Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Private Language

First published Fri Jul 26, 1996; substantive revision Fri Sep 5, 2008

The idea of a private language was made famous in philosophy by Ludwig Wittgenstein, who in §243 of his book Philosophical Investigations explained it thus: “The words of this language are to refer to what can be known only to the speaker; to his immediate, private, sensations. So another cannot understand the language.”[1] This is not intended to cover (easily imaginable) cases of recording one's experiences in a personal code, for such a code, however obscure in fact, could in principle be deciphered. What Wittgenstein had in mind is a language conceived as necessarily comprehensible only to its single originator because the things which define its vocabulary are necessarily inaccessible to others.

Immediately after introducing the idea, Wittgenstein goes on to argue that there cannot be such a language. The importance of drawing philosophers' attention to a largely unheard-of notion and then arguing that it is unrealizable lies in the fact that an unformulated reliance on the possibility of a private language is arguably essential to mainstream epistemology, philosophy of mind and metaphysics from Descartes to versions of the representational theory of mind which became prominent in late twentieth century cognitive science.

1. Overview: Wittgenstein's Argument and its Interpretations

Wittgenstein's main attack on the idea of a private language is contained in §§244–271 of Philosophical Investigations (though the ramifications of the matter are recognizably pursued until §315). These passages, especially those from §256 onwards, are now commonly known as ‘the private language argument’, despite the fact that he brings further considerations to bear on the topic in other places in his writings; and despite the fact that the broader context, of §§243–315, does not contain a singular critique of just one idea, namely, a private language — rather, the passages address many issues, such as privacy, identity, inner/outer relations, sensations as objects, and sensations as justification for sensation talk, amongst others.

Nevertheless, the main argument of §§244–271 is, apparently, readily summarized. The conclusion is that a language in principle unintelligible to anyone but its originating user is impossible. The reason for this is that such a so-called language would, necessarily, be unintelligible to its supposed originator too, for he would be unable to establish meanings for its putative signs.

We should, however, note that Wittgenstein himself never employs the phrase ‘private language argument’. And a few commentators (e.g., Baker 1998, Canfield 2001 pp. 377–9, Stroud 2000 p. 69) have questioned the very existence in the relevant passages of a unified structure properly identifiable as a sustained argument. This suggestion, however, depends for its plausibility on a tendentiously narrow notion of argument — roughly, as a kind of proof, with identifiable premisses and a firm conclusion, rather than the more general sense which would include the exposure of a confusion through a variety of reasoned twists and turns, of qualifications, weighings-up and re-thinkings — and is a reaction against some drastic and artificial reconstructions of the text by earlier writers. Nevertheless, there is a point to be made, and the summary above conceals, as we shall see, a very intricate discussion.

Even among those who accept that there is a reasonably self-contained and straightforward private language argument to be discussed, there has been fundamental and widespread disagreement over its details, its significance and even its intended conclusion, let alone over its soundness. The result is that every reading of the argument (including that which follows) is controversial. Some of this disagreement has arisen because of the notorious difficulty and occasional elusiveness of Wittgenstein's own text (sometimes augmented by problems of translation). But much derives from the tendency of philosophers to read into the text their own preconceptions without making them explicit and asking themselves whether its author shared them. Some commentators, for instance, supposing it obvious that sensations are private, have interpreted the argument as intended to show they cannot be talked about; some, supposing the argument to be an obvious but unsustainable attempt to wrest special advantage from scepticism about memory, have maintained it to be unsound because it self-defeatingly implies the impossibility of public discourse as well as private; some have assumed it to be a direct attack on the problem of other minds; some have claimed it to commit Wittgenstein to behaviourism or verificationism; some have thought it to imply that language is, of necessity, not merely potentially but actually social (this has come to be called the ‘community view’ of the argument).

The early history of the secondary literature is largely one of disputation over these matters. Yet what these earlier commentators have in common is significant enough to outweigh their differences and make it possible to speak of them as largely sharing an Orthodox understanding of the argument. After the publication in 1982 of Saul Kripke's definitely unorthodox book, however, in which he suggested that the argument poses a sceptical problem about the whole notion of meaning, public or private, disputation conducted by Orthodox rules of engagement was largely displaced by a debate on the issues arising from Kripke's interpretation. (However, there is overlap: Kripke himself adheres to the community view of the argument's implications, with the result that renewed attention has been paid to that issue, dispute over which began in 1954.) Both debates, though, show a tendency to proceed with only the most cursory attention to the original argument which started them off.

This rush to judgment about what is at stake, compounded by a widespread willingness to discuss commentators' more accessible accounts of the text rather than confront its difficulties directly, has made it hard to recover the original from the accretion of more or less tendentious interpretation which has grown up around it. Such a recovery is one of the tasks attempted in this article. The criterion of success in this task which is employed here is one of coherence: a good account should accommodate all of Wittgenstein's remarks in §§244–271, their (not necessarily linear) ordering as well as their content, and should make clear how these remarks fit with the context provided by the rest of the book. (One of the problems with many of the commentaries on this matter, especially the earlier ones, is that their writers have quarried the text for individual remarks which have then been re-woven into a set of views said to be Wittgenstein's but whose relation to the original is tenuous. A striking example of this approach is Norman Malcolm's famous and influential 1954 review of Philosophical Investigations, which was commonly taken as an accurate representation of Wittgenstein's own thinking and formed the target of many “refutations”.)

