Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed May 28, 2008

The concept of race[1] signifies the grouping of individual humans by some set of perceived physical characteristics, often called “phenotypes,” which are thought to be inherited through some blood-borne factor. Which specific set of perceived, shared physical characteristics constitute a race varies historically, geographically, socially, and politically. Indeed, there is no biological or genetic foundation for the grouping of individual humans into a racial group. Instead, humans themselves choose (consciously or unconsciously) which physical characteristics constitute a racial group. Consequently, racial groups are presently thought to be social constructions, or a category created not by biological nature but by human invention. However, from its origins in the early modern era until the twentieth century, race was not considered a social construction but a real, biological distinction transmitted from one generation to the next. Thus, racial identity was thought to be something fixed and imposed genetically.

As a result of this biological conception, racial groupings are typically thought of as discrete, meaning that the boundaries between them are determinate. Where one racial group ends, a distinct other racial group begins. If human phenotypes are simply considered to be gradual variations in things like skin color, hair texture, or bone structure, then one cannot really speak of distinct human races. Rather, such differences would simply reflect variations in physical traits, such as the variation between very straight versus very curly hair. To speak of race, then, requires classifying humans into discrete groupings based upon a set of putatively inherited physical characteristics. Note that the discrete character of racial groups holds even when we speak of “mixed race” people, since this term implies that a “mixed” individual has ancestry from two or more discrete racial groups.

Determining the boundaries of discrete races has proven to be the most vexing problems for those thinkers who sought to classify humans according to race, and led to great variations in the number of human races believed to be in existence. Thus, some thinkers categorized humans into only four distinct races (typically white or Caucasian, black or African, yellow or Asian, and red or Native American), and downplayed any phenotypical distinctions within racial groups (such as those between Scandavians and Spaniards within the white or Caucasian race). Other thinkers, drawing boundaries around different physical traits, classified humans into many more racial categories, for instance arguing that those humans “indigenous” to Europe could be distinguished into discrete Nordic, Alpine, and Mediterranean races.

The ambiguities and confusion associated with determining the boundaries of discrete racial categories has over time provoked a widespread scholarly consensus that that race is socially constructed, while advances in the understanding of human genetics has undermined scholarly belief in the biological foundations of discrete races. However, significant scholarly debate persists regarding the relationship between racial groupings and social or political processes. For instance, some scholars suggest that race is inconceivable without racialized social hierarchies, such that racial identities are always organized so that some races are portrayed as superior while others are inferior. In addition, scholars dispute whether racial categories are defined only by members of superior racialized groups or whether subordinate groups themselves contribute to and maintain racial categorization. Finally, there is some controversy as to whether some real genetic differences may validly be used to categorize individual humans into breeding populations, even though these categorizations do not fit the socially constructed racial groups that may be recognized within any given society.

In what follows, I will trace the historical origins and development of the concept of race. I will then examine the idea that races are socially constructed. Thereafter, I will examine how moral, political and legal philosophers address the quandaries posed by the existence of biologically irrelevant but politically significant racial groupings.

1. History of the Concept of Race

The contemporary scholarly consensus is that the concept of race is a modern phenomenon, at least in the west (Europe, the Americas, and North Africa). Indeed, the oppression and conflict associated with racism clearly predate the biological conception of race (Zack 2002, 7). Neither the ancient Greeks and Romans nor the medieval Jews, Christians and Muslims sought to classify humans into discrete racial categories. In the ancient Greco-Roman world, phenotypical differences such as skin color and hair texture were noticed but did not ground discrete categories of biological difference. Nor did the physical differences today associated with race connote differences in character or culture; as ethnocentric as the Greeks and Romans were, the political affiliations of citizenship were their primary human divisions (Blum 2002, 110). Even Aristotle's famous distinction between Greek and Barbarian is thought of as a distinction based not on race but on the practical distinction between those people who organize themselves into the political communities of city-states (Greeks) and those who do not (Barbarians) (Hannaford 1996, 43-57; Simpson 1998, 19). The Romans, in turn, differentiated themselves from other groups not through biological race but through the differing legal structures through which they organized their collective lives (Hannaford 1996, 85). For the medieval followers of occidental, monotheistic religions, the primary boundaries among humans lay between believers and non-believers, with the implicit assumption among Christians and Muslims that any human being was capable to being converted into the fold of believers. Even the Jewish distinction between goyim and Jew reflected a difference in faith, not in blood (Hannaford 1996, 88).

Notably, the one Biblical story later used to justify racial distinctions was not used by orthodox Christian thinkers as a basis for race thinking. The story of Ham recounts how this son of Noah saw his father drunk, asleep, and naked. After Ham tried to expose his father's body to ridicule before Noah's other two sons Shem and Japhet, Noah cursed Ham's progeny. While later thinkers argued that Ham's descendants are the cursed people of Africa, St. Augustine allegorically interpreted this passage, depicting Ham's progeny as heretics (Hannaford 1996, 95).

Perhaps the first, unconscious stirrings of the concept of race arose within the Iberian peninsula. Following the Moorish conquest of Andalusia in the eighth century A.D., the Iberian Peninsula became the site of the greatest intermingling between Jewish, Christian, and Muslim believers. During and after their reconquista (reconquest) of the Muslim principalities in the peninsula, the Catholic Monarchs Isabel and Ferdinand sought to establish a uniformly Christian state by expelling first the Jews (in 1492) and then the Muslims (in 1502). But because large numbers of both groups converted to Christianity to avoid expulsion (and before this to avoid persecution), the monarchs distrusted the authenticity of these Jewish and Muslim conversos (converts). So to ensure that only truly faithful Christians remained within the realm, the grand inquisitor Torquemada reformulated the Inquisition to inquire not just into defendants' religious faith and practices but into their lineage. Only those who could demonstrate their ancestry to those Christians who resisted the Moorish invasion were secure in their status in the realm. Thus was born the idea of purity of blood (limpieza de sangre), not fully the biological concept of race but perhaps the first occidental use of blood heritage as a category of religio-political membership (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, vii; Hannaford 1996, 122-126; Frederickson 2002, 31-35).

