Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Jul 15, 2004; substantive revision Thu May 28, 2009

A heritable trait is most simply an offspring's trait that resembles the parents' corresponding trait. Inheritance or heredity was a focus of systematic research before its inclusion as a key concept within evolutionary theory. An influential 18th and early 19th century theory of heredity was preformationism. This view took several forms, each maintaining that organisms were passed on from one generation to the next, miniature and yet fully formed, and development was simply the growth of the miniature organism. Subsequent accounts of heredity included the theory that organisms inherited traits that their parents had developed through response to various environmental pressures. This view was widely held during the 19th century and usually attributed to Lamarck. Although Darwin also at times defended aspects of Lamarck's view, he also clearly articulates and defends the view that evolutionary change results from natural selection acting upon inherited traits under variation. Weismann's experimental refutation of the inheritance of acquired traits paved the way for the combination of Darwin and Mendel's views of the nature of heredity. The systematic study of heredity in the 20th century focused on the gene as the unit of heredity. (There is a vast amount of helpful work on the history of heredity including Keller (2002), Griesemer (1994), Morange (1998), Moss (2003), Sapp (2003), Sarkar (1998), Wade (1992), Winther (2000; 2001) and contributors to Buerton et al. (eds.) (2000).) Two traditions now dominate the study of heredity: population genetics and molecular biology. The notion of a quantitative measure of the heritability of any given trait comes from population genetics. The idea that what is inherited is a stock of DNA, or the information contained in the DNA sequence, comes from molecular biology.

Philosophical discussions of heredity have focused on the sustainability of heritability analyses and more recently on the units of heredity. Here I introduce the concept of heritability and the problems associated with it.

1. Terminological issues

The term “heritable” applies to traits that are similar in parents and offspring. We inherit numerous attributes from our parents including their religious beliefs and, if we are lucky, their vast fortunes. The kinds of hereditary traits that biologists are interested in are those that are reliably transmitted from one generation to the next as a matter of biology. Darwin (1859/1968), working without the advantages that genetics would later bring, discussed hereditary traits at the level of phenotypes. Darwin demonstrated that natural selection sorts among hereditary variations, for example, the height of an organism, its weight, the color of its coat and so on. Most contemporary discussions of heredity constrain hereditary traits to those that can be demonstrated to be passed on genetically. The concept of “heritability” was introduced “to quantify the level of predictability of passage of a biologically interesting phenotype from parent to offspring” (Feldman, 151). Heritability is usually assessed by complex statistical analysis, careful experimentation or both.

Discussions of heredity invite confusions between mechanisms responsible for individual development and mechanisms responsible for the transmission of traits from one generation to the next. Genes are the standard units of inheritance discussed in biology. Genes are also taken to be the most important causal component in the development of an organism's traits. Methods derived from population genetics to assess heritability provide no information about the causal mechanisms contributing to the development of an individual's traits. Population geneticists study the patterns of transmission of traits in populations from one generation to the next. Molecular biologists identify coding sequences of DNA and hence the proteins that these sequence produce in the developing organism. Working together, molecular biologists and population geneticists can produce a convergent account of a particular gene, providing both its pattern of transmission and an account of its role in development. For example, medical geneticists may discover a pattern of inheritance for a disease in a family that leads them to hypothesize that there is a gene (or a number of genes) responsible for the development of the trait in individual humans. Molecular analysis may then lead to the discovery of a sequence of DNA that codes for an unusual protein that is in part responsible for the development of the symptoms of the disease. Finally, population genetics techniques, such as heritability analysis, may then be applied to mechanisms discovered by molecular biologists.

2. Population genetics and the attempt to measure the heritability of traits

Mendelian genetics provides laws that govern the passing on of discrete traits from one generation to the next. For example, Mendel experimentally demonstrated particular patterns of inheritance for smooth and wrinkled peas in a population of pea plants. Discrete or discontinuous traits contrast with continuous or quantitative traits. Height in humans and leaf number in trees are continuous traits. Continuous traits vary on a continuum that can be represented as a normal distribution, graphed as a bell curve. Most philosophical discussion about heredity and heritability arises from the study of continuous traits.

The study of quantitative or continuous traits can be carried out by looking simply at phenotypes. For example, if a population of plants varies in height we can ask how much of this variation is due to genes. Assessing the proportion of the variation of a trait in a population that is due to genes is achieved by a statistical method called the analysis of variance. Once this analysis has been carried out a simple formula provides a number between 0 and 1 that is the heritability measure for the trait in question. I will use a few simple examples to illustrate the important concepts involved in producing heritability measures.