1.1 Recent Developments and Their Consequences

Interpretation of Wittgenstein started to become even more complex at the close of the twentieth century, as commentators began to focus on broad questions of method. In both Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus and Philosophical Investigations there is a tension between some statements that seem to be stating controversial philosophical positions and others that seem to be saying that philosophy ought not to offer controversial theses but only work with what we already know by being competent language users embedded in human circumstances. In the latter book there are passages that seem to support an anti-philosophical position and others that seem to offer interesting new philosophical views in the process of criticizing more traditional philosophical doctrines such as foundationalism and Cartesianism. Along these lines, two overlapping distinctions concerning how to read Philosophical Investigations have arisen: the resolute–substantial distinction, and the Pyrrhonian–non-Pyrrhonian distinction. In general, the resolute and Pyrrhonian readings make Wittgenstein out to be an anti-philosopher, one who is not offering positive philosophical theses to replace false ones; rather, his goal is to show the nonsensical nature of traditional philosophical theorizing. It is this goal that is partly responsible for the unique style of Philosophical Investigations (its dialogical and, at least at times, anti-dogmatic, therapeutic character). On the substantial and non-Pyrrhonian readings, Wittgenstein is not only presenting a method for exposing the errors of traditional philosophers, but also showing how philosophy should rightly be done and thereby offering positive philosophical views, views which must often be inferred or reconstructed from an elusive text.

There is neither a single resolute/Pyrrhonian nor a single substantial/non-Pyrrhonian reading of Wittgenstein. Moreover, there is an important difference between the resolute–substantial and Pyrrhonian–non-Pyrrhonian distinctions. The former distinction arises from a continuing debate on how to read Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, both on its own and in relation to Philosophical Investigations (see, e.g., Conant 2004 and Mulhall 2007), and is associated with the so-called New Wittgensteinians (see, e.g., Crary and Read 2000). The Pyrrhonian and non-Pyrrhonian discussion is to be found, for example, in Fogelin (1994), Sluga (2004), and Stern (2004, 2007), and concerns the ways in which Wittgenstein might be considered as writing in the tradition of the ancient Pyrrhonian sceptics, who were philosophically sceptical about the very possibility of philosophy (see Fogelin 1994, pp. 3ff and 205ff). These distinctions cut across the distinction between Orthodox and Kripkean non-orthodox readings of the text: both Orthodox and Kripkean non-orthodox interpreters have tended to offer substantial or non-Pyrrhonian readings of Wittgenstein — though the line may not always be clear and some (e.g., Hacker, 1990) move from a resolute/Pyrrhonian to a substantial/non-Pyrrhonian reading without remarking the fact.

Some (Fogelin, Stern, and Mulhall, for example) have come to question whether it makes sense to suppose that either one or the other, resolute/Pyrrhonian or substantial/non-Pyrrhonian, must be the correct way to read Wittgenstein. Fogelin and Stern see the tension in the text of Philosophical Investigations as the expression of a tension, indeed a struggle, within its author, between his wanting to uncover the ‘disguised nonsense’ of philosophical theses and his being tempted and drawn into still other philosophical positions on the nature of language, reference, private experience, and philosophy itself. In what is surely a reference to §133c — which reads: ‘The real discovery is the one that makes me capable of stopping doing philosophy when I want to.—The one that gives philosophy peace, so that it is no longer tormented by questions which bring itself in question’ — Wittgenstein is reported by Rush Rhees to have said ‘In my book I say that I am able to leave off with a problem in philosophy when I want to. But that's a lie; I can't’ (Rhees, 1984, p. 219 n. 7). According to Stern, the Wittgenstein of the Philosophical Investigations is more Pyrrhonian than not, while understanding all too acutely the attraction of philosophy and the difficulty of giving it up. One's stance on these matters affects how one reads the private language sections, in particular by raising the question whether Wittgenstein intends to argue that the positive claim of the possibility of a private language is false, or is some kind of nonsense.

1.2 Are Claims Affirming the Possibility of a Private Language False or Nonsense?

If someone were to insist that a private language is possible, one way to argue against him would be by employing the method of reductio ad absurdum: assume that it is true that a private language is possible, show that that assumption leads to certain absurdities or a contradiction, and then conclude that it is actually false that a private language is possible. This is the way in which the argument was typically understood. But this understanding has come into question. In contrast to his earlier commentaries, for example, Gordon Baker has since called into question whether the private language sections should not be read as attempting to show that the notion of a private language is intelligible but false, but rather that it is nonsense masquerading as an important possibility (Baker, 1998).

There is, however, in Wittgenstein's thinking an inclination to think of contradiction in terms of the disintegration of sense, so that even argument by reductio might be understood not in terms of falsehood. (The appearance of this inclination in Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus, for example, is well mapped by Fogelin [1976, Ch. IV].) And it is characteristic of Wittgenstein to talk of philosophical error in terms of nonsense. In §119 of Philosophical Investigations he wrote, e.g., ‘The results of philosophy are the uncovering of one or another piece of plain nonsense and of bumps that the understanding has got by running its head against the limits of language. These bumps make us see the value of the discovery.’ And in §464: ‘My aim is: to teach you to pass from a piece of disguised nonsense to something that is patent nonsense.’ In the discussion of the possibility of a private language it may well at first seem as though we understand the possibility under consideration. After all we seem to understand the the question in §256, ‘Now, what about the language which describes my inner experiences and which only I myself can understand?’ But is Wittgenstein suggesting we only seem to understand this question?

The matter may not be clear. Shortly after the main private language sections, the following remark occurs as part of a dialogue, ‘It comes to this: only of a living human being and what resembles (behaves like) a living human being can one say: it has sensations; it sees; is blind; hears; is deaf; is conscious or unconscious’ (§281). The dialogue continues in §282:

“But in a fairy tale the pot too can see and hear!” (Certainly; but it can also talk.)

“But the fairy tale only invents what is not the case: it does not talk nonsense.”—It is not as simple as that. Is it false or nonsensical to say that a pot talks? Have we a clear picture of the circumstances in which we should say of a pot that it talked? (Even a nonsense-poem is not nonsense in the same way as the babbling of a child.)

