitanism in the moral sphere best describes the position of those communitarians (e.g., MacIntyre) who believe either that our obligations to compatriots and more local people crowd out any obligations to benefit human beings as such or that there are no obligations except where there are close, communal relationships.

Moral cosmopolitanism has sometimes led to political cosmopolitanism. Again, we can draw useful distinctions among the political cosmopolitans. Some advocate a centralized world state, some favor a federal system with a comprehensive global body of limited power, some would prefer more limited international political institutions that focus on particular concerns (e.g., war crimes, environmental preservation), and some defend a different alternative altogether. Prominent philosophical discussions of international political arrangements have recently clustered around the heirs of Kant (e.g., Habermas, Rawls, Beitz, and Pogge) and around advocates of ‘cosmopolitan democracy’ (e.g., Held) or ‘republican cosmopolitanism’. Again, there are anti-cosmopolitans, who are skeptical of all international political entanglements.

Perhaps the most common invocations of the label ‘cosmopolitan’ in recent philosophical literature have been in the disputes over cultural cosmopolitanism. Especially with disputes over multiculturalism in educational curricula and with resurgent nationalisms, cultural claims and counter-claims have received much attention. The cosmopolitan position in both of these kinds of disputes rejects exclusive attachments to parochial culture. So on the one hand, the cosmopolitan encourages cultural diversity and appreciates a multicultural mélange, and on the other hand, the cosmopolitan rejects a strong nationalism. In staking out these claims, the cosmopolitan must be wary about very strong ‘rights to culture,’ respecting the rights of minority cultures while rebuffing the right to unconditional national self-determination. Hence, recent advocates of ‘liberal nationalism’ (e.g., Margalit and Raz, Tamir) or of the rights of minority cultures (e.g., Kymlicka) generally seem to be anti-cosmopolitan. But the cosmopolitan's wariness towards very strong rights to culture and towards national self-determination need not be grounded in a wholesale skepticism about the importance of parochial cultural attachments. Cosmopolitanism can acknowledge the importance of (at least some kinds of) cultural attachments for the good human life (at least within certain limits), while denying that this implies that a person's cultural identity should be defined by any bounded or homogeneous subset of the cultural resources available in the world (e.g., Waldron).

Economic cosmopolitanism is perhaps less often defended among philosophers and more often among economists (e.g., Hayek, Friedman) and certain politicians, especially in the richer countries of this world. It is the view that one ought to cultivate a single global economic market with free trade and minimal political involvement. It tends to be criticized rather than advanced by philosophical cosmopolitans, as many of them regard it as at least a partial cause of the problem of vast international economic inequality. These debates about the desirability of a fully globalized market have intensified in recent years, as a result of the end of the Cold War and the increasing reach of the market economy.

3. Objections to Cosmopolitanism

One of the most common objections to cosmopolitanism attacks a position that is in fact made of straw. Often it is said that cosmopolitanism is meaningless without the context of a world-state or that cosmopolitanism necessarily involves the commitment to a world state. These claims are historically uninformed, because cosmopolitanism as a concept arose in the first instance as a metaphor for a way of life and not in literal guise. Ever since, there have been cosmopolitans who do not touch on the issue of international political organization, and of those who do, very few defend the ideal of a world-state. Furthermore, even those cosmopolitans who do favor a world-state tend to support something more sophisticated that cannot be dismissed out of hand: a thin conception of world government with layered sovereignty.

The more serious and philosophically interesting challenges to cosmopolitanism come in two main forms. The first calls into question the possibility of realizing the cosmopolitan ideal, while the second queries its desirability. We discuss these two challenges to the different forms of cosmopolitanism in turn.

