Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Paul Ricoeur

First published Mon Nov 11, 2002; substantive revision Mon Oct 3, 2005

Paul Ricoeur (1913–2005) is widely recognized as one of the most distinguished philosophers of our time. In the course of his career he has written extensively on a broad range of issues. Among his many books are two volumes on the philosophy of the will, namely Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary (1950, Eng. tr. 1966), and the two-part volume entitled Finitude and Culpability, whose two parts are Fallible Man (1960, Eng. tr. 1967, hereafter FM) and The Symbolism of Evil (1960, Eng. tr. 1970); Freud and Philosophy: An Essay on Interpretation (1965, Eng. tr. 1970); The Rule of Metaphor (1975, 1977 hereafter RM) the three-volume Time and Narrative (1983-85, Eng. tr. 1984-88, hereafter TN); the published version of his Gifford lectures, namely Oneself as Another (1990, Eng. tr. 1992, hereafter OAA); Memory, History, Forgetting (2000, Eng. tr. 2004, hereafter MHF) and The Course of Recognition (2004, Eng. tr. 2005 hereafter CR). In addition to his books, there are more than 500 essays, some of the most important of which are collected in ten volumes, many of which have already been translated into English, with more to follow. Among these volumes, of special importance are From Text to Action (1986, Eng. tr. 1991, hereafter TA) and The Just (1995, Eng. tr. 2000). For the most part his writings are concerned with developing a philosophical anthropology. This anthropology, which he came to call an anthropology of the “capable person,” aims to give an account of the fundamental capabilities and vulnerabilities that human beings display in the activities that make up their lives. Though the accent is always on the possibility of understanding the self, Ricoeur consistently rejects any Cartesianesque claim for an absolute transparency of the self to itself that would render self-knowledge independent of any kind of knowledge of the world.

In the course of developing his anthropology, Ricoeur made a major methodological shift. His writings prior to 1960 are in the tradition of existential phenomenology. But during the 60s Ricoeur concluded that properly to study human reality one had to combine phenomenological description with hermeneutic interpretation. For hermeneutics, whatever is intelligible is accessible to us in and through language and all deployments of language call for interpretation. Accordingly, “there is no self-understanding that is not mediated by signs, symbols, and texts; in the final analysis self-understanding coincides with the interpretation given to these mediating terms.”[1] Ricoeur's hermeneutic or linguistic turn did not require him to disavow the basic results of his earlier investigations. It did, however, lead him not only to revisit them but also to see more clearly their implications.

1. Biographical Sketch

Paul Ricoeur was born on February 27, 1913 in Valence, France. Orphaned in 1915 when his mother died and his father was killed soon thereafter in the Battle of the Marne, Ricoeur was reared by his paternal grandparents and an unmarried aunt in Rennes. He studied philosophy first at the University of Rennes and then at the Sorbonne. From the earliest years of his academic life he was convinced that there is a basic, irreducible difference between persons and things. Unlike things, persons can engage in free, thoughtful action. Nonetheless, he never accepted any version of a substance dualism in the person that the Cartesian cogito or the Kantian transcendental subject would require. After succeeding in his aggregation examination, he taught at lycées or studied in Germany until the outbreak of World War II. Soon after being drafted into the French army in 1940 he was captured and spent the rest of the war in prison camps in Germany. After the war and a three-year period of teaching at a lycée, Ricoeur was appointed a lecturer in the history of philosophy at the University of Strasbourg. He remained there until 1956, when he was named to the chair of general philosophy at the Sorbonne. In 1967, he joined the faculty of the new University of Paris at Nanterre, now Paris X. Except for three years spent at Louvain, he taught there until he reached the mandatory retirement age in 1980. From 1954 on, Ricoeur also taught regularly in the United States. Among the schools at which he taught are Haverford, Columbia, and Yale. In 1967 Ricoeur was named to succeed Paul Tillich as the John Nuveen professor of philosophical theology at the University of Chicago, with joint appointments in the Divinity School, the Philosophy Department, and the Committee on Social Thought. He held this position until 1992. Ricoeur's work has been widely translated not only into English and many European languages but also into Chinese and Japanese. Among his many honorary doctorates are those from Chicago (1967), Northwestern (1977), Columbia (1981), Goettingen (1987, and McGill (1992). He has received numerous awards, e.g. the Dante Prize (Florence, 1988), the Karl Jaspers Prize (Heidelberg, 1989), the Leopold Lucas Prize (Tubingen, 1990), and the French Academy Grand Prize for Philosophy (1991). He was a co-recipient of the John W. Kluge Prize in the Human Sciences awarded by the Kluge Center at the Library of Congress (2004) He delivered the Gifford Lectures at Edinburgh in 1986.