Here the question of how the Investigations is to be read intrudes. For example, part of the distinction between what Mulhall calls resolute and substantial readings of Wittgenstein concerns the sense in which Wittgenstein aimed to ‘overcome our attraction to the idea that there is something that we cannot do in philosophy’ (Mulhall, 2007, p. 8; cf. Philosophical Investigations §374). Mulhall claims that that idea goes against the moral of Investigations §500: ‘When a sentence is called senseless, it is not as it were its sense that is senseless. But a combination of words is being excluded from the language, withdrawn from circulation.’ Further, this substantial reading attributes to Wittgenstein an implicit philosophical theory of meaning, ‘of the (now grammatical) conditions of sense — quite as if our everyday abilities to distinguish sense from nonsense require at the very least a philosophical grounding or foundation (perhaps a criterial semantics, or a theory of language-games, or an anthropology of the human life form’ (Mulhall, 2007, p. 9). By contrast, on a resolute reading of Philosophical Investigations, Wittgenstein's appeal to the notion of a grammatical investigation involves the deployment of ‘our everyday capacity to distinguish sense from nonsense in a philosophical context, and hence as depriving itself of any claim to expertise or authority that exceeds that form of practical ability — an ability that can equally well be laid claim to by any competent speaker, and hence by any philosophical interlocutor’ (ibid., p. 10). Further, the resolute reading is especially firm in rejecting the idea that there is something determinate that we cannot do, the idea that there is something, namely, a private language, that cannot be achieved; there is not a limitation on language. Rather, the idea is simply nonsense, or as Mulhall later puts it (ibid. p. 18): no sense can be given to the idea of a philosophically substantial private language.

Though Mulhall claims that the private language sections can justifiably be read either resolutely or substantially — because ‘each reading can ... point to an aspect of the text that it fully acknowledges, and whose proper acknowledgement by the other is at the very least an issue for it, it would seem profitless to insist that one reading is essentially faithful to Wittgenstein's text and the other intrinsically faithless’ (ibid., p. 20) — it is plain that he thinks the resolute reading is to be preferred. However, we may not need to choose. We might view the private language sections as Wittgenstein's asking, ‘Do we have a clear picture of the circumstances in which we should say that someone spoke a private language?’ The line of reasoning that follows §243 can be read as various attempts to achieve a clear picture of what it might mean to speak a private language, where the attempts ultimately fail, with the result that what at first sight seemed intelligible (‘a language which describes my inner experiences and which only I myself can understand’) turns out not to be intelligible after all. And in so far as we cannot make intelligible the circumstances in which there could be a private language, we should say that the idea of a private language is nonsense. However, as we saw above, in §282 Wittgenstein indicates that the border between nonsense and falsehood is itself unclear; and moreover, in trying to make sense of the possibility of a private language, we may find, in different parts of the chain of reasoning, suggestions of falsehood as well as of nonsensicality.

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2. The Significance of the Issue

The issue's significance can be seen by considering how the argument is embedded in the structure of Philosophical Investigations. Immediately prior to the introduction of the argument (§§241f), Wittgenstein suggests that the existence of the rules governing the use of language and making communication possible depends on agreement in human behaviour — such as the uniformity in normal human reaction which makes it possible to train most children to look at something by pointing at it. (Unlike cats, which react in a seemingly random variety of ways to pointing.) One function of the private language argument is to show that not only actual languages but the very possibility of language and concept formation depends on the possibility of such agreement.

Another, related, function is to oppose the idea that metaphysical absolutes are within our reach, that we can find at least part of the world as it really is in the sense that any other way of conceiving that part must be wrong (cf. Philosophical Investigations p. 230). Philosophers are especially tempted to suppose that numbers and sensations are examples of such absolutes, self-identifying objects which themselves force upon us the rules for the use of their names. Wittgenstein discusses numbers in earlier sections on rules (185–242). Some of his points have analogues in his discussion of sensations, for there is a common underlying confusion about how the act of meaning determines the future application of a formula or name. In the case of numbers, one temptation is to confuse the mathematical sense of ‘determine’ in which, say, the formula y = 2x determines the numerical value of y for a given value of x (in contrast with y > 2x, which does not) with a causal sense in which a certain training in mathematics determines that normal people will always write the same value for y given both the first formula and a value for x — in contrast with creatures for which such training might produce a variety of outcomes (cf. §189). This confusion produces the illusion that the result of an actual properly conducted calculation is the inevitable outcome of the mathematical determining, as though the formula's meaning itself were shaping the course of events.

In the case of sensations, the parallel temptation is to suppose that they are self-intimating. Itching, for example, seems like this: one just feels what it is directly; if one then gives the sensation a name, the rules for that name's subsequent use are already determined by the sensation itself. Wittgenstein tries to show that this impression is illusory, that even itching derives its identity only from a sharable practice of expression, reaction and use of language. If itching were a metaphysical absolute, forcing its identity upon me in the way described, then the possibility of such a shared practice would be irrelevant to the concept of itching: the nature of itching would be revealed to me in a single mental act of naming it (the kind of mental act which Russell called ‘acquaintance’); all subsequent facts concerning the use of the name would be irrelevant to how that name was meant; and the name could be private. The private language argument is intended to show that such subsequent facts could not be irrelevant, that no names could be private, and that the notion of having the true identity of a sensation revealed in a single act of acquaintance is a confusion.

The suggestion that a language could be private in the way described appears most openly in the second of Bertrand Russell's published lectures ‘The Philosophy of Logical Atomism’, where Russell says:

In a logically perfect language, there will be one word and no more for every simple object, and everything that is not simple will be expressed by a combination of words, by a combination derived, of course, from the words for the simple things that enter in, one word for each simple component. A language of that sort will be completely analytic, and will show at a glance the logical structure of the facts asserted or denied. … A logically perfect language, if it could be constructed, would not only be intolerably prolix, but, as regards its vocabulary, would be very largely private to one speaker. That is to say, all the names that it would use would be private to that speaker and could not enter into the language of another speaker.

… A name, in the narrow logical sense of a word whose meaning is a particular, can only be applied to a particular with which the speaker is acquainted, because you cannot name anything you are not acquainted with.