The Iberian peninsula may also have witnessed the first stirrings of anti-black and anti-Native-American racism. Since this region was the first in Europe to utilize African slavery while gradually rejecting the enslavement of fellow European Christians, Iberian Christians may have come to associate blacks as physically and mentally suitable only for menial labor. In this they were influenced by Arab slave merchants, who assigned the worst tasks to their dark skinned slaves while assigning more complex labor to light or tawny-skinned slaves (Frederickson 2002, 29). The “discovery” of the New World by Iberian explorers also brought European Christians into contact with indigenous Americans for the first time. This resulted in the heated debate in Valladolid in 1550 between Bartolomé Las Casas and Gines de Sepúlveda over whether the Indians were by nature inferior and thus worthy of enslavement and conquest. Whether due to Las Casas's victory over Sepúlveda, or due to the hierarchical character of Spanish Catholicism which did not require the dehumanization of other races in order to justify slavery, the Spanish empire did avoid the racialization of its conquered peoples and African slaves. Indeed, arguably it was the conflict between the Enlightenment ideals of universal freedom and equality versus the fact of the European enslavement of Africans and indigenous Americans that fostered the development of the idea of race (Blum 2002, 111-112; Hannaford 1996, 149-150).

While events in the Iberian peninsula may have provided the initial stirrings of proto-racial sentiments, the philosophical concept of race did not actually emerge in its present form until the 1684 publication of “A New Division of the Earth” by Francois Bernier (1625-1688) (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, viii; Hannaford 1996, 191, 203). Based on his travels through Egypt, India, and Persia, Bernier presented a division of humanity into “four or five species or races of men in particular whose difference is so remarkable that it may be properly made use of as the foundation for a new division of the earth” (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 1-2). First were the peoples inhabiting most of Europe and North Africa, extending eastward through Persia, northern and central India, and right up to parts of contemporary Indonesia. Despite their differing skin tones, these peoples nevertheless shared common physical characteristics, such as hair texture and bone structure. The second race was constituted by the people of Africa south of the Sahara desert, who notably possessed smooth black skin, thick noses and lips, thin beards, and wooly hair. The peoples inhabiting lands from east Asia, through China, today's central Asian states such as Usbekistan, and westward into Siberia and eastern Russia represented the third race, marked by their “truly white” skin, broad shoulders, flat faces, flat noses, thin beards, and long, thin eyes, while the short and squat Lapps of northern Scandanavia constituted the fourth race. Bernier considered whether the indigenous peoples of the Americas were a fifth race, but he ultimately assigned them to the first (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 2-3).

But while Bernier initiated the use of the term “race” to distinguish different groups of humans based on physical traits, his failure to reflect on the relationship between racial division and the human race in general mitigated the scientific rigor of his definition (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, viii). Central to a scientific concept of race would be a resolution of the conflict between ideas of human monogenesis versus polygenesis. Monogenesis adhered to the Biblical creation story in asserting that all humans descended from a common ancestor, such as Adam of the Book of Genesis; polygenesis, on the other had, asserted that different human races descended from different ancestral roots. Whereas the former position contended that all races are nevertheless members of a common human species, the latter saw races as distinct species.

David Hume's position on the conflict between polygenesis versus monogenesis is the subject of some scholarly debate. The bone of contention is his essay “Of National Characters,” where he contends that differences among European nations are attributable not to natural differences but to cultural and political influences. Amidst this argument against crude naturalism, Hume inserts a footnote in the 1754 edition, wherein he writes: “I am apt to suspect the negroes and in general all the other species of men (for there are four or five different kinds) to be naturally inferior to whites. There never was a civilized nation of any other complexion than white, nor even any individual eminent either in action or speculation” (Zack 2002, 15; emphasis added). Whereas even the most barbarous white nations such as the Germans “have something eminent about them,” the “uniform and constant difference” in accomplishment between whites and non-whites could not occur “if nature had not made an original distinction betwixt these breeds of men” (Zack 2002, 15). Responding to criticism, he softens this position in the 1776 edition, restricting his claims to natural inferiority only to “negroes,” stating that “scarcely ever was a civilized nation of that complexion, not even of individual eminent in action or speculation” (Zack 2002, 17; Hume 1776 [1987], 208; emphasis added). Richard Popkin (1977) and Naomi Zack (2002, 13-18) contend that the 1754 version of the essay assumes, without demonstration, an original, polygenetic difference between white and non-white races. Andrew Valls (2005, 132) denies that either version of the footnote espouses polygenesis.

A strong and clear defense of monogenesis was provided by Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) in his essay “Of the Different Human Races,” first published in 1775 and revised in 1777. Kant argued that all humans descended from a common human “lineal root genus” in Europe, which contained the biological “seeds” and “dispositions” that can generate the distinct physical traits of race when triggered by divergent environmental factors, especially combinations of heat and humidity. This, combined with patterns of migration, geographic isolation, and in-breeding, led to the differentiation of four distinct, pure races: the “noble blond” of northern Europe; the “copper red” of America (and east Asia); the “black” of Senegambia in Africa; and the “olive-yellow” of Asian-India. Once these discrete racial groups were developed over many generations, further climatic changes will not alter racial phenotypes (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 8-22).

Yet despite the distinction generated between different races, Kant's monogenetic account led him to maintain that the different races were part of a common human species. As evidence, he adduced the fact that individuals from different races were able to breed together, and their offspring tended to exhibit blended physical traits inherited from both parents. Not only did blending indicate that the parents were part of a common species; it also indicated that they are of distinct races. For the physical traits of parents of the same race are not blended but often passed on exclusively: a blond white man and a brunette white woman may have four blond children, without any blending of this physical trait; whereas a black man and a white woman will bear children who blend white and black traits (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 9-10). Such inter-racial mixtures accounted for the existence of liminal individuals, whose physical traits seem to lie between the discrete boundaries of one of the four races; peoples who do not fit neatly into one or another race are explained away as groups whose seeds have not been fully triggered by the appropriate environmental stimuli (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 11).