Before we consider the analysis of variance and its contribution to heritability measures, it is helpful to understand the general concept of heritability. Heritability is a measure of genetic influence. If a trait has high heritability, its varying from individual to individual in a population can be explained genetically. An imaginary example illustrates one way of assessing heritability. Say we have two students from a class and student a is 6′2″ and student b is 4′2″. To discover the influence of genes on height, we could clone both students and then swap the clones' environments and see what happens. In the figure below, the environments that a and b grew up in are Ea and Eb. Clones of a and b are Ca and Cb.

Ea Eb
1 Cb = 4′2″ Ca = 6′2″ Height is genetic
2 Cb = 5′8″ Ca = 5′8″ Height results from genes and environment
3 Cb = 6'2″ Ca = 4′2″ Height results entirely from environment

A scenario like 2 is the most likely outcome. Of course we can't clone humans (or faithfully replicate the environments they grow up in). We can do this with plants and other kinds of experimental organisms and as a result we can get a good sense of the contribution of genes to variation in a phenotypic trait.

Heritability can be estimated in humans by comparing resemblance in the phenotypic traits of twins. Twin studies make the following assumptions: Monozygotic, (identical), twins share all their genes and their environment but dizygotic, (fraternal), twins share half their genes and their environment. For any given trait, say height, we get the following results:

If heritability is high and variation is due mostly to genes, then monozygotic twins will be closer in height than fraternal twins.

If heritability is low and variation in height is due mostly to the environment, then monozygotic twins will be as different in height from one another as dyzygotic twins.

Finally, we can get a sense of the heritability of a trait by finding the slope of the regression line on the plots of offspring value for a trait graphed with parental value. If the slope is 1, the trait is entirely genetic and if the slope is 0, then the trait is not genetic at all. If the variation among individuals is due to variation in their genes, then offspring ought to resemble their parents. Heritability is always a value between 1 and 0. In the graph below values for mid-parent height and mid-offspring height are plotted for a small sample population (mid-parent height is the average of the height of both parents). The slope of the regression line is .75, which indicates high heritability. (It should be stressed that this is a very informal presentation of this kind of estimation of heritability and for this approach to provide any useful results important constraints on the nature of the population and the relevant environment would have to be satisfied.)


So far we have introduced methods of measuring or calculating heritability that are somewhat intuitive. The problem is that these methods do not acknowledge all that is involved in the production of variation in the quantitative traits of organisms in a population. If we stick to the example of variation in height in a sample population of humans, we will discover that in most representative samples, heights are distributed more or less normally. The variance in height is defined as the average of the squared difference between each measured height and the mean height for the population. Variance in phenotype or phenotypic variance is symbolized as VP. (From here until the end of this section I adopt a specific strategy for presenting the equations used in spelling out heritability relations. I start out, with equation (1) below, by presenting the simplest version of the relevant equations. Simple equations such as (1) below are rarely ever satisfied but are routinely presented as adequate in elementary introductions to behavioral genetics. Subsequent equations in the sequence below render the relevant situation more accurately. Population geneticists endorse variants of (1′) below and do not endorse (1).)

(1) VP = VG + VE

Equation (1) simply says that the phenotypic variance is the variance due to genes plus the variance due to the organisms' environment. Behavioral geneticists and psychologists introduce heritability in the following way: Heritability is the proportion of phenotypic variance that is attributable to genotypic variance: heritability = VG/VP

This notion of heritability is called broad sense heritability, hb2 , and is “the proportion of phenotypic differences due to all sources of genetic variance” (Plomin 1990, 234). Narrow sense heritability, h2, is “the proportion of phenotypic variance due solely to additive genetic variance” (Plomin 1990, 234).

(2) hb2 = VG/VP

(3) h2 = VA/VP

“Additive genetic variation (VA) is variation among individuals due to the additive effects of genes” (Freeman and Heron, 206). For example, variation in height of organisms could result from the contribution of several alleles at a locus where each allele contributes more height to the organism. For example, allele A could contribute .5 units to an organism's height, allele a another .5 units and so on. A contrast with additive genetic variance is dominance variance (VD). In this case, say two alleles (A and a) are responsible for the organism's height. An organism with aa is 1.0 units high, an organism with AA is 2.0 units high but an organism with Aa is also only 2.0 units high. Total genetic variance, VG, is actually the sum of all the genetic variance. In the simplified case presented here this is