… One can use ‘this’ as a name to stand for a particular with which one is acquainted at the moment. We say ‘This is white’. … But if you try to apprehend the proposition that I am expressing when I say ‘This is white’, you cannot do it. If you mean this piece of chalk as a physical object, then you are not using a proper name. It is only when you use ‘this’ quite strictly, to stand for an actual object of sense [i.e., a sense-datum], that it is really a proper name. And in that it has a very odd property for a proper name, namely that it seldom means the same thing two moments running and does not mean the same thing to the speaker and to the hearer.

… [I]n order to understand a name for a particular, the only thing necessary is to be acquainted with that particular. When you are acquainted with that particular, you have a full, adequate and complete understanding of the name, and no further information is required.

Although Wittgenstein does not explicitly say so, it is likely that this is the inspiration of his argument: his writing is marked in many places by criticism of Russell, both explicit and otherwise.

But the idea of a private language is more usually hidden: the confusions supposed to belong to it allegedly underlie a range of articulated philosophical notions and theories, without themselves being so articulated. The argument is thus perhaps most profitably read as targeting, not any particular theory, but rather the motivation for considering a range of apparently independent or even competing theories along with their associated tasks, problems and solutions.

For example, a still very common idea, often attributed to John Locke and openly embraced by Jerry Fodor in the nineteen seventies, is that interpersonal spoken communication works by speakers' translation of their internal mental vocabularies into sounds followed by hearers' re-translation into their own internal vocabularies. Again, Descartes considered himself able to talk to himself about his experiences while claiming to be justified in saying that he does not know (or not until he has produced a reassuring philosophical argument) anything at all about an external world conceived as something independent of them. And he and others have thought: while I may make mistakes about the external world, I can infallibly avoid error if I confine my judgments to my immediate sensations. (Compare The Principles of Philosophy, I, 9.) Again, many philosophers, including John Stuart Mill, have supposed there to be a problem of other minds, according to which I may reasonably doubt the legitimacy of applying, say, sensation-words to beings other than myself.

In each of these examples, the implication is that the internal vehicle of my musings could in principle be private (as Kenny [1966, p. 369] showed, this vehicle does not have to be a language for the argument to apply to it): for these problems and theories even to make sense, sharability must be irrelevant to meaning and it must be at least conceivable that my knowledge, even my understanding, is necessarily confined to my own case. The implication is of course often denied. The terms of Fodor's language of thought, for example, are supposed to be able to refer to public objects. But the question is, on what basis does this ability rest? However this question should be answered, Fodor himself was concerned enough about Wittgenstein's argument to try to show both that it did not apply to his views and — apparently superfluously — that it is not a good argument anyway (Fodor pp. 68–73). The matter is clearer with Descartes (compare Kenny 1966): for his sceptical question to be raised without being immediately self-defeating, he must hold it possible to identify his experiences inwardly — where ‘inwardly’ means without relying on resources supplied by his essential embodiment in a world whose existence is independent of his own mind and accessible to others (e.g., such resources as the concepts acquired in a normal upbringing). The question which accordingly looms large in the private language argument is: How is this identification of one's experiences to be achieved?

However, it cannot be emphasized too strongly that the significance of the private language argument does not rest on the scholarly detail of whether this or that thinker can be correctly described as committed to the idea. The target is a way of thinking which generates philosophical theories, not the theories themselves.

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3. The Private Language Argument Expounded

3.1 Preliminaries

As already noted, the private language sections of Philosophical Investigations are usually held to begin at §243 (though we shall see that Wittgenstein relies on points made much earlier in the book). The methodological issues canvassed above arise at the outset, in the interpretation of §243's crucial second paragraph.

On a substantial/non-Pyrrhonian reading, Wittgenstein begins to clarify what kind of philosophically important notion of private language is to be examined, i.e., one that is necessarily private and which refers to one's immediate private sensations. In the remarks that follow, Wittgenstein argues that the idea of such a private language is nonsensical or incoherent because it is a violation of grammar (i.e., Wittgenstein draws on his substantive views on meaning).

On a resolute/Pyrrhonian reading, it is emphasized that the reader is asked in the first sentence of the second paragraph whether one can actually imagine a language for one's inner experiences, for private use. Wittgenstein at this point reminds the interlocutor that we already use ordinary language for that. But the interlocutor quickly replies in the last three lines of §243 that what he is asking is whether we can imagine a private language that refers to what only the speaker can know. In the following sections, Wittgenstein examines ‘whether there is a way of meaning the words of the penultimate sentence [of §243] that does not simply return us to a banality, whether in fact his interlocutor means anything in particular with those words’ (Mulhall 2007, p. 18). The question is whether the notion of a language ‘which only I myself can understand’ can be given any substantial meaning to begin with. On this latter reading, §§258 and 270, for example, are attempts to give the interlocutor what he says he wants, but which, in the end, amount to nothing (in the case of 258) or bring us back to a publicly understandable language (in the case of 270).

As we saw above, in section 1.2, it is not clear that we must choose between these two readings. On either, the point of the private language argument is that the idea is exposed as unintelligible when pressed — we cannot make sense of the circumstances in which we should say that someone is using a private language.