The “science” of race was furthered by the man sometimes considered to be the father of modern anthropology, Johann Friedrich Blumenbach (1752-1840). In his doctoral dissertation, “On the Natural Variety of Mankind,” first published in 1775, Blumenbach identified four “varieties” of mankind: the peoples of Europe, Asia, Africa, and America. His essay was revised and republished both in 1781, wherein he introduced a fifth variety of mankind, that inhabiting the South Pacific islands, and in 1795, wherein he first coined the term “Caucasian” to describe the variety of people inhabiting Europe, West Asia, and Northern India. This term reflected his claim that this variety originated in the Caucuses mountains, in Georgia, justifying this etiology through reference to the superior beauty of the Georgians. The 1795 version also included the terms Mongolian to describe the non-Caucasian peoples of Asia, Ethiopian to signify black Africans, American to denote the indigenous peoples of the New World, and Malay to identify the South Pacific Islanders (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 27-33; Hannaford 1996, 207).

While noting differences in skin tone, he based his varieties upon the structures of the cranium, which supposedly gave his distinctions a stronger scientific foundation than the more superficial characteristic of color (Hannaford 1996, 206). In addition, he strongly denied polygenetic accounts of racial difference, noting the ability of members of different varieties to breed with each other, something that humans were incapable of doing with other species. Indeed, he took great pains to dismiss as spurious accounts of Africans mating with apes or of monstrous creatures formed through the union of humans with other animals (Hannaford 1996, 208-9). In final support of his more scientific, monogenist approach, Blumenbach posited the internal, biological force which generated racial difference, the “nisus formativus,” which when triggered by specific environmental stimuli generated the variations found within the varieties of humans (Hannaford 1996, 212).

Despite the strong monogenist arguments provided by Kant and Blumenbach, polygenesis remained a viable intellectual strain within race theory, particularly in the “American School of Anthropology,” embodied by Louis Agassiz, Robins Gliddon, and Josiah Clark Nott. Agassiz, born in Switzerland to a Protestant minister, received an M.D. in Munich and later studied zoology, geology, and paleontology in various German universities under the influence of Romantic scientific theories. His orthodox Christian background initially imbued him with a strong monogenist commitment, but upon visiting America and seeing an African American for the first time, Agassiz experienced a type of conversion experience, which led him to question whether these remarkably different people could share the same blood as Europeans. Eventually staying on and making his career in America, and continually struck by the physical character of African Americans, Agassiz officially announced his turn to polygenesis at the 1850 meeting of the American Association for the Advancement of Science (AAAS) in Charleston, South Carolina. Nott, a South Carolina physician, attended the same AAAS meeting and, along with Gliddon, joined Agassiz in the promulgation of the American School's defense of polygenesis (Brace 2005, 93-103).

Apart from Agassiz, Nott was also influenced by the French romantic race theorist Arthur de Gobineau (1816-1882), whose “Essay on the Inequality of the Human Races” (1853-1855) Nott partially translated into English and published for the American public. Although the Catholic Gobineau initially espoused monogenesis, he later leaned towards polygenesis and ended up ambivalent on this issue (Hannaford 1996, 268-269). Nevertheless, Gobineau leant credence to the white racial supremacy that Nott supported (Brace 2005, 120-121). Gobineau posited two impulses among humans, that of attraction and repulsion. Civilization emerges when humans obey the law of attraction and intermingle with peoples of different racial stocks. According the Gobineau, the white race was created through such intermingling, which allowed it alone to generate civilization, unlike the other races, which were governed only by the law of repulsion. Once civilization is established, however, further race mixing leads to degeneration of the race through a decline in the quality of its blood. Consequently, when the white race conquers other black or yellow races, any further intermingling will lead it to degenerate from its initially superior position. Thus, Gobineau claimed that the white race would never die so long as its blood remains composed of its initial mixture of peoples. Notably, Nott strategically excised those sections discussing the law of attraction when translating Gobineau's essay for an American audience (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 45-51).

Eventually, polygenesis declined through the intellectual success of Charles Darwin's theory of evolution (Brace 2005, 124). Darwin himself weighed in on this debate in the chapter “On the Races of Man” in his book The Descent of Man (1871), arguing that as the theory of evolution gains wider acceptance, “the dispute between the monogenists and the polygenists will die a silent and unobserved death” (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 68), with the former winning out. The rest of the essay entertained both sides of the debate regarding whether or not different races constitute different species or sub-species of humans. Although Darwin did not explicitly take sides in this debate, the preponderance of his argument gives little support to the idea of races being different species. For instance, he noted that couples from different races produce fertile offspring, and that individuals from different races seem to share many mental similarities. That said, while Darwinian evolution may have killed off polygenesis and the related idea that the races constituted distinct species, it hardly killed off race itself. Darwin himself did not think natural selection would by itself generate racial distinctions, since the physical traits associated with racial differences did not seem sufficiently beneficial to favor their retention; he did, however, leave open a role for sexual selection in the creation of races, through repeated mating among individuals with similar traits (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 77-78). Consequently, later race thinkers would replace polygenesis with natural selection and sexual selection as scientific mechanisms whereby racial differentiation could slowly, unintentionally, but nevertheless inevitably proceed (Hannaford 1996, 273).

Sexual selection became a central focus for race-thinking with the introduction of the term “eugenics” in 1883 by Francis Galton (1822-1911) in his essay “Inquiries into Human Faculty and Development” (Hannaford 1996, 290). Focusing on physical as opposed to “moral” qualities, Galton advocated selective breeding to improve the “health, energy, ability, manliness, and courteous disposition” of the human species in his later essay, “Eugenics: Its Definition, Scope, and Aims” (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 80). Following the same currents of “Social Darwinism” that advocated the evolutionary improvement of the human condition through active human intervention, Galton proposed making eugenics not only an element in popular culture or “a new religion” (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 82) but even a policy enforced by the American government. While positive eugenics, or the enforced breeding of higher types, never became law, negative eugenics, or the sterilization of the feebleminded or infirm, was implemented in a number of American states and upheld by the United States Supreme Court in an eight-to-one decision in Buck v. Bell (274 U.S. 200, 1927). The widespread acceptance of negative eugenics can be inferred by the fact that the Court Opinion justifying the decision was authored by Justice Oliver Wendell Holmes, a figure usually associated with progressive and civil libertarian positions, and whose doctrine of “clear and present danger” sought to expand the protection of free speech.

