Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Properties

Uses of Properties in the Philosophy of Mathematics

1. Logicist Identificationism

The first detailed version of identificationism was developed by Gottlob Frege, in which numbers were identified with sets. (Frege actually identified numbers with the extensions of second-order concepts, but since these are extensional creatures, it isn't wildly anachronistic to think of them as sets. See the entry on Frege's logic, theorem and foundations for arithmentic.) But Frege made a further claim: these extensions, and hence the numbers, are logical entities, ones whose very existence is guaranteed by logic alone. Hence, truths of number theory are really just logical truths. This thesis, which came to be known as logicism, offered the hope of an extremely secure foundation for arithmetic that fulfilled wishes 4 (telling us how arithmetical truths can be necessarily true) and 5 (telling us how we have a priori knowledge in mathematics). After all, logical truths are surely necessarily true if anything is, and if anything can be known a priori, they surely can be. Indeed, they are usually thought to be analytic, and there is supposed to be little puzzle about how we can know such truths a priori; we just analyze the meanings of terms.

In their monumental, three-volume work Principia Mathematica, Whitehead and Russell develop logicism in a slightly different way. They identify numbers with propositional functions which, owing to unclarity of exposition, hover between properties, on the one hand, and linguistic expressions (open sentences, predicates roughly), on the other. But they quantify over propositional functions in a way that treats them as properties, so this early version of logicism actually identifies numbers with properties rather than with sets. Whitehead and Russell don't make use of the intensionality of properties, however, and they could as well have used sets. More recently several philosophers, particularly Bealer (1982, ch 5-6; cf. Menzel, 1986) have argued that logic alone guarantees the existence of enough properties with the right structure to play the role of the natural numbers. This requires a conception of logic much richer than many traditional ones; among other things, logic alone must ensure the existence of infinitely many things (such systems, which are quite intricate, are beyond the scope of the present article, but a few of the basic ideas are explained in §8).

Champions of a logicism based on properties can simply adapt earlier identificationist's explanations of truth, objectivity, and logical form, substituting properties for the sets employed in the earlier accounts. Moreover, they can hold that the existence of properties, at least those identified with the numbers, is guaranteed by logic. And since logical truths are necessarily true, these properties necessarily exist and they necessarily stand in the (mathematically relevant) relations that they do, which explains the modal status of arithmetic claims. None of this tells us how mathematical knowledge is possible; any account of this will require substantive auxiliary hypotheses about human cognitive faculties.

This brief account of property-theoretic versions of logicism can't do justice to their details, but it tells us enough to spot several likely objections to them. They face problems peculiar to logicism as well as more general problems that threaten most versions of identificationism.

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2. Set-theoretic Identificationism

These steps are familiar from set-theoretic versions of identificationism in which numbers are identified with sets. For example, we might identify zero with the empty set, ∅, and for each x in the domain, the successor of x, s(x), could be identified with {x} (as in Zermelo's account), or with the union of x and {x} (as in von Neumann's account), or with the result of applying some other operation of the appropriate sort to x (when there is one way to do this, there are lots of ways). Classical versions of identificationism begin with a formal theory of the objects we take to be numbers, and the task is to show that arithmetical truths match up with truths of this theory and that arithmetical falsehoods match up with its falsehoods. When the proposed identification is with sets, this involves deriving the set-theoretic translations of our favorite set of axioms for number theory in some version of set theory.

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3. Logicism and Logic

The exact character of logic is elusive; indeed, there is some reason to think that, like many other notions, it is vague around the edges. But one traditional hallmark of logic is that it is topic neutral; it applies to everything indifferently; it doesn't deal explicitly with specific sorts of things like planets or dogs or the number 16. The notion of a property is very general, however, since it is plausible to suppose that absolutely anything can exemplify a property, so there is some room to argue that logic can guarantee the existence of properties without violating its topic-neutrality.

A second traditional hallmark of logic is that it does not make existence commitments, at least not any specific ones. It is true that theorems of our most familiar logical system, first-order logic, are only true in circumstances in which at least one thing exists. But this one thing can be any sort of thing at all, and this system is sometimes criticized for assuming even this much (this is one reason why some philosophers prefer free logic, which doesn't make even this minimal commitment). In the end, though, it is less important to decide whether rich and powerful systems count as logic than to see whether they have the sorts of features that make logicism attractive in the first place.

It may seem plausible to view theorems of classical sentential logic as analytic, true in virtue of the meanings of the logical constants they contain. But it is generally agreed that existence claims are not analytic (this is the root of the problem with the ontological argument). So the nice, intuitive view that mathematical knowledge is no great mystery (it's simply knowledge of analytic logical truths) seems less plausible once the notion of logic is stretched to become so powerful. Moreover, this stretching doesn't end with the requirement that our logic of properties guarantee the existence of infinitely many things. First-order logic is not strong enough to characterize the natural numbers even up to isomorphism, and logics that are do not have recursively enumerable sets of logical truths (by Gödel's theorem). Hence, such systems are epistemically untractable in the sense that their truths far outrun our ability to track (prove) them.

In short, it may well be a merely verbal dispute just which formal systems merit the honorific title of ‘logic’. The substantive point here is that if logicism requires a logic that is so lavish in its existence commitments and so computationally (and hence epistemologically) unruly, then the appeal that the slogan "truths of arithmetic are just truths of logic" had when we had a kinder and gentler vision of logic in mind begins to fade. Indeed, as we will now see, logicist identificationism does not turn out to be so very terribly different from its non-logicist counterparts.

4. Non-logicist identificationism

In view of the heavy existence commitments of number theory, most philosophers came to doubt that "reductions" of arithmetic to set theory really counted as reductions to logic (and parallel reasoning would lead them to doubt that using a logic of properties rather than set theory changes this). Instead, the reducing theory, that of sets, came to be seen as an independent formal theory with its own proprietary existence commitments that was best formulated in, but was not identical with, some logical system (as the decades rolled by this system was increasingly first-order logic).

The claim that numbers are identical with sets is really all we need to mobilize the logicist's accounts of mathematical truth, objectivity, and logical form. Furthermore, since the sets identified with numbers are all pure sets (they don't have any members that aren't themselves sets), it can be argued that they exist necessarily, which explains the modal status of mathematical claims. The important point here is that a property theorist can write a set of axioms for property theory that parallel the axioms of standard set theories (save for replacing the axiom of extensionality with some other identity condition, perhaps omitting the axiom of foundations, and making other minor emendations to adapt the ideas better to properties; e.g., Jubien, 1989; cf. Pollard and Martin, 1986). The resulting axioms are not viewed as part of logic, but as a characterization of an independently existing realm of properties. And once this is done, the property theorist can adapt the explanations given by those non-logicists who identify numbers with sets to explain all of the items on our list except for the one involving mathematical knowledge.