So, having introduced the idea of a private language in the way already quoted, Wittgenstein goes on to argue in a preliminary discussion (§§244–255) that there are two senses of ‘private’ which a philosopher might have in mind in suggesting that sensations are private, and that sensations as they are talked about in natural languages (such as English and German) are in fact private in neither of them. He then turns, at §256, to the question whether there could be a private language at all. He continues to talk of sensations, and of pain as an example, but one should remember that these are not our sensations, the everyday facts of human existence, but the supposed exemplars of philosophical accounts of the everyday facts. Thus, for instance, they might be the sensations of something like a Cartesian soul (perhaps one associated with a physical body, as indicated in §§257 and 283), something which has no publicly available mental life and whose “experiences” are accordingly private. (It is worth noting that the Anscombe translation is misleading here: in §243, for example, where the idea of a private language is introduced, it loses the crucial contrast, so evident in the original German, between the ordinary human beings described as solitary speakers in the first paragraph and the second paragraph's mysterious ‘one’ who is the ‘speaker’ of a private language and whose nature is carefully left unclear. See the translation of part of this paragraph, in the first sentence of this article, to find a version closer to the original.) Consistent with this point is that in §256 Wittgenstein suggests that one cannot arrive at the idea of a private language by considering a natural language: natural languages are not private, for our sensations are expressed. But neither can we arrive at the idea by starting with a natural language and just subtracting from it all expression of sensations (temporary paralysis is clearly not in question), as he considers next, for as he says in §257, even if there could be language in such a situation as this where teaching is impossible, the earlier argument of Philosophical Investigations (§§33–35), concerning ostensive definition, has shown that mere “mental association” of one thing with another is not alone enough to make the one into a name of the other. Naming one's sensation requires a place for the new word: that is, a notion of sensation. The attempt to name a sensation in a conceptual vacuum merely raises the questions of what this business is supposed to consist in, and what is its point. But, for the sake of getting to the heart of the matter, Wittgenstein puts the first of these questions on one side and pretends that it is sufficient for the second to imagine himself in the position of establishing a private language for the purpose of keeping a diary of his sensations.

However, to investigate the possibility of the imagined diary case by exploring it from the inside (the only way, he thinks, really to expose the confusions involved) requires him to use certain words when it is just the right to use these words which is in question. Thus he is forced to mention in §258 examples like ostensive definition, concentrating the attention, speaking, writing, remembering, believing and so on, in the very process of suggesting that none of these can really occur in the situation under consideration (§261).

This difficulty has often gone unnoticed by commentators on the argument, with particularly unhappy results for the understanding of the discussion of the diary example. Fogelin [1976], for instance, a paradigm representative of Orthodoxy, treats this as a case where he himself, a living embodied human being, keeps a diary and records the occurrences of a sensation which he finds it impossible to describe to anyone else. But we are not to assume that the description of the keeping of the diary is a description of a possible or even ultimately intelligible case. In particular, we are not to think of such a human being's keeping a real diary, but of something like the Cartesian internal equivalent. It is thus vital to the argument that the diary case is presented in the first person, without our pressing the question, ‘Who is speaking?’ At this stage we are simply not to worry about whether the diary story ultimately makes sense or not. But the fact that it may not make sense must be remembered in reading what follows, which in strictness should constantly be disfigured with scare quotes. (We shall, as we have already, occasionally supply them as a reminder, reserving double quotes for this purpose.)

To summarize the argument's preliminary stage: In §256 Wittgenstein asked of the “private language”, ‘How do I use words to stand for my sensations?’, and reminded us in §257 that we cannot answer ‘As we ordinarily do’. So this question, which is the same question as ‘How do I obtain meaning for the expressions in a “private language”?’ is still open; and the answer must be independent of our actual connections between words and sensations. In the attempt to arrive at an answer, and explore the question in its full depth, he temporarily allows the use of the notions of sensation and diary-keeping (despite the objections of §257), and imagines himself in the position of a private linguist recording his sensations in a diary. The aim is to show that even if this concession is made, meaning for a sensation-word still cannot be secured and maintained by such a linguist. The crucial central part of the argument begins here, at §258.

3.2 The Central Argument

Wittgenstein points out of the diary case ‘first of all that a definition of the sign cannot be formulated’. (The translation here obscures the reason why. Wittgenstein's word is ‘aussprechen’, better translated as ‘expressed’ than ‘formulated’: the point follows by definition from the fact that the case is one where the definition is private.) So if meaning is to be obtained for the “sign”, this must be achieved through a private exercise of ostensive definition, where I concentrate on the sensation and produce the sign at the same time. (In these circumstances, meaning cannot be extracted from a pre-existing practice of private use, since what is in question is how such a use could be established in the first place.) But if this exercise is to be genuine and successful ostensive definition, it must establish the connection between sign and sensation, and this connection must persist. As Wittgenstein says, ‘“I impress [the connection] on myself” can only mean: this process brings it about that I remember the connection right in the future’. For I do not define anything, even to myself let alone anyone else, by merely attending to something and making a mark, unless this episode has the appropriate consequences.

3.3 Interlude: the Rejection of Orthodoxy

At this point we should suspend our exposition of the argument, in order to examine closely the remark ‘this process brings it about that I remember the connection right in the future’.

This remark has usually been interpreted as a demand that, for the sign ‘S’ to have been given a meaning, it must always figure thereafter (if used affirmatively and sincerely) as a true statement: that is, I must use the sign ‘S’ affirmatively only when I really do have the sensation S. And it has usually been thought that the subsequent argument concerns the adequacy of memory to ensure that I do not later misidentify my sensations and call a different kind of sensation ‘S’ in the future. This account of the argument and its history is summed up by Anthony Kenny as follows:

Many philosophers have taken ‘I remember the connection right’ to mean ‘I use “S” when and only when I really have S’. They then take Wittgenstein's argument to be based on scepticism about memory: how can you be sure that you have remembered aright when next you call a sensation ‘S’? …

Critics of Wittgenstein have found the argument, so interpreted, quite unconvincing. Surely, they say, the untrustworthiness of memory presents no more and no less a problem for the user of a private language than for the user of a public one. No, Wittgenstein's defenders have said, for memory-mistakes about public objects may be corrected, memory-mistakes about private sensations cannot; and where correction is impossible, talk of correctness is out of place. At this point critics of Wittgenstein have either denied that truth demands corrigibility, or have sought to show that checking is possible in the private case too. (Kenny[ 1973] pp. 191–2)

This interplay of criticism and defence characterizes the Orthodox interpretation of the argument. (See Fogelin [1976], pp. 162–4, for a good example.) There seem to be at least two reasons why this interpretation should have become established. First, philosophers committed to the idea of a private language are often looking for an arrangement in which mistakes of fact are impossible; that is, they are trying to overcome scepticism by finding absolute certainty. (Descartes is the example usually cited.) And this would make sceptical arguments appear to be natural weapons to use in reply to them. (See, e.g., Fogelin [1976] p. 153.) Secondly, it is plausible — which is not the same as correct — to suppose that one cannot be mistaken concerning the natures of one's present sensations, and a supposed proof that the idea of a private language entails that one is just as fallible on this subject as on any other could thus seem crippling to that idea.