The apogee of post-Darwinian race-thinking was arguably reached in the book The Foundations of the Nineteenth Century by Houston Stewart Chamberlain (1855-1927), the son-in-law of German opera composer Richard Wagner. Chamberlain argued in the evolutionary terms of sexual selection that distinct races emerged through geographical and historical conditions which create inbreeding among certain individuals with similar traits (Hannaford 1996, 351). Moving from this initial specification, Chamberlain then argued that the key strands of western civilization - Christianity and ancient Greek philosophy and art – emerged from the Aryan race. Jesus, for instance, was held to be of Aryan stock, despite his Jewish religion, since the territory of Galilee was populated by peoples descended from Aryan Phonecians as well as by Semitic Jews. Similarly, Aristotle's distinction between Greeks and Barbarians was reinterpreted as a racial distinction between Aryans and non-Aryans. These Greek and Christian strands became united in Europe, particularly during the Reformation, which allowed the highest, Teutonic strain of the Aryan race to be freed from constraining Roman Catholic cultural fetters. But while Roman institutions and practices may have constrained the Teutonic Germans, their diametric opposite was the Jew, the highest manifestation of the Semitic Race. The European religious tensions between Christian and Jew were thus transformed into racial conflicts, for which conversion or ecumenical tolerance would have no healing effect. Chamberlain's writings, not surprisingly, have come to be seen as some of the key intellectual foundations for twentieth century German anti-Semitism, of which Adolf Hitler was simply its most extreme manifestation.

If Chamberlain's writings served as intellectual fodder for German racial prejudice, Madison Grant (1865-1937) provided similar foundations for American race prejudice against Blacks and Native Americans in his popular book The Passing of the Great Race (1916). Rejecting political or educational means of ameliorating the destitution of the subordinate racial groups in America, Grant instead advocated strict segregation and the prohibition of miscegenation, or the interbreeding of members of different races (Hannaford 1996, 358). Like Galton, Grant had similar success in influencing American public policy, both through the imposition of racist restrictions on immigration at the federal level and through the enforcement of anti-miscegenation laws in thirty states, until such prohibitions were finally overturned by the United States Supreme Court in Loving v. Virginia (388 U.S. 1 [1967]).

If the apogee of biological race was reached in the early twentieth century, its decline began at about the same time in the very field that first lent it scientific validity, academic anthropology. Columbia University professor Franz Boas (1858-1942), a German-born Jewish immigrant to the United States, challenged the fixed character of racial groups by attacking Blumenbach's anthropological fundament to racial typology, cranium size. Boas showed that this characteristic was profoundly affected by environmental factors, noting that American-born members of various “racial” types, such as Semitic Jews, tended to have larger crania than their European-born parents, a result of differences in nourishment. From this he concluded that claims about racially differential mental capacities could similarly be reduced to such environmental factors. In so doing, Boas undermined one measure of racial distinction, and although he did not go so far as to reject entirely the concept of biological race itself, he strongly influenced anthropologists to shift their focus from putatively fixed biological characteristics to apparently mutable cultural factors in order to understand differences among human groups (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 84-88; Brace 2005, 167-169; Cornell and Hartmann 1998, 42-43).

A stronger anthropological rejection of the biological conception of race was leveled by Ashley Montagu (1905-1999). Drawing on insights from modern, experimental genetics, Montagu forcefully argued that the anthropological conception of race relied on grouping together various perceptible physical characteristics, whereas the real building blocks of evolution were genes, which dictated biological changes among populations at a much finer level. The morphological traits associated with race, thus, were gross aggregates of a variety of genetic changes, some of which resulted in physically perceptible characteristics, many others of which resulted in imperceptible changes. Moreover, since genetic evolution can occur through both the mixture of different genes and the mutation of the same gene over generations, the traits associated with races cannot be attributed to discrete lines of genetic descent, since the dark skin and curly hair of one individual may result from genetic mixture, while the same traits in another individual may result from genetic mutation (Bernasconi and Lott 2000, 100-107). Montagu's efforts eventually resulted in the publication of an official statement denying the biological foundations of race by the United Nations Educational, Scientific, and Cultural Organization (UNESCO) in 1950, although it would take until 1996 for the American Association of Physical Anthropologists (AAPA) to publish a similar document (Brace 2005, 239).

While the field of anthropology most prominently disseminated the scientific concept of race and subsequently contributed to its demise, it was the field of biological genetics that most profoundly undermined the idea of discrete and hereditary racial groups. Naomi Zack (2002) accessibly summarizes the reasons for discarding race as a scientifically significant taxonomy, sequentially recounting the scientific rejection of essences, geography, phenotypes, post-Mendelian transmission genetics, and genealogies as possible foundations for races. Aristotelian essences, thought to ground the common characteristics of distinct species, were correctly rejected by early modern philosophers. If essences cannot even ground differences among species, then they clearly cannot ground the differences among races, which even nineteenth century racial science still understood as members of the same species. Whereas folk theories rely on geography to divide humanity into African, European, Asian, and Amerindian races, contemporary population genetics reveal the vacuity of this foundation for two reasons. First, geographically based environmental stimuli lead to continuous physical adaptations in skin, hair and bone rather than the discrete differences associated with race; and second, although mitochondrial DNA mutations provide evidence of the geographical origins of populations, these mutations do not correlate with the physical traits associated with racial groups. Similarly, phenotypes cannot ground folk theories of race: for instance, differences in skin tone are gradual, not discrete; and blood-type variations occur independently of the more visible phenotypes associated with race, such as skin color and hair texture. Race cannot be founded upon transmission genetics, since the genes transmitted from one generation to the next lead to very specific physical traits, not general racial characteristics shared by all members of a putatively racial group. And finally, genealogy cannot ground race, since clades (populations descended from a common ancestor) may have common genetic characteristics, but these need not correlate with the visible traits associated with races (Zack 2002, 87-88). Zack concludes: “Essences, geography, phenotypes, genotypes, and genealogy are the only known candidates for physical scientific bases of race. Each fails. Therefore, there is no physical scientific basis for the social racial taxonomy” (Zack 2002, 88).

