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Principia Mathematica

First published Tue May 21, 1996; substantive revision Thu May 1, 2003

Principia Mathematica, the landmark work written by Alfred North Whitehead and Bertrand Russell, and published in three volumes, in 1910, 1912 and 1913. Written as a defense of logicism (i.e., the view that mathematics is in some significant sense reducible to logic) the book was instrumental in developing and popularizing modern mathematical logic. It also served as a major impetus for research in the foundations of mathematics throughout the twentieth century. Next to Aristotle's Organon, it remains the most influential book on logic ever written.

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History of Principia Mathematica

Logicism is the view that (some or all of) mathematics can be reduced to (formal) logic. It is often explained as a two-part thesis. First, it consists of the claim that all mathematical truths can be translated into logical truths or, in other words, that the vocabulary of mathematics constitutes a proper subset of the vocabulary of logic. Second, it consists of the claim that all mathematical proofs can be recast as logical proofs or, in other words, that the theorems of mathematics constitute a proper subset of the theorems of logic. In Bertrand Russell's words, it is the logicist's goal "to show that all pure mathematics follows from purely logical premises and uses only concepts definable in logical terms."[1]

In its essentials, logicism was first advocated in the late seventeenth century by Gottfried Leibniz. Later, the idea was defended in greater detail by Gottlob Frege. During the critical movement initiated in the 1820s, mathematicians such as Bernard Bolzano, Niels Abel, Louis Cauchy and Karl Weierstrass succeeded in eliminating much of the vagueness and many of the contradictions present in the mathematical theories of their day. By the late 1800s, William Hamilton had also introduced ordered couples of reals as the first step in supplying a logical basis for the complex numbers. In much the same spirit, Karl Weierstrass, Richard Dedekind and Georg Cantor had also all developed methods for founding the irrationals in terms of the rationals. Using work by H.G. Grassmann and Richard Dedekind, Guiseppe Peano had then gone on to develop a theory of the rationals based on his now famous axioms for the natural numbers. Thus, by Frege's day, it was generally recognized that a large portion of mathematics could be derived from a relatively small set of primitive notions.

Even so, it was not until 1879, when Frege developed the necessary logical apparatus, that the project of logicism could be said to have become technically plausible. Following another five years' work, Frege arrived at the definitions necessary for logicising arithmetic and, during the 1890s, he worked on many of the essential derivations. However, with the discovery of paradoxes such as Russell's paradox at the turn of the century, it appeared that additional resources would need to be postulated if logicism were to succeed.

By 1903, both Whitehead and Russell had reached this same conclusion. By this time, both men were in the initial stages of preparing second volumes to earlier books on related topics: Whitehead's 1898 A Treatise on Universal Algebra and Russell's 1903 The Principles of Mathematics. Since their research overlapped considerably, they began collaborating on what would eventually become Principia Mathematica. By agreement, Russell worked primarily on the philosophical parts of the project (including the philosophically rich Introduction, the theory of descriptions, and the no-class theory), while the two men collaborated on the technical derivations. Intially, it was thought that the project might take a year to complete.

Unfortunately, after almost a decade of difficult work on the part of both men, Cambridge University Press concluded that publishing Principia would result in an estimated loss of approximately 600 pounds. Although the press agreed to assume half this amount and the Royal Society agreed to donate another 200 pounds, that still left a 100-pound deficit. Only by each contributing 50 pounds were the authors able to see their work through to publication.

Today there is not a major academic library anywhere in the world that does not possess a copy of this landmark publication.

Significance of Principia Mathematica

Achieving Principia's main goal proved to be controversial. Primarily at issue were the kinds of assumptions that Whitehead and Russell needed to complete their project. Although Principia succeeded in providing detailed derivations of many major theorems in set theory, finite and transfinite arithmetic, and elementary measure theory, two axioms in particular were arguably non-logical in character: the axiom of infinity and the axiom of reducibility. The axiom of infinity in effect stated that there exists an infinite number of objects. Thus, it made the kind of assumption that is generally thought to be empirical rather than logical in nature. The axiom of reducibility was introduced as a means of overcoming the not completely satisfactory effects of the theory of types, the theory that Russell and Whitehead used to restrict the notion of a well-formed expression, and so to avoid paradoxes such as Russell's paradox. Although technically feasible, many critics concluded that the axiom of reducibility was simply too ad hoc to be justified philosophically. As a result, the question of whether mathematics could be reduced to logic, or whether it could be reduced only to set theory, remained open.