Ricoeur died May 20, 2005.

2. Pre-hermeneutic Anthropology

Already in Ricoeur's first major work, Freedom and Nature: The Voluntary and the Involuntary (1950), one finds an expression of a perennial theme central to his anthropology, namely the two-dimensional character of all constituent features of human existence. Contrary to Sartre's claim that there is radical difference between consciousness or the for-itself and materiality or the in-itself, a difference that pits the for-itself's freedom against the in-itself's sheer facticity, Ricoeur argues that the voluntary and involuntary dimensions of human existence are complementary. There is, to be sure, no seamless harmony between these two dimensions. Each person has to struggle with the conflict between them. But this conflict is what ultimately makes my freedom genuinely mine, what gives me my distinctive identity.

Ricoeur extends his account of freedom in Fallible Man and The Symbolism of Evil, both published in 1960. In these works he addresses the question of how it is possible for us to go wrong, to have a bad will. In Fallible Man he argues that there is a basic disproportion between the finite and the infinite dimensions of a human being. This disproportion is epitomized by the gap between bios or one's spatiotemporally located life and logos or one's reason that can grasp universals. This disproportion shows up in every aspect of human existence. It is manifest in perception, in thought and speech, in evaluation, and in action. By reason of this disproportion, we are never wholly at one with ourselves and hence we can go wrong. We are fallible.

This disproportion does not, Sartre notwithstanding, render our existence absurd. Rather, the very disproportion that makes us fallible and makes human evil possible is also what makes goodness, knowledge, and achievement possible. It is that which both distinguishes us from one another—each has his or her unique spatiotemporal location—and at the same time makes it possible for us to communicate with each other, through logos.

Though the unity of humanity is never more than a unity of communication, precisely because we can communicate the differences among us are never absolute. Furthermore, no one of us alone could be a person. Though each of us has an individual identity, our identities show that we are bound up with others. “Man is this plural and collective unity in which the unity of destination and the differences of destinies are to be understood through each other” (FM, 138).[2]

The kind of unity that binds people to one another even though they differ so much is the basis for their quest for esteem and recognition. This quest aims for genuine mutuality. It aims for a mutual esteem for the worth that each of us has by reason of both our common humanity and our individual uniqueness. This esteem positively values the disproportion constitutive of every person.

The theme of mutual recognition is developed more fully in Ricoeur's final book The Course of Recognition (CR).

Both the disproportion and the quest for mutual esteem are visible through the study of history. And attention to history, in turn, clarifies the nature of human freedom. For Ricoeur, there is indeed an order and structure to history. Otherwise history would be unintelligible. But history also recounts events and deeds that disrupt some prevailing order and reorder it.

These reflections lead Ricoeur to hold that human sayings and doings display both a freedom from natural processes and a dependence on these same processes for their efficacy. Sayings and doings would be meaningless if they did not fit into some antecedent structure or pattern established by natural processes on the one hand and prior sayings and doings. Indeed, our words and deeds get their significance from being responses to contexts not wholly of our own making. Admittedly, these contexts can and often do give our performances unintended meanings and values. Nonetheless, our exercises of freedom can have worth and efficacy only by reason of their embodiment in a natural and cultural setting that is largely not of our own making.[3]

Ricoeur's conception of the disproportion that characterizes human beings was, he came to conclude, insufficient to account for occurrences of actual bad will and evil deeds. No direct, unmediated inspection of the cogito, as Descartes and Husserl had proposed, could show why these evils, contingent as each of them is, in fact came to be. Recognizing the opacity of the cogito in this respect confirmed his suspicion that all self-understanding comes about only through “signs deposited in memory and imagination by the great literary traditions.”[4] This suspicion was a major motivator for his hermeneutic or “linguistic turn.”