2. Race as Social Construction

If the biological conception of race is philosophically and scientifically dead, has something else taken its place? In a series of impressively lucid articles, Ron Mallon (2004, 2006, 2007) provides a nice sketch of the contemporary philosophical terrain regarding the ontological status of the concept of race, dividing it into three valid competing schools of thought, along with the discarded biological conception. Racial naturalism, or racialism, signifies the old, biological conception of race, which depicts races as bearing “biobehavioral essences: underlying natural (and perhaps genetic) properties that (1) are heritable, biological features, (2) are shared by all and only the members of a race, and (3) explain behavioral, characterological, and cultural predispositions of individual persons and racial groups” (2006, 528-529). While philosophers and scientists have reached the consensus that such races simply do not exist, philosophers nevertheless disagree on the possible ontological status of a different conceptions of race. Mallon divides such disagreements into three metaphysical camps (racial skepticism, racial constructivism, and racial population naturalism) and two normative camps (eliminativism and conservationism).

Racial skepticism holds that because biological races do not exist, races of any type do not exist. Racial skeptics, such as Anthony Appiah (1995, 1996) and Naomi Zack (1993, 2002) contend that the term race cannot refer to anything real in the world, since the one thing in the world to which the term could uniquely refer – biological races – have been proven not to exist. Because of its historical genealogy, the term race can only refer to one or more groups of people who alone share biologically significant genetic features. Such a monopoly on certain genetic features could only emerge within a group that practices such a high level of inbreeding that it is effectively genetically isolated. Such genetic isolation might refer to the Amish in America (Appiah 1996, 73) or to Irish Protestants (Zack 2002, 69), but they clearly cannot refer to those groupings of people presently subsumed under American racial census categories. Because the concept “race” can only apply to groups not typically deemed races (Amish, Irish Protestants), and because this concept cannot apply to groups typically deemed races (African Americans, Whites, Asians, Native Americans), a mismatch occurs between the concept and its typical referent. This leads Appiah and Zack to the normative position of eliminativism, which recommends discarding the concept of race entirely (Mallon 2006, 526, 533).

Racial constructionism refers to the argument that, although biological race is false, races have come into existence and continue to exist through “human culture and human decisions” (Mallon 2007, 94). Race constructivists accept the skeptics' dismissal of biological race but argue that the term still meaningfully refers to the widespread grouping of individuals into certain categories by society, indeed often by the very members of such racial ascriptions. Normatively, race constructivists argue that since society labels people according to racial categories, and since such labeling often leads to race-based differences in resources, opportunities, and well-being, the concept of race must be conserved, in order to facilitate race-based social movements or policies, such as affirmative action, that compensate for socially constructed but socially relevant race differences. While thus sharing the normative commitment to race conservationism, racial constructivists can be subdivided into three groups with slightly different accounts of the ontology of race.

Thin constructivism depicts race as a grouping of humans according to “superficial properties that are prototypically linked with race,” such as skin tone, hair color and texture, and other physical traits that are genetically insignificant (Mallon 2006, 534). Thin constructivists such as Robert Gooding-Williams (1998), Lucius Outlaw (1990, 1996) and Charles Mills (1998), articulate the widespread folk theory of race, by which society uses biologically insignificant physical criteria to assign people to racial categories. Mills (1998) provides a two step process, whereby a society first elucidates certain criteria for constructing a racial category and then applies those criteria in actually assigning individuals to those categories (Mallon 2004, 652). Interactive kind constructivism goes further, in arguing that being ascribed to a certain racial category causes the individuals so labeled to have certain common experiences (Mallon 2006, 535; Piper 1992). So for instance, if society ascribes you as black, you are likely to experience difficulty hailing cabs in New York or are more likely to be apprehended without cause by the police (James 2004, 17). Finally, institutional constructivism emphasizes race as a social institution, whose character is specific to the society in which it is embedded and thus cannot be applied across cultures or historical epochs (Mallon 2006, 536). Thus, Michael Root (2000, 632) argues that a person ascribed as black in the United States would likely not be considered black in Brazil, since each country has very different social institutions regarding the division of humanity into distinct races. Similarly, Paul Taylor (2000) responds to Appiah's skepticism by holding that races, even if biologically unreal, remain social objects (Mallon 2006, 536-537). Indeed, in a later work Taylor (2004) argues that the term “race” has a perfectly clear referent, that being those people socially ascribed to certain racial categories within the United States, regardless of the widespread social rejection of biological racial naturalism.

The third, metaphysical school of thought regarding the ontology of race is racial population naturalism. This camp suggests that, although prior biological theories of race falsely attributed cultural, mental, and physical characters to racial groups, it is possible that genetically significant biological groupings could exist. Robin Andreasen (1998, 2000) provides a historical, phylogenetic account of how reproductively and thus genetically isolated populations could emerge in the process of human evolution. Philip Kitcher (1999), in turn, argues that the social construction of racial categories in the United States, combined with legal sanctions against miscegenation, might render African Americans a genetically isolated race. Whereas Andreasen seeks to show that races might have naturally arisen and historically existed thousands of years ago, Kitcher suggests that the biologically insignificant classification of racial categories can end up socially constructing genetically significant races. In both instances, racial population naturalism analytically resembles the type of genetically isolated groupings that could constitute races for skeptics such as Appiah (the Amish) and Zack (Iris Protestants), although racial population naturalism would require a higher level of genetic isolation in order to generate real biological significance (Mallon 2006, 543). The key import of this metaphysical school lies not with any normative position on race-based politics or policy but with the possible efficacy of the use of race within evolutionary biology (Andreasen) or in medical research, such as drug trials (Kitcher).

Mallon (2004, 2006) suggests that although these metaphysical positions primarily reflect relatively unimportant semantic differences, the normative repercussions are more dramatic. For whether or not to use the term race in our ethical and political discourse, and more concretely whether to use racial categories in public policy and political institutions, are questions of enormous normative significance. At issue are the capacity of oppressed racial groups to mobilize collectively and the legitimacy of race-specific policies such as affirmative action and race-conscious electoral districts. For instance, if one espouses racial skepticism, one is likely to espouse race eliminativism. Consequently, it becomes difficult (although not impossible) to justify race-based solidarity and policies (Appiah 1996, 102-104). It is for precisely this reason that racial constructivists defend the continuing significance of race and, consequently, for race-specific policies and mobilization. To bolster this practical aim, racial constructivists can draw on numerous empirical social scientific studies outlining the differences among socially constructed races in terms of social well-being, political preferences, and self-identification, although this evidence can at times complicate arguments for race-specific policies.