3.1 Political cosmopolitanism

It is often argued that it is impossible to change the current system of states and to form a world-state or a global federation of states. This claim is hard to maintain, however, in the face of the existence of the United Nations, the existence of states with more than a billion people of heterogeneous backgrounds, and the experience with the United States and the European Union. So in order to be taken seriously, the objection must instead be that it is impossible to form a good state or federation of that magnitude, i.e., that it is impossible to realize or even approximate the cosmopolitan ideal in a way that makes it worth pursuing and that does not carry prohibitive risks. Here political cosmopolitans disagree among themselves. On one end of the spectrum we find those who argue in favor of a strong world-state, on the other end we find the defenders of a loose and voluntary federation, or a different system altogether.

The defenders of the loose, voluntary and noncoercive federation warn that a world-state easily becomes despotic without there being any competing power left to break the hold of despotism (Rawls). Defenders of the world-state reply that a stronger form of federation, or even merger, is the only way to truly exit the state of nature between states, or the only way to bring about international distributive justice. Other authors have argued that the focus among many political cosmopolitans on only these two alternatives overlooks a third, and that a concern for human rights should lead one to focus instead on institutional reform that disperses sovereignty vertically, rather than concentrating it in all-encompassing international institutions. On this view, peace, democracy, prosperity, and the environment would be better served by a system in which the political allegiance and loyalties of persons are widely dispersed over a number of political units of various sizes, without any one unit being dominant and thus occupying the traditional role of the state (Pogge).

Of the objections brought up by non- or anti-cosmopolitans, two deserve special mention. First, some authors argue that the (partial or whole) surrender of state sovereignty required by the cosmopolitan scheme is an undue violation of the principle of the autonomy of states or the principle of democratic self-determination of their citizens. Second, so-called ‘realists’ argue that states are in a Hobbesian state of nature as far as the relations among them are concerned, and that it is as inappropriate as it is futile to subject states to normative constraints. To these objections cosmopolitans have various kinds of response, ranging from developing their alternative normative theory (e.g., by arguing that global democracy increases rather than diminishes the democratic control of individual world citizens) to pointing out, as has been done at least since Grotius, that states have good reasons even on Hobbesian grounds to submit to certain forms of international legal arrangements.

3.2 Economic cosmopolitanism

Various arguments have been used to show that economic cosmopolitanism is not a viable option. Marx and later Marxists have argued that capitalism is self-destructive in the long run, because the exploitation, alienation, and poverty that it inflicts on the proletariat will provoke a world-wide revolution that will bring about the end of capitalism. In the twentieth century, when nationalist tendencies proved to be stronger (or in any case more easily mobilized) than international solidarity, and when the position of workers was strengthened to the point of making them unwilling to risk a revolution, this forced the left to reconsider this view.

Critics of the economic cosmopolitan ideal have also started to emphasize another way in which capitalism bears the seeds of its own destruction within itself, namely, insofar as it is said to lead to a global environmental disaster that might spell the end of the human species, or in any event the end of capitalism as we know it. The effects of excessive consumption (in some parts of the world) and the exploitation of nature would make the earth inhospitable to future human generations.

Even if one does not think that these first two problems are so serious as to make economic cosmopolitanism unviable, they can still make it seem undesirable in the eyes of those who are concerned with poverty and environmental destruction.

Moreover, there are several other concerns that lead critics to regard economic cosmopolitanism as undesirable. First among these is the lack of effective democratic control by the vast majority of the world's population, as large multinationals are able to impose demands on states that are in a weak economic position and their populations, demands that they cannot reasonably refuse to meet, although this does not mean that they meet them fully voluntarily. This concerns, for example, labor conditions or the use of raw materials in so-called Third World countries.

Second, economic cosmopolitans are accused of failing to pay attention to a number of probable side-effects of a global free market. In particular, they are criticized for neglecting or downplaying issues such as (a) the presupposition of large-scale migration or re-schooling when jobs disappear in one area (the loss of ties to friends and family, language, culture, etc., and the monetary costs of moving or re-tooling), (b) the lack of a guarantee that there will be a sufficient supply of living-wage jobs for all world citizens (especially given increasing automation), and (c) the problem of the detrimental effects of income disparities. They are similarly accused of failing to take seriously the fact that there might be circumstances under which it would be profitable for some states to be protectionist or wage war, such as wars about markets or raw materials and energy (e.g., oil).