Ricoeur explored his suspicion first in The Symbolism of Evil, a study devoted to learning from the great symbols and myths how people have tried to make sense of the enigma of evil. Then he turned his attention to other aspects of the cogito's opacity. Stimulated by structuralism, he embarked upon a detailed study of psychoanalysis that culminated in his Freud and Philosophy and the essays that make up his The Conflict of Interpretations (1969). These investigations reinforced his view that there is no unmediated self-understanding.

While recognizing the fruitfulness of structural analyses of particular well-defined fields of experience, Ricoeur resisted those structuralists who sought to reduce language to the functioning of a system of signs having no reference to anything outside itself. Following clues found in the works of the linguists Emil Benveniste and Roman Jakobson, he defined discourse as occurring when some person A says p about x to some person B in accordance with phonetic, lexical, syntactic, and stylistic rules. That is, discourse always involves as speaker or writer and a hearer or reader as well as something said about some topic. It follows that a full interpretation of discourse requires both the objective sort of analysis of which structuralism is an example and an appreciation of the self-understanding of the discursive partners.[5]

3. Hermeneutic Anthropology

In the aftermath of his “linguistic turn” Ricoeur does not abandon the basic claims of his earlier anthropology. As he had in Freedom and Nature, he continued to reject any form of substance dualism. And as he did in Fallible Man, he continued to emphasize the fragility of the human condition. But this turn led him to make major changes in his accounts of both language and action. On the one hand, he finds in his conception resources both for framing working hypotheses to make sense of human existence and for testing them. On the other hand, he comes to conclude that his earlier work on the will is insufficient for a solid philosophical anthropology. He had emphasized that the will involved an “internal” project or aim that was basically self-contained. But he came to conclude that one can only make sense of projects and intentions by seeing them as always connected to events in the world.

Properly conceived, action is that which brings projects and worldly events together, for action encompasses not only doing and making but also receiving and enduring. Action includes “saying inasmuch as it is a doing, ordinary action inasmuch as it is an intervention into the course of things, narration inasmuch as it is the narrative reassembling of a life stretched out in time, and finally, the capacity to impute to oneself or to others the responsibility for acting.”[6] Hence Ricoeur concludes that his conception of action is tantamount to Heidegger's conception of care as the fundamental way that persons exist and inhabit the world.[7]

The implications of Ricoeur's conceptions of discourse and action come together in a particularly striking way in his discussion of what he calls the narrative unity of a person's life. Whatever else a narrative recounts, he says, it also recounts care. Indeed, in a sense narrative “only recounts Care. This is why there is nothing absurd in speaking about the narrative unity of a life, under the sign of narratives that teach us how to articulate retrospection and prospection in a narrative way” (OAA, 163, translation modified).

Construing Heidegger's care in terms of action and thereby finding care-action to be at the heart of every narrative gives Ricoeur the basic resources for articulating the main themes of his mature anthropology. Among these themes are: (a) discourse and action, (b) selves as agents, (c) the temporality of action, (d) narrativity, identity, and time, (e) memory and history, (f) ethics, and (g) politics. Each of these themes deals with a fundamental feature of the constitutive capabilities of the human person.

3.1 Discourse and Action

In a seminal essay, “The Model of the Text: Meaningful Action Considered as a Text,” (TA, 146-67). Ricoeur's aim is both to set forth the essential constituents of all actions and to show that action is intelligible and the proper object of the social sciences. To do so he builds on his conception of discourse, of language in use.

Language contains within itself resources that allow it to be used creatively. Two important ways in which these resources come to light are (a) in the coining of metaphors and (b) in the fashoning of narratives. In The Rule of Metaphor, Ricoeur argues that there is a linguistic imagination that "generates and regenerates meaning through the living power of metaphoricity."[8] For him, fresh metaphors, metaphors that have not been reduced to the commonplace, reveal a new way of seeing their referents. They creatively transform language. Thus they are not merely rhetorical ornaments. They have genuine cognitive import in their own right and are untranslatable without remainder into literal language. In a similar manner, as I will develop more fully below, acts of narrating create new plots and characters, thereby also producing new meanings. Thus to become aware of the metaphorical and narrative resources resident in language is to see that notwithstanding the many rules and codes that govern language usage, it is always able to be used to be inventive, to produce new meanings.