Stephen Cornell and Douglas Hartmann (1998) summarize many of the characteristics of race as found within ethnographic studies in the fields of sociology and anthropology. Focusing on the United States, they depict race as “a human group defined by itself or others as distinct by virtue of perceived common physical characteristics that are held to be inherent. A race is a group of human beings socially defined on the basis of physical characteristics. Determining which characteristics constitute the race – the selection of markers and therefore the construction of the racial category itself – is a choice human beings make. Neither markers nor categories are predetermined by any biological factors” (Cornell and Hartmann 1998, 24). Race is thus distinct from ethnicity, the other great marker of inter-generational communities, which is defined as some sense of common ancestry based on largely symbolic cultural attachments, past linguistic heritage, religious affiliations, claimed kinship, or some physical traits (1998, 19).

More precisely, Cornell and Hartmann outline five characteristics that distinguish race from ethnicity: racial identity is typically externally imposed by outsiders, as when whites created the negro race to homogenize the multiple groups they encountered in Africa or among African slaves brought to America; race is a result of early globalization, when European explorers “discovered” and then conquered peoples with radically different phenotypical traits; race typically involves power relations, from the basic power to define the race of others to the more expansive power to deprive certain racial groups of social, economic, or political benefits; racial identities are typically hierarchical, with certain races being perceived as superior to others; and racial identity is perceived as inherent, something individuals are born with (1998, 27-29).

Although individuals can be said to inherit their ethnic identity, Cornell and Hartmann suggest that race provokes a more “radical” sense alterity, since the immediate visual impact of the physical traits associated with race enable individuals to lump other individuals together prior to exchanging communication or accessing cultural information. And the emphasis on gross morphological traits allows racial categories often to encompass multiple ethnic groups (1998, 26). So for instance, people racially coded as “Black” may possess distinct ethnic identities with divergent cultures, such as recent immigrants from Kenya versus African Americans whose ancestors came to America 300 years ago. Indeed Mary Waters (1999) and Philip Kasinitz (1992) document how phenotypically black West Indian immigrants exercise agency asserting their ethnic identity in order to differentiate themselves from native-born African Americans, although again discrimination and violence aimed at all Blacks, regardless of ethnicity, often (but not always) generate the background context to such exercises of agency. Consequently, in societies marked by racial differentiation, racial identity takes on a more immediate character; as a result, individuals are less able to choose whether or not to identify with a specific race and more able to choose whether or not to identify with a specific ethnicity, at least in strongly racially differentiated societies such as the United States.

So for instance, individuals who phenotypically appear white and have ancestors from Ireland can choose more easily whether or not to assert their Irish identity (say, through the symbolic celebration of St. Patrick's Day) than whether or not to assert their white identity (Cornell and Hartmann 1998, 29-30). Moreover, Mary Waters (1990) argues that the high level of intermarriage among white Americans from various national ancestries grants their children significant “ethnic options” in choosing which of their multiple heritages to identify with. Such agency is typically lacking in racial identities, which are externally imposed through informal perceptions and formal laws and policies. Indeed, a person with one Irish parent and one Italian parent, while inheriting these ethnic roots, can choose whether or not to identify with either ethnicity, but American society will generally and immediately perceive this person as white. Compare this to a person with one Irish parent and one Kenyan parent, who might also have choices regarding ethnic identity but whom American society will most likely perceive as black. The greater constraints regarding racial identity stem from the role of informal perceptions and formal laws in imposing racial identity externally. Examples of formal, legal imposition of racial identity include Census categorization (Nobles 2000) and the infamous “hypodescent” laws, which defined people as black if they had one drop of African blood (Davis 1991). Less well known but equally striking are the “prerequisite cases,” judicial opinions issued to determine whether specific immigrants could be classified as white, since the original American naturalization law of 1789 restricted eligibility for citizenship only to “white” immigrants (Lopez 1996).

The line between race and ethnicity gets blurred in the case of Asians and Latinos in the United States. Yen Le Espiritu (1992) notes that Asian American racial identity, which of course encompasses a remarkable level of ethnic diversity, results from a combination of external assignment and agency, as when Asians actively respond to anti-Asian discrimination or violence through political action and a sense of shared fate. Such agency, in this instance, reacts to the initial imposition of a common racial identity, one based on shared phenotypes regardless of distinct ethnic or cultural heritage, as when unemployed white auto workers assaulted a Chinese-American due to frustration towards the dominance of Japanese car companies. But agency can also be exercised more proactively, as when Indian immigrants successfully lobbied Congress to include them within the Census's Asian racial category so as to render them eligible for affirmative action benefits under the Small Business Administration Act. Notably, while Espiritu uses the term “panethnicity” to describe Asian American identity, this concept clearly has racial connotations, given the “racial lumping” together of members of diverse Asian ethnicities into a single racial group defined by phenotypical traits. Thus, she pointedly notes that “African Americans [are] the earliest and most developed pan-ethnic group in the United States” (1992, 174). Hispanic or Latino identity exhibits traits similar to pan-ethnicity. Indeed, unlike Asian identity, Hispanic identity is not even a formal racial identity under the Census. However, informal perceptions, affirmative action policies, and discrimination based on physical appearance nevertheless tend to lump together various national ancestries that share some connection to Latin America (See Rodriquez 2000). In this way, one might say that Hispanics and Asians constitute incompletely racialized groups (Blum 2002, 149-155).

Moreover, scholars have noted that Jews (Brodkin 1998) and the Irish (Ignatiev 1995) were once were considered distinct, non-white races but now are considered to be racially white ethnic groups. This migration from racial group to ethnic group depended importantly on the exercise of agency, in particular efforts by members of these groups to distance themselves socially from African Americans by adopting anti-black racism, achieving some economic success, and exercising political power. Thus, it is conceivable that groups today considered to be sociological racial groups could transform into something more like an ethnic group.