3.3 Moral cosmopolitanism

Another version of the criticism that cosmopolitanism is impossible targets the psychological assumptions of moral cosmopolitanism. Here it is said that human beings must have stronger attachments toward members of their own state or nation, and that attempts to disperse attachments to fellow-citizens in order to honor a moral community with human beings as such will cripple our sensibilities. If this is a viability claim and not simply a desirability claim, then it must be supposed that moral cosmopolitanism would literally leave large numbers of people unable to function. So it is claimed that people need a particular sense of national identity in order to be agents, and that a particular sense of national identity requires attachment to particular others perceived to have a similar identity. This argument seems plausible if it is assumed that cosmopolitanism requires the same attitudes towards all other human beings, but moderate cosmopolitanism does not make that assumption. Rather, the moderate cosmopolitan has to insist only that there is some favorable, motivating attitude toward all human beings as such; this leaves room for some special attitudes towards fellow-citizens. Of course, the strict moral cosmopolitan will go further and will deny that fellow-citizens deserve any special attitudes, and it might be thought that this denial is what flouts the limits of human psychology. But this does not seem to be true as an empirical generalization. The cosmopolitan does not need to deny that some people do happen to have the need for national allegiance, so long as it is true that not all people do; and insofar as some people do, the strict cosmopolitan will say that perhaps it does not need to be that way and that cosmopolitan education might lead to a different result. The historical record gives even the strict cosmopolitan some cause for cheer, as human psychology and the forms of political organization have proven to be quite plastic.

In fact, some cosmopolitans have adopted a developmental psychology according to which patriotism is a step on the way to cosmopolitanism: as human individuals mature they develop ever wider loyalties and allegiances, starting with attachments to their caregivers and ending with allegiance to humanity at large. These different attachments are not necessarily in competition with each other. Just as little as loyalty to one's family is generally seen as a problematic feature of citizens, so the argument goes, loyalty to one's state is not a necessarily problematic feature in the eyes of cosmopolitans. Thus, cosmopolitanism is regarded as an extension of a developmental process that also includes the development of patriotism. This claim is just as much in need of empirical support, however, as the opposite claim discussed in the previous paragraph.

Often, though, the critic's arguments about psychological possibility are actually run together with desirability claims. The critic says that the elimination of a special motivating attachment to fellow-citizens is not possible, but the critic means that the elimination of special motivating attachments to fellow-citizens will make a certain desirable form of political life impossible. To respond to this sort of argument, the cosmopolitan has two routes open. First, she can deny the claim itself. Perhaps the viability of politics as usual depends not upon certain beliefs that fellow-citizens deserve more of one's service, but upon commitments to the polity itself. If strictly cosmopolitan patriotism is a possibility, it lives in a commitment to a universal set of principles embodied in a particular political constitution and a particular set of political institutions. If such commitment is enough for desirable politics, then the anti-cosmopolitan is disarmed. But second, the cosmopolitan can of course also deny the value of the form of political life that is posited as desirable. At this point, moral commitments run over into a discussion of political theory.

Occasionally it is said that cosmopolitans are treasonous or at least unreliable citizens. But many recognizably cosmopolitan theses (that is, the moderate ones) are consistent with loyalty to fellow-citizens, and even the strictest cosmopolitan can justify some forms of service to fellow-citizens when they are an optimal way to do good for human beings (who happen to be fellow-citizens, and not because they are fellow-citizens).

This last criticism can be developed further, however, and tailored specifically to target the strict cosmopolitan. If the strict cosmopolitan can justify only some forms of service to fellow-citizens, under some conditions, it might be said that she is blind to other morally required forms or conditions of service to fellow-citizens. At this point, the critic offers reasons why a person has special obligations to compatriots, which are missed by the strict cosmopolitan. Many critics who introduce these reasons are themselves moderate cosmopolitans, wishing to demonstrate that there are special obligations to fellow-citizens in addition to general duties to the community of all human beings. But if these reasons are demanding enough, then there may be no room left for any community with all human beings, and so these objections to strict cosmopolitanism can also provide some impetus toward an anti-cosmopolitan stance. Because there are several such reasons that are frequently proposed, there are, in effect, several objections to the strictly cosmopolitan position, and they should be considered one-by-one.

