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Bertrand Russell

First published Thu Dec 7, 1995; substantive revision Thu May 1, 2003

Bertrand Arthur William Russell (b.1872 - d.1970) was a British philosopher, logician, essayist, and social critic, best known for his work in mathematical logic and analytic philosophy. His most influential contributions include his defense of logicism (the view that mathematics is in some important sense reducible to logic), and his theories of definite descriptions and logical atomism. Along with G.E. Moore, Russell is generally recognized as one of the founders of analytic philosophy. Along with Kurt Gödel, he is also regularly credited with being one of the two most important logicians of the twentieth century.

Over the course of his long career, Russell made significant contributions, not just to logic and philosophy, but to a broad range of other subjects including education, history, political theory and religious studies. In addition, many of his writings on a wide variety of topics in both the sciences and the humanities have influenced generations of general readers. After a life marked by controversy (including dismissals from both Trinity College, Cambridge, and City College, New York), Russell was awarded the Order of Merit in 1949 and the Nobel Prize for Literature in 1950. Also noted for his many spirited anti-war and anti-nuclear protests, Russell remained a prominent public figure until his death at the age of 97.

Interested readers may also wish to listen to two sound clips of Russell speaking.

A Chronology of Russell's Life

A short chronology of the major events in Russell's life is as follows:

For more detailed information about Russell's life, readers are encouraged to consult Russell's four autobiographical volumes, My Philosophical Development (London: George Allen and Unwin, 1959) and The Autobiography of Bertrand Russell (3 vols, London: George Allen and Unwin, 1967, 1968, 1969). In addition, John Slater's accessible and informative Bertrand Russell (Bristol: Thoemmes, 1994) gives an excellent short introduction to Russell's life, work and influence.

Other sources of biographical information include Ronald Clark's The Life of Bertrand Russell (London: Jonathan Cape, 1975), Ray Monk's Bertrand Russell: The Spirit of Solitude (London: Jonathan Cape, 1996) and Bertrand Russell: The Ghost of Madness (London: Jonathan Cape, 2000), and the first volume of A.D. Irvine's Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments (London: Routledge, 1999).

For a chronology of Russell's major publications, readers are encouraged to consult Russell's Writings below. For a more complete list see A Bibliography of Bertrand Russell (3 vols, London: Routledge, 1994), by Kenneth Blackwell and Harry Ruja. A less detailed, but still comprehensive, list also appears in Paul Arthur Schilpp, The Philosophy of Bertrand Russell, 3rd edn (New York: Harper and Row, 1963), pp. 746-803.

Finally, for a bibliography of the secondary literature surrounding Russell, see A.D. Irvine, Bertrand Russell: Critical Assessments, Vol. 1 (London: Routledge, 1999), pp. 247-312.

Russell's Work in Logic

Russell's contributions to logic and the foundations of mathematics include his discovery of Russell's paradox, his defense of logicism (the view that mathematics is, in some significant sense, reducible to formal logic), his development of the theory of types, and his refining of the first-order predicate calculus.

Russell discovered the paradox that bears his name in 1901, while working on his Principles of Mathematics (1903). The paradox arises in connection with the set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Such a set, if it exists, will be a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself. The paradox is significant since, using classical logic, all sentences are entailed by a contradiction. Russell's discovery thus prompted a large amount of work in logic, set theory, and the philosophy and foundations of mathematics.

Russell's own response to the paradox came with the development of his theory of types in 1903. It was clear to Russell that some restrictions needed to be placed upon the original comprehension (or abstraction) axiom of naive set theory, the axiom that formalizes the intuition that any coherent condition may be used to determine a set (or class). Russell's basic idea was that reference to sets such as the set of all sets that are not members of themselves could be avoided by arranging all sentences into a hierarchy, beginning with sentences about individuals at the lowest level, sentences about sets of individuals at the next lowest level, sentences about sets of sets of individuals at the next lowest level, and so on. Using a vicious circle principle similar to that adopted by the mathematician Henri Poincaré, and his own so-called "no class" theory of classes, Russell was able to explain why the unrestricted comprehension axiom fails: propositional functions, such as the function "x is a set," may not be applied to themselves since self-application would involve a vicious circle. On Russell's view, all objects for which a given condition (or predicate) holds must be at the same level or of the same "type."