Despite these criticisms, Principia Mathematica proved to be remarkably influential in at least three other ways. First, it popularized modern mathematical logic to an extent undreamt of by its authors. By using a notation superior in many ways to that of Frege, Whitehead and Russell managed to convey the remarkable expressive power of modern predicate logic in a way that previous writers had been unable to achieve. Second, by exhibiting so clearly the deductive power of the new logic, Whitehead and Russell were able to show how powerful the modern idea of a formal system could be, thus opening up new work in what was soon to be called metalogic. Third, Principia Mathematica reaffirmed clear and interesting connections between logicism and two main branches of traditional philosophy, namely metaphysics and epistemology, thus initiating new and interesting work in both these and other areas.

Thus, not only did Principia introduce a wide range of philosophically rich notions (such as propositional function, logical construction, and type theory), it also set the stage for the discovery of classical metatheoretic results (such as those of Kurt Gödel and others) and initiated a tradition of common technical work in fields as diverse as philosophy, mathematics, linguistics, economics and computer science.

Today there remains controversy over the ultimate substantive contribution of Principia, with some authors holding that, with the appropriate modifications, logicism remains a feasible project. Others hold that the philosophical and technical underpinnings of the Whitehead/Russell project simply remain too weak or confused to be of much use to the logicist. Interested readers are encouraged to consult Hale and Wright (2001), Quine (1966a), Quine (1966b), Landini (1998) and Linsky (1999).

Contents of Principia Mathematica

Principia Mathematica originally appeared in three volumes. Together these three volumes are divided into six parts. Volume 1 begins with a lengthy Introduction containing sections entitled "Preliminary Explanations of Ideas and Notations," "The Theory of Logical Types," and "Incomplete Symbols." It also contains Part I, entitled "Mathematical Logic," which contains sections on "The Theory of Deduction," "Theory of Apparent Variables," "Classes and Relations," "Logic of Relations," and "Products and Sums of Classes"; and Part II, entitled "Prolegomena to Cardinal Arithmetic," which contains sections on "Unit Classes and Couples," "Sub-Classes, Sub-Relations, and Relative Types," "One-Many, Many-One and One-One Relations," "Selections," and "Inductive Relations."

Volume 2 begins with a "Prefatory Statement of Symbolic Conventions." It then continues with Part III, entitled "Cardinal Arithmetic," which itself contains sections on "Definition and Logical Properties of Cardinal Numbers," "Addition, Multiplication and Exponentiation," and "Finite and Infinite"; Part IV, entitled "Relation-Arithmetic," which contains sections on "Ordinal Similarity and Relation-Numbers," "Addition of Relations, and the Product of Two Relations," "The Principle of First Differences, and the Multiplication and Exponentiation of Relations," and "Arithmetic of Relation-Numbers"; and the first half of Part V, entitled "Series," which contains sections on "General Theory of Series," "On Sections, Segments, Stretches, and Derivatives," and "On Convergence, and the Limits of Functions."

Volume 3 continues Part V with sections on "Well-Ordered Series," "Finite and Infinite Series and Ordinals," and "Compact Series, Rational Series, and Continuous Series." It also contains Part VI, entitled "Quantity," which itself contains sections on "Generalization of Number," "Vector-Families," "Measurement," and "Cyclic Families."

A fourth volume was planned but never completed.

Contemporary readers (i.e., those who have learned logic in the second half of the twentieth century or later) will find the book's notation somewhat antiquated and clumsy. Even so, the book remains one of the great scientific documents of the twentieth century.


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Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | logic: classical | logicism | Principia Mathematica: notation in | propositional function | Russell, Bertrand | Russell's paradox | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North