The first narrow objection to strict cosmopolitanism is that it neglects the obligations of reciprocity. According to this argument, we have obligations to give benefits in return for benefits received, and we receive benefits from our fellow-citizens. The best strictly cosmopolitan response to this argument will insist on a distinction between the state and fellow-citizens and will question exactly who provides which benefits and what is owed in return. On grounds of reciprocity the state may be owed certain things — cooperative obedience — and these things may in fact generally benefit fellow-citizens. But the state is not owed these things because one owes the fellow-citizens benefits. One does not appropriately signal gratitude for benefits received from the state by, say, giving more to local charities than to charities abroad because charity like this does not address the full agent responsible for the benefits one has received, and does not even seem to be the sort of thing that is commensurate with the benefits received. In assessing this exchange of arguments, there are some significantly difficult questions to answer concerning exactly how the receipt of benefits obliges one to make a return and concerning how the benefits one receives from one's state affect the acceptability of emigration.

A second objection to strict moral cosmopolitanism gives contractarian grounds for our obligations to fellow-citizens. Because actual agreements to prioritize fellow-citizens as beneficiaries are difficult to find, the contractarians generally rely upon an implicit agreement that expresses the interests or values of the fellow-citizens themselves. So the contractarian argument turns on identifying interests or values that obligate fellow-citizens to benefit each other. Perhaps, then, it will be argued that citizens have deep interests in what a successful civil society and state can offer them, and that these interests commit the citizens to an implicit agreement to benefit fellow-citizens. The strict cosmopolitan will reply to such an argument with skepticism about what is required for the civil society. Why is more than cooperative obedience required by our interests in what a successful state and civil society can provide? Surely some citizens have to dedicate themselves to working on behalf of this particular society, but why can they not do so on the grounds that this is the best way to benefit human beings as such? Perhaps an intermediate position here is the (Kantian) view that it is morally necessary to establish just democratic states and that just democratic states need some special commitment on the part of their citizens in order to function as democracies, a special commitment that goes beyond mere cooperative obedience but that can still be defended in universalist cosmopolitan terms. The acceptability of this type of view, however, will depend on whether one finds convincing the underlying Kantian political theory.

The final argument for recognizing obligations to benefit fellow-citizens appeals to what David Miller has called ‘relational facts.’ Here the general thought is that certain relationships are constituted by reciprocal obligations: one cannot be a friend or a brother without having certain friendship-obligations or sibling-obligations, respectively. If fellow-citizenship is like these other relations, then we would seem to have special obligations to fellow-citizens. But this argument, which can be found in Cicero's De Officiis, depends upon our intuitions that fellow-citizenship is like friendship or brotherhood and that friendship and brotherhood do come with special obligations, and both intuitions require more argument. Frequently, these arguments appeal to alleged facts about human nature or about human psychology, but these appeals generally raise still further questions.

In sum, a range of interesting and difficult philosophical issues is raised by the disputes between cosmopolitans of various stripes and their critics. As the world becomes a smaller place through increased social, political, and economic contacts, these disputes and the issues they raise will only become more pressing.


Historical works

On the History of Cosmopolitanism

On the Taxonomy of Cosmopolitanisms

On Contemporary Cosmopolitanisms, For and Against

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the authors with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Augustine, Saint | Chrysippus | Cicero | citizenship | communitarianism | Cynics, ancient | Diogenes of Sinope | globalization | Grotius, Hugo | justice: international | Kant, Immanuel | Marxism | nationalism | obligations: special | political philosophy: history of | rights: human | Socrates | world government