Although first introduced in 1903, the theory of types was further developed by Russell in his 1908 article "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types" and in the monumental work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). Thus the theory admits of two versions, the "simple theory" of 1903 and the "ramified theory" of 1908. Both versions of the theory later came under attack for being both too weak and too strong. For some, the theory was too weak since it failed to resolve all of the known paradoxes. For others, it was too strong since it disallowed many mathematical definitions which, although consistent, violated the vicious circle principle. Russell's response was to introduce the axiom of reducibility, an axiom that lessened the vicious circle principle's scope of application, but which many people claimed was too ad hoc to be justified philosophically.

Of equal significance during this period was Russell's defense of logicism, the theory that mathematics was in some important sense reducible to logic. First defended in his 1901 article "Recent Work on the Principles of Mathematics," and then later in greater detail in his Principles of Mathematics and in Principia Mathematica, Russell's logicism consisted of two main theses. The first was that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of that of logic. The second was that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of those of logic.

Like Gottlob Frege, Russell's basic idea for defending logicism was that numbers may be identified with classes of classes and that number-theoretic statements may be explained in terms of quantifiers and identity. Thus the number 1 would be identified with the class of all unit classes, the number 2 with the class of all two-membered classes, and so on. Statements such as "There are two books" would be recast as statements such as "There is a book, x, and there is a book, y, and x is not identical to y." It followed that number-theoretic operations could be explained in terms of set-theoretic operations such as intersection, union, and difference. In Principia Mathematica, Whitehead and Russell were able to provide many detailed derivations of major theorems in set theory, finite and transfinite arithmetic, and elementary measure theory. A fourth volume was planned but never completed.

Russell's most important writings relating to these topics include not only Principles of Mathematics (1903), "Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types" (1908), and Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913), but also his An Essay on the Foundations of Geometry (1897), and Introduction to Mathematical Philosophy (1919).

Russell's Work in Analytic Philosophy

In much the same way that Russell used logic in an attempt to clarify issues in the foundations of mathematics, he also used logic in an attempt to clarify issues in philosophy. As one of the founders of analytic philosophy, Russell made significant contributions to a wide variety of areas, including metaphysics, epistemology, ethics and political theory, as well as to the history of philosophy. Underlying these various projects was not only Russell's use of logical analysis, but also his long-standing aim of discovering whether, and to what extent, knowledge is possible. "There is one great question," he writes in 1911. "Can human beings know anything, and if so, what and how? This question is really the most essentially philosophical of all questions."[1]

More than this, Russell's various contributions were also unified by his views concerning both the centrality of scientific knowledge and the importance of an underlying scientific methodology that is common to both philosophy and science. In the case of philosophy, this methodology expressed itself through Russell's use of logical analysis. In fact, Russell often claimed that he had more confidence in his methodology than in any particular philosophical conclusion.

Russell's conception of philosophy arose in part from his idealist origins.[2] This is so, even though he believed that his one, true revolution in philosophy came about as a result of his break from idealism. Russell saw that the idealist doctrine of internal relations led to a series of contradictions regarding asymmetrical (and other) relations necessary for mathematics. Thus, in 1898, he abandoned the idealism that he had encountered as a student at Cambridge, together with his Kantian methodology, in favour of a pluralistic realism. As a result, he soon became famous as an advocate of the "new realism" and for his "new philosophy of logic," emphasizing as it did the importance of modern logic for philosophical analysis. The underlying themes of this "revolution," including his belief in pluralism, his emphasis upon anti-psychologism, and the importance of science, remained central to Russell's philosophy for the remainder of his life.[3]

Russell's methodology consisted of the making and testing of hypotheses through the weighing of evidence (hence Russell's comment that he wished to emphasize the "scientific method" in philosophy[4]), together with a rigorous analysis of problematic propositions using the machinery of first-order logic. It was Russell's belief that by using the new logic of his day, philosophers would be able to exhibit the underlying "logical form" of natural language statements. A statement's logical form, in turn, would help philosophers resolve problems of reference associated with the ambiguity and vagueness of natural language. Thus, just as we distinguish three separate sense of "is" (the is of predication, the is of identity, and the is of existence) and exhibit these three senses by using three separate logical notations (Px, x=y, and ∃x respectively) we will also discover other ontologically significant distinctions by being aware of a sentence's correct logical form. On Russell's view, the subject matter of philosophy is then distinguished from that of the sciences only by the generality and the a prioricity of philosophical statements, not by the underlying methodology of the discipline. In philosophy, as in mathematics, Russell believed that it was by applying logical machinery and insights that advances would be made.