Four traits of discourse, as distinct from language as a system, are of central importance for the analogy Ricoeur makes between texts and actions. First, a language system as conceived by structuralists is simply virtual and hence timeless, but discourse always occurs at some particular moment of time. Second, a language system is self-contained, but discourse always refers to persons who say or write or hear or read. Third, though a language system is a necessary condition for communication inasmuch as it provides the codes for communication, it itself does not communicate. Only discourse communicates among interlocutors. And fourth, the signs in a language system refer only to other signs in it, but discourse “refers to a world that it claims to describe, to express, or to represent.”[9]

Action is analogous to discourse because, to make full sense of any action, one has to recognize that its meaning is distinguishable from its occurrence as a particular spationtemporal event. Nevertheless, every genuine action is meaningful only because it is some specific person's doing at some particular moment.

To clarify the analogy between discourse and action, Ricoeur draws on speech act theory. First, action has the structure of a locutionary act inasmuch as it has a “propositional content” that we can identify and reidentify. For example, we can recognize the activity of putting on clothes or digging in the ground whenever we encounter anyone doing them.

Second, action has “illocutionary” characteristics that closely resemble the speech acts in discourse. Each type of action has constitutive “rules,” rules that make an action a specific type of action. An obvious example of the “illocutionary” character of actions is that of promises. Actions of a certain sort, for example, stepping forward when volunteers are called for, can, in the appropriate context, count as a promise no less than a verbal pledge can.

Though Ricoeur does not explicitly discuss the counterpart in action of the perlocutionary act in discourse, it is easy to infer. Just as we can anticipate how people are likely to react to things that we might say or write, so we can anticipate how they would likely react to what we might do. We know that there some deeds that people are quite likely to put up with and others that they are likely not to do so.

It follows from the analogies between discourse and action that all action is in principle interaction just as all discourse is in principle dialogical. Because of this similarity, action, like discourse, is inherently subject to interpretation. Like discourse, actions are “open worlds” whose meanings are not fully determined by their performers and their immediate audiences. As the study of history shows, there are two main ways that a past action remains open to interpretation. One can reasonably investigate what it meant to those who knew about it when it occurred. And one can also ask how those who came later understood and assessed it.

Furthermore, we interpret the whole of a discourse or text, whether spoken or written, in the light of its several parts and a particular part in the light of the whole. Similarly, we interpret a complex of actions, for example, a war, in the light of the particular actions of its participants and vice versa.

All interpretative activity proceeds by way of a dialectic between guessing and validating. We make a guess about the meaning of a part and check it against the whole and vice versa. Also we guess about the relative importance of the several parts. Throughout the process of guess and validation, there is no definitive outcome. It is always possible reasonably to relate sentences, or actions, to one another in more than one way.

To validate an interpretation is not to verify it empirically. One validates an interpretation by vindicating it against competing interpretations. Thus validation “is an argumentative discipline comparable to the judicial procedures of legal interpretation. It is a logic of uncertainty and qualitative probability.”[10]

Through the conflict of interpretations one can find criteria, such as comprehensiveness, for determining which interpretation is more likely. Sometimes, though, more than one interpretation will satisfy the criteria equally well. But some interpretations have little or no likelihood. Hence:

If it is true that there is always more than one way of construing a text, it is not true that all interpretations are equal…. The text is a limited field of possible constructions. The logic of validation allows us to move between the two limits of dogmatism and skepticism. It is always possible to argue against an interpretation, to confront interpretations, to arbitrate between them and to seek for an agreement, even if this agreement remains beyond our reach.[11]

What holds good for the interpretation of discourse holds good also for the interpretation of action.

Each discourse and action is, of course, an event that occurs at a particular place and time. Accordingly, besides interpreting it, one ought also to seek for a causal explanation of its occurrence. Only an account that provides both a causal explanation and an interpretation of its meaning that enjoys probability does justice to the action or discourse.

Ricoeur finds in his reflections on discourse and action a capital lesson about the world and the persons or selves that inhabit it. Selves as agents are, to be sure, entities in the world. But they are fundamentally different from all other worldly entities.