(4) VG = VA + VD

The implied equation for VP from the discussion so far is

(1′) VP = VA + VD + VE

But this equation still oversimplifies the situation and requires more refining to deal with quantitative traits. Variance in phenotype can result from gene interaction effects, or epistatic variance, VI. This occurs when alleles at one locus have an effect on the phenotype that is dependent upon alleles at one or more other loci. Further, there may be a contribution to phenotypic variance from gene/environment interaction, VG×E. This occurs when the effect of the environment on the phenotype differs between genotypes. Finally, VP can be effected by non-random correlations between genotypes and environments referred to as gene-environment covariation, COV(G,E). For example, if plants with a genotype that tends to produce large plants also select nutrient- rich environments and plants with a genotype that tends to produce small plants also select nutrient- poor environments, the variance in height would be increased. If the relation was switched the variance would decrease (Futuyma 1998). Factoring all the above in we now have the following:

(1′) VP = VA + VD + VI + VE + VG×E + COV(G,E)


(4′) VG = VA + VD + VI

The assumption made by many evolutionary biologists is that VI, VG×E and COV(G,E) are generally small and the most important component of variance from an evolutionary standpoint is VA. As a result, evolutionary biologists are usually interested in h2 (= VA/VP). In contrast, psychologists and behavioral geneticists are more interested in hb2 (= VG/VP). Psychologists are interested in the contribution of genes to human psychological traits whereas evolutionary biologists use heritability measures to predict and measure the response of a trait to selection. The relevant equation here is

(5) h2 = R/S

where, R is response to selection and S is the selection differential. Heritability in this context is referred to as realized heritability.

Philosophical discussion over measuring heritability has arisen mostly from the use of hb2 measures in behavioral genetics and psychology. Much of this discussion takes off from a paper by Lewontin (1974) in which he argues that the analysis of variance cannot provide us with answers to questions about how much genes contribute to variance in a given trait.

3. Philosophical issues arising from heritability analysis

Discussions of the viability of heritability measures were most heated in the 1970s and 1980s. In the 1970s discussions about IQ and race came to a head (this issue was revisited in the 1990s with the publication of Herrnstein and Murray (1999)), and in the late 1970s and early 1980s sociobiology came under critical scrutiny. Both proponents of the hereditary nature of IQ and sociobiologists made a connection between human behavioral traits and genes. Hereditarians in the IQ debates explicitly relied upon heritability analyses such as those introduced above. Critics of sociobiology and hereditarianism over IQ included biologists, philosophers and many social scientists as well as many left-leaning political and social activists (See Gould (1981), Paul (1998) and Segerstråle (2000) for some of the relevant history here).

The point of departure for many philosophers criticizing heritability analysis is Lewontin's (1974) paper on the analysis of variance. (It is worth noting that Lewontin's paper is somewhat informal and should perhaps be best viewed as Lewontin's attempt to pass on the received wisdom among population geneticists at the time to a wider audience. The formal arguments Lewontin alludes to are presented in a number of places including Layzer (1974) (and later Kempthorne (1978)) and precursors to these arguments can be found in Hogben (1933) and can also be found in R.A. Fisher's work.) Lewontin claimed that equation (1′) above presented the most accurate picture of the contributions to phenotypic variance. He went on to argue that VI, VG×E and COV(G,E) were not negligible. In fact, he argues that these are always part and parcel of the variance in traits. As a result, apportioning the phenotypic variance between genes and environment is no easy matter and standard analyses of variance simply cannot come up with useful and informative values for hb2 and h2. Lewontin also pointed out that many proponents of heritability measures mistakenly attribute the heritability values to individuals rather than populations. Finally, he argued that norms of reaction gave a more accurate picture of the relations between genes, environment and phenotypic traits. A norm of reaction is a graph of a quantitative phenotype plotted as a function of environment for different genotypes. Many philosophers and biologists have extended and refined Lewontin's criticism of the analysis of variance (e.g. Block 1995, Kitcher 1985, Sarkar 1998, Sober 1988) and most have shared his conclusions that heritability measures are hard to come by and that norms of reaction are a superior way to examine gene/environment interactions.

One response to these kinds of criticisms is to emphasize caution in the use of heritability measures and to re-emphasize Lewontin's point that such measures do not provide information about the traits of individuals (See e.g. Plomin et al. 1990; 1997, Hamer and Copeland 1998). Kitcher (1985) pointed out in response to this line of defense that words of caution do not seem to be enough and many behavioral geneticists and psychologists still talk as if they can discover the genetic components of human behavioral traits by using heritability analyses. A second line of response is to argue that norms of reaction are almost impossible to generate for complex human traits and, as a result, are not a serious contender in the business of ascertaining the genetic causes of human traits. Lewontin himself introduced this problem for norms of reaction. In organisms whose genotypes and environments can be exhaustively manipulated, a norm of reaction for a particular trait can be produced. Lewontin cites early work on Drosophila larvae's responses to temperature as pioneering work of this kind. The problem for most human traits, particularly human behavioral traits, is that we have no clear sense of either what the relevant genes to examine are or what the range of relevant environments is. This response need not necessarily blunt Lewontin's critical attack on heritability measures, as in cases where a norm of reaction can be reliably produced, we do have more information about the relations between genes and environment than can be provided by a standard analysis of variance. Further, attempts to experimentally partition the contribution of genetic variance to phenotypic variance run into problems for human traits similar to the problems presented by attempts to generate norms of reaction. The examples in Section 2. above are artificial for a reason: it is hard to establish the relevant genotypes and environments that lead to variance in human traits. The current consensus among philosophers of biology is that heritability analyses are misleading about the genetic causes of human traits. New work on norms of reaction (see e.g. Pigliucci 2001) reinforces Lewontin's point about the information that can be gained from such analyses.