The multi-dimensional origins of racial identities complicate the justification for race-specific social mobilization, policies, and institutions. Instead of simply arguing that certain racial identities, as opposed to ethnic identities, are imposed from without and bear certain costs, James (2004) argues that moral and political philosophers must provide more context-sensitive justifications that weigh the benefits of such measures against the cost of perpetuating racialized identities that lump together diverse individuals and groups.

3. Race in Moral, Political and Legal Philosophy

Two strands in moral, political, and legal philosophy are pertinent to the concept of race. One strand examines the moral status of the concept of race; the other addresses the justice of specific policies or institutional forms that seek to redress racial inequality, such as affirmative action, race-conscious electoral districting, and the general question of colorblindness in law and policy. Both strands demand reflection upon the metaphysics of race discussed above, but in fact only the moral status strand consistently addresses this question, with the result being that many scholars debate the justice of policies like affirmative action without deeply questioning the ontological status of the groups involved. That said, three philosophers articulate indispensable positions in addressing the moral status of the concept of race.

Lawrence Blum (2002) examines both the concept of race and the problem of racism. He argues that “racism” be restricted to two referents: inferiorization, or the denigration of a group due to its putative biological inferiority; and antipathy, or the “bigotry, hostility, and hatred” towards another group defined by its putatively inherited physical traits (2002, 8). These two moral sins deserve this heightened level of condemnation associated with the term racism, because they violate moral norms of “respect, equality, and dignity” and because they are historically connected to extreme and overt forms of racial oppression (2002, 27). But because these connections make “racism” so morally loaded a term, it should not be applied to “lesser racial ills and infractions” that suggest mere ignorance, insensitivity or discomfort regarding members of different groups (28), since doing so will apply a disproportionate judgment against the person so named, closing off possible avenues for fruitful moral dialogue.

Continuing with the historical connection between racism and extreme oppression, Blum argues against using the term race, since this biologically defined term no longer has any biological foundation. Instead, he advocates using the term “racialized group” to denote those socially constructed identities whose supposedly inherited common physical traits are used to impose social, political, and economic costs. To Blum, “racialized group” creates distance from the biological conception of race and it admits of degrees, as in the case of Latinos, whom Blum describes as an “incompletely racialized group” (2002, 151). This terminological shift, and its supposed revelation of the socially constructed character of physiognomically defined identities, need not require the rejection of group-specific policies such as affirmative action. Members of socially constructed racialized identities suffer real harms, and laws might have to distinguish individuals according to their racialized identities in order to compensate for such harms. Nevertheless, Blum remains ambivalent about such measures, arguing that even when necessary they remain morally suspect (2002, 97).

Similar ambivalence is also expressed by Anthony Appiah, earlier discussed regarding the metaphysics of race. While his metaphysical racial skepticism was cited as grounding his normative position of eliminativism, Appiah is “against races” but “for racial identities” (1996). Because a wide social consensus claims that races exist, individuals are ascribed to races regardless of their individual choices or desires. Moreover, racial identity remains far more salient and costly than ethnic identity (1996, 80-81). As a result, mobilization along racial lines is justifiable, in order to combat racism. But even at this point, Appiah still fears that racial identification may constrain individual autonomy by requiring members of racial groups to behave according to certain cultural norms or “scripts” that have become dominant within a specific racial group. Appiah thus concludes, “Racial identity can be the basis of resistance to racism; but even as we struggle against racism…let us not let our racial identities subject us to new tyrannies” (1996, 104). This residual ambivalence, to recall the metaphysical discussions of the last section, perhaps ground Mallon's contention that Appiah remains an eliminativist rather than a racial constructivist, since ideally Appiah would prefer to be free of all residual constraints entailed by even socially constructed races. Notably, Blum believes that even Appiah's ambivalent espousal of racial identity undermines Appiah's radical critique of race, since it fails to require that those adopting racial identities for political reasons be sufficiently aware that race is a biologically false social construction (Blum 2002, 224-225, footnote 34).

Tommie Shelby tries to combat the ambivalence of Appiah and Blum through resources found within Martin Delany's Black nationalism, distinguishing classical black nationalism, which rested upon an organic black identity, with pragmatic black nationalism, based on an instrumental concern with combating anti-black racism (2005, 38-52; 2003, 666-668). Pragmatic nationalism allows blacks to generate solidarity across class or cultural lines, not just through the modus vivendi of shared interests but upon a principled commitment to racial equality and justice (2005, 150-154). As a result, black solidarity is grounded upon a principled response to common oppression, rather than some putative shared identity (2002). Black solidarity, if rightly understood, is rational and principled and thus mitigates the dangers of biological essentialism that Appiah associates with race and the tyranny of cultural conformity that Appiah associates with racial identities.

Turning to the second strand of practical philosophy devoted to race, various scholars have addressed policies such as affirmative action, race-conscious electoral districting, and colorblindness in policy and law. The literature on affirmative action is immense, and may be divided into approaches that focus on compensatory justice, distributive justice, critiques of the concept of merit, and diversity of perspective. Alan Goldman (1979) generally argues against affirmative action, since jobs or educational opportunities as a rule should go to those most qualified. Only when a specific individual has been victimized by racial or other discrimination can the otherwise irrelevant factor of race be used as a compensatory measure to award a position or a seat at a university. Ronald Fiscus (1992) rejects the compensatory scheme in favor of a distributive justice argument. He claims that absent the insidious and invidious effects of a racist society, success in achieving admissions to selective universities or attractive jobs would be randomly distributed across racial lines. Thus, he concludes that distributive justice requires the racially proportional distribution of jobs and university seats. Of course, Fiscus's argument displaces the role of merit in the awarding of jobs or university admissions, but this point is addressed by Iris Young (1990, Chapter 7), who argues that contemporary criteria of merit, such as standardized testing and educational achievement, are biased against disadvantaged racial and other groups, and rarely are functionally related to job performance or academic potential. Finally, Michel Rosenfeld (1991) turns away from substantive theories of justice in favor of a conception of justice as reversibility, a position influenced by the “Discourse Ethics” of Jürgen Habermas (1990), which defines justice not by the proper substantive awarding of goods but as the result of a fair discursive procedure that includes all relevant viewpoints and is free of coercive power relations. Thus, affirmative action is justified as an attempt to include racially diverse viewpoints. All of these positions are discussed more superficially in a useful, if not always concise, debate format in Cohen and Sterba (2003).