But, as Kenny first showed, the question of factual infallibility in future uses of the sign ‘S’ is not the issue. If we look closely at §258, we see that ‘I remember the connection right’ refers to remembering a meaning, namely, the meaning of the sign ‘S’, not to making sure that I infallibly apply ‘S’ only to S's in the future. (Nor does the private language argument depend on taking the latter to be an effect of the former.)

3.4 The Central Argument Continued

Now that we are clearer about what the connection is which has to be remembered right, we can return to the exposition of the argument. I am to imagine that I am a private linguist. I have a sensation, and make the mark ‘S’ at the same time, as I might in an ordinary case introduce a sign by ostensive definition. Afterwards, I “believe” myself to have established a meaning for this sign ‘S’, and I now use it to judge that I am again experiencing the same sensation. What do I mean by ‘S’ on this second occasion? Wittgenstein considers two possible answers.

The First Answer

One of the answers is that what I mean by ‘S’ is just the sort of sensation I am now having. Of this Wittgenstein says merely:

… whatever is going to seem right to me is right. And that only means that here we can't talk about ‘right’.

The point is highly condensed. Here is a more explicit version. For there to be factual assertion, there must be the distinction between truth and falsehood, between saying what is the case and saying what is not. For there to be the distinction between truth and falsehood, there must be a further distinction between the source of the meaning, and the source of the truth, of what is said. Suppose that I confront some object and say of it ‘This is S’. If I must also appeal to this very object to make this utterance intelligible to myself, I deprive it of any claim to the status of factual assertion — it becomes, at best, ostensive definition. (The ‘at best’ is important here, for the same reason that the diary example is not to be assumed genuinely possible.)

The Second Answer

The second answer Wittgenstein considers to the question of what I mean by ‘S’ is this: I mean by ‘S’, not this current sensation, but the sensation I named ‘S’ in the past. We have already seen, in Kenny's rejection of the Orthodox reading of the argument, that scepticism about memory has no place in the discussion of “private language”; the text simply does not support it. But at this point we must break with Kenny too. For according to his account the crucial claim becomes: ‘If it is possible for me to misremember my previous ostensive definition of “S”, then I do not really know what “S” means.’ (See, e.g., Kenny [1973] p. 194.) This is just conventional scepticism about memory extended to include meanings as well as judgments. And it is an elementary point of epistemology that knowing something does not obviously entail just as a result of the definition of knowledge that it is impossible for one to be wrong about that thing, only that one is not in fact wrong.

What has gone wrong? The answer is that Kenny's and the Orthodox accounts share an unnoticed assumption: that even in the circumstances of the “private language” there is actually an application of a sign to a private sensation by a private linguist. The problem as Kenny then conceives it is one of later remembering this earlier application in order that ‘S’ should have retained its meaning. The question then seems to be whether one's admittedly fallible memory is adequate for the maintenance of meaning. But why should this assumption be allowed? What entitles us to assume that a private linguist could even ostensively define his sign to himself in the first place? As we have seen, this is one of the matters in question; and §§260 and 261 show that Wittgenstein was not prepared to let an argument in favour of private language proceed from this assumption. In these two sections Wittgenstein reminds us that his arguments in the earlier sections (e.g., 33–35) of Philosophical Investigations showed that ostensive definition was not achieved by any performance unless certain circumstantial conditions are fulfilled; and nothing about the diary case as so far described shows them to be fulfilled. It is only later (§§270–271) that Wittgenstein imagines a partial fulfilment of them, and the result there is to render the language public.

One cause of the muddle is Wittgenstein's insistence that there must be a distinction between obeying a rule and merely thinking that one has. This does not result, as the Orthodox have supposed, in a demand for, and eventual rejection of, ‘memory-infallibility in a private language’: demand and rejection being based respectively on the grounds that without infallibility one could always be going wrong and would never know if one were, and with infallibility one would collapse the distinction between obeying a rule and merely thinking one was obeying it. Rather, the argument is this. The private linguist cannot legislate a meaning for a sign by “private ostensive definition” merely — for this has to establish a technique of using the sign (§260). The technique cannot function by means of repeated “ostensive definitions”, as we saw in examining the first answer, since this collapses the distinction between meaning and truth and thus destroys the possibility of making factual judgments. So the so-called “definition” has on some other basis to establish a constancy in use of the sign.

But this is just what is in question. What would be constancy here? What would be using the sign in the same way as before? How was the sign used in the first place? As there cannot be assumed to be a way of using the sign which the linguist succeeds even in determining, let alone establishing, and which is the correct way, independent of the linguist's later impression of the correct way, then a defender of “private language” would have to show that there was. It might now seem as if one could show this by appealing to the private linguist's memory. He simply remembers how he used the sign before. And this looks straightforward enough, because one thinks: he certainly did something before, for he remembers it. And we do not require his memory to be infallible. But the memory does at least have to be a memory: that is, accurate or not, it has to be of something determinate which existed independently of the memory of it; and the “memory” alone cannot bring such a thing into existence.