3.2 Selves as Agents

Ricoeur's conception of the self stands opposed to both the Cartesian and the radical anti-Cartesian conceptions. On the Cartesian conception of the cogito, the ego is supposedly independent of its body and the body's spatiotemporal setting. On the radical anti-Cartesian conception, a self is at bottom nothing other than the product or function of some basically impersonal system. For Ricoeur, the self is essentially embodied. It is, on the one hand, both made possible and constituted by its material and cultural situation. But, on the other hand, it is in principle always capable of initiative, of inaugurating something new.

The kind of identity that the Ricoeurian self has is not like the nonpersonal entities that perdure simply as in some significant sense “selfsame.” Rather, the self's identity is constituted by an inextricable tie between a selfsameness and a selfhood or ipseity. Following a distinction in Latin between idem and ipse, Ricoeur holds that the self's idem-identity is that which gives the self, among other things, its spatio-temporal sameness. Its ipse-identity gives it its unique ability to initiate something new and imputable to himself or herself (OAA, 35). Without both sorts of identity there is no self. Because a self has both an idem-identity and an ipse-identity, it inhabits two irreducible orders of causality, namely the physical and the intentional orders. A comprehensive account of any genuine action must express the way it is related to both of these orders.

The evidence that Ricoeur cites to support the claim that the self inhabits two orders of causality comes not from empirical verification but from attestation. Attestation is the sort of assurance or confidence that each person has of existing in both of these orders of causality. This assurance is a kind of belief or credence rather than a certitude. It is the belief that the self has in its ability to act and to suffer, to do and undergo things that it can impute to itself as its own doings and sufferings (OAA, 21-23). The evidential validity of attestation as distinct from verification is crucial for Ricoeur's entire anthropology. Without it, he would have no basis for insisting, with Kant, that persons are irreducibly different from things.

Ricoeur buttresses his case by analyzing what initiating something involves. The stimulus to initiate is some desire. Desire is not only a force that moves or impels a person. It is also a reason for the initiative in question. It is a reason that makes the initiative intelligible and meaningful. Thus desire shows that the self, as agent, belongs both to the order of nature, in which desire impels, and to the order of culture or meaning, in which initiatives make sense both to the agent and to others as motions aimed at obtaining what it desires.

These two dimensions of desire, however, are not sufficient to account fully for action. Action purportedly makes a change in the world. Accordingly, the crucial questions about action are: “What must be the nature of the world… if human beings are able to introduce changes into it? [And] what must be the nature of action… if it is to be read in terms of change in the world?”[12]

To answer the first of these questions, Ricoeur adopts the analysis of interference that G. H. von Wright gives in his Explanation and Understanding.[13] For Ricoeur, von Wright's analysis shows, first, that for there to be interference, there must be both an ongoing anterior established order or course of things and a human doing that somehow intervenes in and disturbs that order. Second, to make sense of interference, one needs a concept of causation different from Hume's, one that can allow for genuine initiative. And third, interference is always purposeful. Hence an interference is not merely ascribable to an agent. It is also imputable to the agent as the one whose purpose motivates the interference.

The second crucial question about action is “What must be the nature of action… if it is to be read in terms of a change in the world?" Building upon Kant's reflections on the antinomies connected with the thesis of the causality of freedom, Ricoeur argues that every action involves initiative, i.e., “an intervention of the agent of action into the course of the world, an intervention that effectively causes changes in the world” (OAA, 109, translation modified). Initiative requires a bodily agent possessing specific capabilities and vulnerabilities who inhabits some concrete worldly situation. The fundamental human capabilities are those of speaking, acting (doing or making), narrating, and imputing actions to some person or personsas worthwhile or not worthwhile. Each of these capabilities has its corresponding vulnerability. For example, the capability to speak makes one always vulnerable to speaking erroneously, or misleadingly, or inappropriately. Ricoeur's reflections on these four capabilities and other capabilities that they make possible underpin much of his work after 1990. They are crucial to his analyses in MHF and CR. The counterpart to the agent's bodiliness with its capabilities is his or her situation. One's situation is made up of the things, events, and other persons that constitute the context of opportunities for and obstacles to the agent's exercise of his or her power to initiate. Through action a person can not only change his or her material situation but can also establish new lasting relationships with other people. Consider for example adopting a child. The adopter initiates a commitment to a long-term pattern of conduct that will require perseverance to fulfill. Action or initiative, then, is that by which agents address themselves to the persons and things that contextualize them and thereby alter the context and its subsequent course. Hence it is imputable to them as their own performance.[14]