Russell's most famous example of his "analytic" method concerns denoting phrases such as descriptions and proper names. In his Principles of Mathematics, Russell had adopted the view that every denoting phrase (for example, "Scott," "blue," "the number two," "the golden mountain") denoted, or referred to, an existing entity. By the time his landmark article, "On Denoting," appeared two years later, in 1905, Russell had modified this extreme realism and had instead become convinced that denoting phrases need not possess a theoretical unity.

While logically proper names (words such as "this" or "that" which refer to sensations of which an agent is immediately aware) do have referents associated with them, descriptive phrases (such as "the smallest number less than pi") should be viewed as a collection of quantifiers (such as "all" and "some") and propositional functions (such as "x is a number"). As such, they are not to be viewed as referring terms but, rather, as "incomplete symbols." In other words, they should be viewed as symbols that take on meaning within appropriate contexts, but that are meaningless in isolation.

Thus, in the sentence

(1) The present King of France is bald,

the definite description "The present King of France" plays a role quite different from that of a proper name such as "Scott" in the sentence

(2) Scott is bald.

Letting K abbreviate the predicate "is a present King of France" and B abbreviate the predicate "is bald," Russell assigns sentence (1) the logical form

(1′) There is an x such that (i) Kx, (ii) for any y, if Ky then y=x, and (iii) Bx.

Alternatively, in the notation of the predicate calculus, we have

(1″) ∃x[(Kx & ∀y(Kyy=x)) & Bx].

In contrast, by allowing s to abbreviate the name "Scott," Russell assigns sentence (2) the very different logical form

(2′) Bs.

This distinction between various logical forms allows Russell to explain three important puzzles. The first concerns the operation of the Law of Excluded Middle and how this law relates to denoting terms. According to one reading of the Law of Excluded Middle, it must be the case that either "The present King of France is bald" is true or "The present King of France is not bald" is true. But if so, both sentences appear to entail the existence of a present King of France, clearly an undesirable result. Russell's analysis shows how this conclusion can be avoided. By appealing to analysis (1′), it follows that there is a way to deny (1) without being committed to the existence of a present King of France, namely by accepting that "It is not the case that there exists a present King of France who is bald" is true.

The second puzzle concerns the Law of Identity as it operates in (so-called) opaque contexts. Even though "Scott is the author of Waverley" is true, it does not follow that the two referring terms "Scott" and "the author of Waverley" are interchangeable in every situation. Thus although "George IV wanted to know whether Scott was the the author of Waverley" is true, "George IV wanted to know whether Scott was Scott" is, presumably, false. Russell's distinction between the logical forms associated with the use of proper names and definite descriptions shows why this is so.

To see this we once again let s abbreviate the name "Scott." We also let w abbreviate "Waverley" and A abbreviate the two-place predicate "is the author of." It then follows that the sentence

(3) s=s

is not at all equivalent to the sentence

(4) ∃x[Axw & ∀y(Aywy=x) & x=s].

The third puzzle relates to true negative existential claims, such as the claim "The golden mountain does not exist." Here, once again, by treating definite descriptions as having a logical form distinct from that of proper names, Russell is able to give an account of how a speaker may be committed to the truth of a negative existential without also being committed to the belief that the subject term has reference. That is, the claim that Scott does not exist is false since

(5) ~∃x(x=s)

is self-contradictory. (After all, there must exist at least one thing that is identical to s since it is a logical truth that s is identical to itself!) In contrast, the claim that a golden mountain does not exist may be true since, assuming that G abbreviates the predicate "is golden" and M abbreviates the predicate "is a mountain," there is nothing contradictory about

(6) ~∃x(Gx & Mx).

Russell's emphasis upon logical analysis also had consequences for his metaphysics. In response to the traditional problem of the external world which, it is claimed, arises since the external world can be known only by inference, Russell developed his famous 1910 distinction between "knowledge by acquaintance and knowledge by description." He then went on, in his 1918 lectures on logical atomism, to argue that the world itself consists of a complex of logical atoms (such as "little patches of colour") and their properties. Together they form the atomic facts which, in turn, are combined to form logically complex objects. What we normally take to be inferred entities (for example, enduring physical objects) are then understood to be "logical constructions" formed from the immediately given entities of sensation, viz., "sensibilia." It is only these latter entities that are known non-inferentially and with certainty.