This is the argument of §265, which has often been mistakenly given an epistemological interpretation. Again we cannot assume that there has been an actual table (even a mental one) of meanings in the case of the private linguist, a table which is now recalled and about which the linguist must rely on recall since the original has gone. Rather, as §§260–264 show, there may be nothing determinate other than this “remembering of the table”. So when we think that a private linguist could remember the meaning of ‘S’ by remembering a past correlation of the sign ‘S’ with a sensation, we are supposing what needs to be itself established — that there was indeed some independent correlation to be remembered. Fallibility of memory, even of memory of meaning, is neither here nor there: the point is not that there is doubt now about the trustworthiness of memory, but that there was doubt then about the status of what occurred. And this original, non-epistemological, doubt cannot later be removed by “recollections” of a status inherently dubious in the first place. That is, if there was no genuine original correlation in the first place, a “memory” will not create one. But if, alternatively, we do not suppose that there was something independent of the memory to be remembered, again ‘what seems right is right’; the “memory” of the “correlation” is being employed to confirm itself, for there is no independent access to the “remembered correlation”. (Not even the independent access that we have as posers of the example, since the question is, can we pose such an example? The typical mistake commentators make here is to disguise the problem by thinking of S in terms of some already established concept, such as pain, which they bring to the example themselves.) This is why Wittgenstein says in §265, ‘As if someone were to buy several copies of the morning paper to assure himself that what it said was true’.

The Closing Stages

So far the argument has been conducted in terms of an ‘I’ not essentially related to body or related only to an inert body. At §269, however, it moves to examples where there is bodily behaviour but despite this there is still the temptation to think of private meanings for words independent of their public use. This suggests a further chance for a defender of the idea of a private language: that a private linguist might secure a meaning for his sign ‘S’ by correlating its private use with some public phenomenon. This would apparently serve to provide a function for the noting of ‘S’ in the diary (§260) and thus give a place for ostensive definition, and would give as well a guarantee that there is some constancy in the linguist's use of the term ‘S’ independent of his impression of such constancy. Wittgenstein uses the example of the manometer in §§270–271 to consider this idea, and his criticism of it is in effect that this method of securing meaning works, but that the secured meaning is public: the so-called “private object”, even if there were such a thing, is revealed to be irrelevant to meaning. Presumably a defender of “private language” would hope that the example would work like this: if I keep saying, on the basis of my sensation, that my blood pressure is rising, and the manometer shows that I am right, then this success in judging my own blood pressure shows that I had in fact established a private meaning for the sign ‘S’ and was using the sign in the same way each time to judge that my sensation was the same each time. However, all the example really shows is that just thinking that I have the same sensation now as I had when my blood pressure rose formerly, can be a good guide to the rising of my blood pressure. Whether in some “private sense” the sensation was “actually the same” or not becomes completely irrelevant to the question of constancy in the use of ‘S’ — that is, there is no gap between the actual nature of the sensation and my impression of it, and ‘S’ in this case could mean merely ‘sensation of the rising of the blood pressure’; indeed, for all we are told of the sign's role, it could even mean just ‘blood pressure rising’.

3.5 Are the Orthodox Objections Met?

Does the ruling out of memory-scepticism as irrelevant to the private language argument mean that two associated Orthodox objections to it are likewise irrelevant? The first of these is that the argument, self-defeatingly, rules out a public language as well. The second relies on the ‘community view’ interpretation: it is that the argument, equally self-defeatingly, rules out as impossible something perfectly conceivable: namely, the case of a so-called ‘Robinson Crusoe’, a human being who, unlike Defoe's original Crusoe, is isolated from birth but devises a language for his own purposes without his having first been taught another language by someone else. Wittgenstein's Orthodox defenders, faced with this second objection, looked to be on shaky ground, often being forced into the position of conceding that the argument did indeed exclude the case, but claiming (not very plausibly) that such a Crusoe is after all impossible so that the concession was not damaging.

The question as it concerns the first objection has already been answered. The supposed threat to public language arose entirely from the claim that memory-scepticism could not be confined to the private case. But since scepticism concerning memory is no part of the argument, there is no reason to suppose that any question of such confinement arises, and thus there is no question of the argument's being self-defeating by excluding the possibility of something we know to be actual, i.e., the language we already have. Now showing the absence of any appeal to memory-scepticism involved transferring the burden of the argument from the question of whether or not an ostensive definition could be remembered or not to the question of whether there could be an ostensive definition in the first place.

This enables us to answer the question as it concerns the second objection. It is clear that an argument which has as its focus the question of ostensive definition is not committed to ruling out in advance all hypothetical cases of ‘Robinson Crusoes’. For there is no a priori barrier to imagining a form of life complex enough for us to be assured that a determinate ostensive definition had been accomplished by such a being. Such a Crusoe, unlike a private linguist, lives in a world independent of his impressions of it, and thus there could be definite occurrences in it which he could remember or forget; and some of those occurrences could be correlations of signs with objects. It is easy to describe such hypothetical cases (a clear example appears in pages 486–8 of Canfield [1996]), and difficult to give a plausible denial that in some sense they are possible. There are, however, further complications here, described briefly in section 4 below.

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4. Kripke's Sceptical Wittgenstein

The Orthodox domination of the secondary literature on private language was largely ended by Saul Kripke's account of Wittgenstein's treatment of rules and private language, in which Wittgenstein appears as a sceptic concerning meaning. Kripke (p. 5) denies commitment to the identity of this sceptical figure with its historical source, and, appropriately, his account has spawned a literature of its own in which discussion often proceeds largely independently of the original private language argument: Kripke's Wittgenstein, real or fictional, has become a philosopher in his own right, and for many people, it is not an issue whether the historical Wittgenstein's original ideas about private language are faithfully captured in this version. The complexities of the subsequent discussion of the philosophical — as opposed to interpretative — questions raised by Kripke's Wittgenstein need a separate article to themselves. (For a survey, see Boghossian [1989].) All that will be settled here is the interpretative question.