4. Prospects and recommendations for further reading

There is something of a consensus in most fields (e.g. philosophy of biology, evolutionary biology, psychology and behavioral genetics) that heritability measures (particularly hb2 measures) only have a very limited use. The consensus among philosophers of biology is that broad heritability measures are uninformative but there are a few dissenting voices (e.g. Sesardic 1993 and 2005). Kaplan (2000) provides an introduction to heritability and its use in behavioral genetics. Sarkar (1998) presents a sophisticated (and technically quite difficult) treatment of arguments against heritability. Freeman and Heron (1998) present a clear analysis of the problems with the use of heritability measures by proponents of the connection between IQ and race (understanding this analysis requires some knowledge of statistics). Block (1995) presents an overview of arguments against the use of heritability measures in the IQ and race literature. This overview is helpful and specifically designed for a non-technical audience. Sober (1988) presents a defense of Lewontin's (1974) criticism of the use of the analysis of variance in assessing the role of genes in the formation of traits of individuals.

Sesardic's recent work is a criticism of those who invoke Lewontin- style arguments against heritability analyses. He argues in favor of hereditarianism by attacking critics. He summarizes his complaint as follows: “For some reason in [the heritability] debate philosophers have displayed a surprising lack of intellectual curiosity and analytical acuity” (2005, 9). This is because

they hastily accepted anti-hereditarian arguments that possessed only superficial plausibility. Soon these arguments, without being exposed to adequate critical scrutiny, rigidified into a philosophical consensus. The paradigm was established and ruled for decades, not because of its theoretical advantages but because its problematic sides went unnoticed. Easily anticipated objections were not considered at all, obvious alternatives were not explored, and gross misinterpretations created the illusion of an easy victory. To make things worse, and quite unusually for this field otherwise known for its high intellectual standards, in this small segment of philosophy of science even prominent scholars are often poorly informed about basic scientific facts in the very domain of their explorations (2005, 9).

Sesardic's criticism is polemical and does not introduce any new techniques in heritability analysis to the philosophical audience. Rather, he relies on a recapitulation of earlier views, such as those of Jensen, one of the original targets of Lewontin's critique. There are several spirited responses to Sesardic's book (Jim Tabery's (2006; forthcoming b) reviews are examples) and Gri Oftedal (2005) presents a clarification of the issues at stake between Sesardic and Lewontin.

Part of what is at stake between followers of Lewontin and Sesardic is whether or not VGxE and other components of variance are negligible or significant. This issue is not purely philosophical and can and has been tackled experimentally. Tabery (forthcoming a) draws attention to a longitudinal study by psychologists Caspi and Moffitt, who show GxE effects in a longitudinal study of human anti-social behavior disorders, in support of a view in line with Lewontin's. Douglas Wahlsten also pursues this issue in much of his experimental work (Wahlsten 1990 summarizes his theoretical views and Wahlsten and Gottfried 1997 is a good survey of some of the relevant experimental work on animals).

There is some irony in the fact that philosophers of biology, who focus their attention almost exclusively on evolutionary biology, are critics of heritability. Heredity is a central component to evolutionary change and heritability analysis, particularly via the notion of realized heritability (see equation 5) above), is an important component of theoretical evolutionary biology. The critical attack on heritability arises against the background of nature/nurture debates and concerns over genetic determinism and is best understood as a critical appraisal of behavioral geneticists in psychology. There is little philosophical work that critically takes on the notion of heritability in its evolutionary context. The notion of realized heritability is briefly discussed by Samir Okasha (2006) (See also Downes forthcoming) but a thorough discussion of the relations between heritability and other central concepts of evolutionary theory has thus far been pursued by evolutionary biologists (E.g. Lynch and Walsh 1998 and Rice 2004). Peter Visscher et al.'s (2008) review article is a nice introduction to much of the work in this area. This is a productive area for future philosophical research.


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