According to Russell, the philosopher's job is to discover a logically ideal language that will exhibit the true nature of the world in such a way that the speaker will not be misled by the casual surface structure of natural language. Just as atomic facts (the association of universals with an appropriate number of individuals) may be combined into molecular facts in the world itself, such a language would allow for the description of such combinations using logical connectives such as "and" and "or." In addition to atomic and molecular facts, Russell also held that general facts (facts about "all" of something) were needed to complete the picture of the world. Famously, he vacillated on whether negative facts were also required.

Russell's most important writings relating to these topics include not only "On Denoting" (1905), but also his "Knowledge by Acquaintance and Knowledge by Description" (1910), "The Philosophy of Logical Atomism" (1918, 1919), "Logical Atomism" (1924), The Analysis of Mind (1921), and The Analysis of Matter (1927).

Russell's Social and Political Philosophy

Russell's social influence stems from three main sources: his long-standing social activism, his many writings on the social and political issues of his day, and his popularizations of technical writings in philosophy and the natural sciences.

Among Russell's many popularizations are his two best selling works, The Problems of Philosophy (1912) and A History of Western Philosophy (1945). Both of these books, as well as his numerous but less famous books popularizing science, have done much to educate and inform generations of general readers. Naturally enough, Russell saw a link between education, in this broad sense, and social progress. At the same time, Russell is also famous for suggesting that a widespread reliance upon evidence, rather than upon superstition, would have enormous social consequences: "I wish to propose for the reader's favourable consideration," says Russell, "a doctrine which may, I fear, appear wildly paradoxical and subversive. The doctrine in question is this: that it is undesirable to believe a proposition when there is no ground whatever for supposing it true."[5]

Still, Russell is best known in many circles as a result of his campaigns against the proliferation of nuclear weapons and against western involvement in the Vietnam War during the 1950s and 1960s. However, Russell's social activism stretches back at least as far as 1910, when he published his Anti-Suffragist Anxieties, and to 1916, when he was convicted and fined in connection with anti-war protests during World War I. Following his conviction, he was also dismissed from his post at Trinity College, Cambridge. Two years later, he was convicted a second time. The result was six months in prison. Russell also ran unsuccessfully for Parliament (in 1907, 1922, and 1923) and, together with his second wife, founded and operated an experimental school during the late 1920s and early 1930s.

Although he became the third Earl Russell upon the death of his brother in 1931, Russell's radicalism continued to make him a controversial figure well through middle-age. While teaching in the United States in the late 1930s, he was offered a teaching appointment at City College, New York. The appointment was revoked following a large number of public protests and a 1940 judicial decision which found him morally unfit to teach at the College.

In 1954 he delivered his famous "Man's Peril" broadcast on the BBC, condemning the Bikini H-bomb tests. A year later, together with Albert Einstein, he released the Russell-Einstein Manifesto calling for the curtailment of nuclear weapons. In 1957 he was a prime organizer of the first Pugwash Conference, which brought together a large number of scientists concerned about the nuclear issue. He became the founding president of the Campaign for Nuclear Disarmament in 1958 and was once again imprisoned, this time in connection with anti-nuclear protests in 1961. The media coverage surrounding his conviction only served to enhance Russell's reputation and to further inspire the many idealistic youths who were sympathetic to his anti-war and anti-nuclear protests.

During these controversial years Russell also wrote many of the books that brought him to the attention of popular audiences. These include his Principles of Social Reconstruction (1916), A Free Man's Worship (1923), On Education (1926), Why I Am Not a Christian (1927), Marriage and Morals (1929), The Conquest of Happiness (1930), The Scientific Outlook (1931), and Power: A New Social Analysis (1938).

Upon being awarded the Nobel Prize for Literature in 1950, Russell used his acceptance speech to emphasize, once again, themes related to his social activism.

Russell's Writings

A Selection of Russell's Articles

A Selection of Russell's Books

Major Anthologies of Russell's Writings

The Collected Papers of Bertrand Russell

The Bertrand Russell Editorial Project is currently in the process of publishing Russell's Collected Papers. When complete, these volumes will bring together all of Russell's writings, excluding his correspondence and previously published monographs.

In Print

Planned and Forthcoming


Selected Articles

Selected Books

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | Gödel, Kurt | knowledge: by acquaintance vs. description | logic: classical | logical atomism: Russell's | logical constructions | logicism | mathematics, philosophy of | Moore, George Edward | Principia Mathematica | propositional function | Russell's paradox | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North | Wittgenstein, Ludwig