Kripke's account resembles that given here in its rejection of Orthodoxy and in its emphasis on the logical priority of Wittgenstein's discussion of rule-following to that of private language. It differs in the prominence it gives to the opening sentence of Philosophical Investigations §201: ‘This was our paradox: no course of action could be determined by a rule, because every course of action can be made out to accord with the rule.’ Kripke says of this (p. 68), ‘The impossibility of private language emerges as a corollary of [Wittgenstein's] sceptical solution of his own paradox’. Wittgenstein himself immediately brushed this “paradox” aside in his very next paragraph: ‘It can be seen that there is a misunderstanding here …’; but Kripke takes the paradox to pose a genuine and profound sceptical problem about meaning.

The example Kripke chooses to illustrate the problem is that of addition. What is it to grasp the rule of addition? The application of the rule is potentially infinite, and bizarre interpretations of the rule, as well as the standard use of it, are compatible with any finite set of applications of the usual sort such as 7 + 14 = 21. So what is it which makes it true that when I say ‘plus’ I mean the usual addition function and not some other? Kripke (pp. 62–71) understands this question as containing a Humean problem to which, he claims, Wittgenstein gives a Humean, ‘sceptical’ solution.

What Kripke means by this comparison with a Humean problem is that Wittgenstein is questioning the nexus between a past act of meaning and subsequent practice in a way analogous to that in which Hume questions the causal nexus between a single past event and a subsequent one. And what he means by a Humean solution is that there is a corresponding analogy between the ways in which Hume and Wittgenstein handle their respective problems. Kripke's view is that, just as Hume says, in effect, “Unique causation is unintelligible; A's causing B consists in A's being embedded in a pattern of the following of A-type-events by B-type-events which inclines us to assert that A caused B”, so, comparably, Wittgenstein says, in effect, “Unique meaning is unintelligible; rather, someone's meaning the usual addition function when saying ‘plus’ consists in their being considered by a community to have passed the community's test for employing that function.”

Kripke formulates the so-called Humean problem in two different ways.

The first way is this: “[T]here is no fact about me that distinguishes my meaning a definite function by ‘plus’ … and my meaning nothing at all” (p. 21). The absence of this fact, in Kripke's view, leads Wittgenstein to abandon the explanation of the meanings of statements like “By ‘plus’, I meant addition” in terms of truth-conditions, and to replace it with explanation in terms of assertibility-conditions, which involve actual (not merely potential) community agreement. (Hence the claim that this is a ‘sceptical solution’: Wittgenstein is supposed to concede to the sceptic the absence of truth-conditions for such statements.) This agreement, on Kripke's account, legitimizes the assertion that I meant addition by ‘plus’ despite there having been no fact of the matter.

This requirement of community agreement for meaning (the ‘community view’) obviously rules out the possibility of private language immediately, thereby rendering the argument of Philosophical Investigations §§256–271 superfluous. This superfluity makes for an odd reading of the text; and the oddness is highlighted by the observation that this first formulation of the sceptical problem relies on Kripke's assumption that we have some idea of what a fact is, independent of a statement's being true. For one of the themes of Philosophical Investigations is that there is no such idea, that the only route to the identification of facts is through the uses of the expressions in which those facts are stated, uses which give us the truth-conditions. These uses are often very different from what we would expect — hence the impression that truth-conditions are lacking — and it is a matter of some philosophical difficulty to see them clearly.

The other formulation of the problem is this (Kripke p. 62): “Wittgenstein questions the nexus between past ‘intention’ or ‘meanings’ and present practice: for example, between my past ‘intentions’ with regard to ‘plus’ and my present computation … .” The idea is that my grasp of the rule governing the use of ‘plus’ does not determine that I shall produce a unique answer for each of indefinitely many new additions in the future. The impression that something is missing here, though, is a result of just that kind of confusion about determination identified in the section headed ‘The Significance of the Issue’ above.

Kripke's account of the private language argument is thus vitiated by his unargued reliance on ideas which Wittgenstein argued against. This of course does not show that he has not hit upon a new and more interesting notion of private language than that expounded here. Further, his reading of the argument gave new life to the debate over the community view.

4.1 The Community View Revisited

Although, as was just said, the community view is not easily reconciled with part of Wittgenstein's text, the matter is less clear than has been indicated so far. Significantly, even the most careful, insightful and sympathetic of Wittgenstein's commentators have divided on this matter (for example, Malcolm for the community view, and Baker and Hacker against it). The dispute is partly explained by the fact that the original texts (including some from Wittgenstein's manuscripts) seem to point two ways, some supporting the account given above (that the burden of the argument is that language must be potentially social), others the community view that language is essentially social.

That is, textual support can be found for two apparently conflicting exegetical claims:

  1. Language is essentially social.
  2. It is conceptually (even if not psychologically) possible that a lifelong Crusoe (i.e., a human being isolated from birth) should employ some kind of linguistic system and follow rules in so doing.

And the contending parties share the assumption that the conflict is genuine.

There is, however, reason to believe that this assumption is false, for investigation of Wittgenstein's notions of essential, possible and lifelong Crusoe shows that admission of the first claim does not commit him to the denial of the second. To take the first notion: on Wittgenstein's view, while chess is essentially a game for two players, this does not exclude the possibility of playing it against oneself provided such solitary games are not regarded as paradigm instances of chess. Similarly, he can claim that language is essentially social, but still allow the possibility of exceptions provided these are peripheral cases. The issue is complex, and its pursuit would lead away from the current article's purpose of articulating the central text. For a detailed account, the reader is referred to Canfield [1996], to which this section is indebted; it also contains a useful bibliography of the debate over the community view.

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The secondary literature on this topic is enormous. The following list is highly selective, and entries are included by meeting at least one of the following criteria: good representative of a standard reading of the argument; influential source, primary or secondary; useful collection of items meeting one or other of the previous two criteria; useful survey; item making recent and significant progress in the understanding and assessment of the argument; source drawn on in the writing of this article; item mentioned in the main text of this article.

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consciousness | Russell, Bertrand | Wittgenstein, Ludwig