The issue of race-conscious electoral districting and representation has also garnered substantial scholarly attention among political theorists, empirical political scientists, and legal scholars. Race-conscious districting is the practice of drawing geographically based electoral districts so that the majority or plurality of voters within that district are members of a racial group that is a minority within the state or the nation as a whole. Race-based representation holds that members of a given racial group are best represented in the government by other members of the same racial group. This position is a more specific variant of the idea of mirror or descriptive representation, which holds that representatives should resemble their constituents in key characteristics. Apart from its application to race, mirror or descriptive representation is most commonly applied to the representation of women. Descriptive representation is linked to race-conscious electoral districting because majority black districts, for instance, are much more likely to elect black representatives.

An early, though critical, discussion of the problem of descriptive representation can be found in Pitkin (1967). Iris Marion Young (1990, 183-191) provides a spirited defense of descriptive representation for women and racial minorities, grounded in their experiences of “oppression, the institutional constraint on self-determination”, and domination “the institutional constraint on self-determination” (1990, 37). Anne Phillips (1995) furthers this position, arguing that representatives who are members of minority racial groups can enhance legislative deliberation. Melissa Williams (1998) also defends the deliberative contribution of descriptive racial representation, but adds that minority constituents are more likely to trust minority representatives, since both will be affected by laws that overtly or covertly discriminate against minority racial groups. Finally, Jane Mansbridge (1999) carefully demonstrates why a critical mass of minority representatives is needed, in order to adequately advocate for common minority interests as well as to convey the internal diversity within the group.

In a later work, Young (2000) addresses critics who argue that descriptive representation relies upon group essentialism, since members of a racial group need not all share the same interests or opinions. In response, Young suggests that members of the same racial group do share the same “social perspective” grounded not in biological essences but in common disadvantages imposed through social structures. Not unlike the interactive kind variant of racial constructivism discussed earlier, Young suggests that such social positioning generates a similar perspective on the social world, even if racial group members derive differing interests or opinions from their common position. However, James and Goldfinger (2005) argue that Young's theory of social perspective can avoid a new type of social essentialism only if based upon something more concrete, such as group-differentiated direct or indirect experiences. But because all members of the group are unlikely to have had such experiences, racially differentiated social positions reflect at best a difference in statistical probability. For example, African Americans are likely to have a distinct social perspective on the question of police brutality not because all of them have been mistreated or know someone who was, but because they are statistically more likely to have been mistreated or know someone who was.

Political scientists have also empirically examined the question of descriptive representation, and have come to divergent conclusions. David Canon (1999) argues that race-conscious electoral districting has produced black and Latino representatives who not only robustly represent the interests of minority race constituents but also those of white voters. David Lublin (1997, 2004) argues, however, that creating majority black or Latino districts, particularly in the South, increases the white population of the surrounding districts, leading to the election of white legislators who are more conservative than would have been the case if black or Latino voters were more evenly distributed in various districts. The result is a polarized legislature, one that includes more black representatives who nevertheless experience little legislative success, since they are consistently outvoted by conservative white legislators. Carol Swain (1993) shares this concern and favors coalition building among white and black voters to elect mutually satisfactory white and black representatives. Focusing on African American members of the House of Representatives, Katherine Tate (2003) defends descriptive representation for the symbolic as well as substantive benefits that it provides to black constituents, and while she finds that black representatives generate greater trust among black constituents, she does not find that they spur their constituents to participate in the political process to a greater extent.

Legal theoretical debates about race-conscious districting have been extensive. Most famously, Abigail Thernstrom (1987) has argued that race-conscious districting violates the original principles behind the 1965 Voting Rights Act and the 15th Amendment, the two most important legal pillars supporting the right to vote by racial minorities, since it seeks to promote the election of black representatives rather than simply guaranteeing black voters the right to cast ballots. J. Morgan Kousser (1999) responds that race-conscious districting reflects simply an expansive view of voting rights, one that grants racial minorities the right to cast a vote that is (almost) as likely to support a winning candidate as the votes cast by white voters. He proceeds to note that the 15th Amendment protects against not only the denial but also the “abridgment” of the right to vote, and that Congress can and has legitimately expanded the goals of the Voting Rights Act so as to avoid such abridgment. Lani Guinier (1994) provides a compelling alternative: instead of drawing majority black or Latino districts, replace the winner-take-all single member electoral system with a more proportional system that facilitates the electoral strength of all minorities, be they based on race, ideology, religion, or some other characteristic. In turn, Michael James (2004) suggests that alternative electoral systems might not only facilitate race-based descriptive representation but also democratic deliberation across racial lines.

A general advantage of alternative electoral systems in facilitating the representation of racial minorities is that they are technically colorblind: in other words, they do not require lawmakers or judges to group citizens according to their racial identities. The general value of colorblindness is an ongoing topic of debate within legal philosophy. In his famous dissent in Plessy v. Ferguson, where the United States Supreme Court upheld the constitutionality of segregation, Justice John Marshall Harlan initiated the idea that the American Constitution, and particularly the 14th Amendment Equal Protection Clause, is meant to be “colorblind.” Drawing on Harlan's dissent and on a not-uncontroversial interpretation of the origins behind the equal protection clause, Andrew Kull (1992) argues that contemporary American statutory and constitutional law should strive to be colorblind. Measures to combat racial inequality must avoid dividing citizens into different racial groups, and thus Kull favors race-neutral policies of economic upliftment over race-based affirmative action or race-conscious districting. Ian Haney Lopez (2006, 143-162), on the other hand, fears “colorblind white dominance,” whereby facially race-neutral laws leave untouched the race-based inequality that operates within American political, legal, and economic structures.


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affirmative action | feminist (interventions): metaphysics | heritability | identity politics | Kant, Immanuel: social and political philosophy | race theory, critical