It follows that initiative appears as both disjunctive and conjunctive vis-à-vis the world. Initiative has “a disjunctive stage, at the end of which we recognize the necessarily antagonistic character of the original causality of the agent in relation to the other modes of causality; and a conjunctive stage, at the end of which we recognize the necessity to coordinate in a synergistic way the original causality of the agent with the other forms of causality” (OAA, 102).

In sum, agents in and by their bodiliness both are capable of initiating and sustaining something new in the world and are subject to other causal sequences that bind them to the world. The agent's power to act requires a distinctive causal capacity that is not reducible to other sorts of causality but that can only be manifest as such in conjunction with these other causal processes (OAA, 109-12).

On Ricoeur's analysis, every action is both purposive and related to other actions. It takes place in a context of meaningfulness. That is, it is in some measure a response to past action and it anticipates that there will be future responses to it. Thus action takes place in what Ricoeur calls historical time.

3.3 The Temporality of Action

Ricoeur's conception of historical time unites two more elementary senses of time. There is cosmic time, the time of the world that unfolds as a sequence of uniform, qualitatively undifferentiated moments in which all change occurs. And there is lived time, the time of our lives. In lived time, some moments are more meaningful than others. For example, the moments of my marriage, of the birth of my child, of the death of a loved one, are more important than many other moments. Thus our elementary experiences of time confront us with a paradox. “On a cosmic scale, our life is insignificant, yet this brief period when we appear in the world is the time in which all meaningful questions arise.”[15]

People harmonize these two conceptions of time by establishing devices, e.g., calendars, to measure time. These devices enable us to assign moments of lived time to moments of cosmic time and vice versa. A calendar, for example, “cosmologizes lived time [and] humanizes cosmic time. And it does this by making a noteworthy present coincide with an anonymous instant in the axial moment of the calendar.”[16] The intelligibility of action depends upon the harmonization of these two kinds of time into what can properly be called historical time.

The present moment of historical time in which action takes place stands at the intersection of what Reinhart Koselleck calls the space of experience and the horizon of expectation. The space of experience is made up of past natural or cultural events that a person remembers in the present. It is the past now made present and thus it serves as the point of departure for a new decision or action. The horizon of expectation, on the other hand, is the unfolding of the array of projects that one can now undertake, of paths that one can now begin to explore. It is the future made present. The space of experience and the horizon of expectation mutually condition each other. The space of experience does not precisely determine a person's horizon of expectation. But a person who remembers only a little has a foreshortened horizon. He or she can only want something that is already rather familiar. Nonetheless, in considering a particular project, a person may be prompted to learn about some part of the past previously outside his or her space of experience.

Action, taken in the present, preserves the space of experience in a dialectical tension with the horizon of expectation. Without them, action would be impossible. But neither singly or jointly can they fully determine action. Undoubtedly we are affected both by a past that is not of our own making and by the pictured future that our society presents. Nonetheless, through our initiatives we do make history and affect ourselves in the process of doing so.[17]

These considerations concerning action and the historical time in which it takes place lead Ricoeur to refine his conception of personal identity. He argues that the kind of identity that a person has by virtue of his or her idem- and ipse-identities is a narrative identity.

3.4 Narrativity, Identity and Time

The historical present is the time of actions, the time of the inaugurations of new sequences and arrangements of things. It is also the moment framed by the agent's space of experience and horizon of expectation. To give expression to this complex historical present one must have a kind of discourse that can articulate both strings of actions and events and their human contexts. The kind of discourse to do this is narrative.[18] Historical time becomes human time “to the extent that it is articulated through a narrative mode, and narrative attains its full significance when it becomes a condition of temporal existence.”[19]

As the most faithful articulations of human time, narratives present the moments when agents, who are aware of their power to act, actually do so, and patients, those who are subject to being affected by actions, actually are affected. They also tell of worldly outcomes, intended or otherwise, of these interventions into processes that both antedate them and outlast them. The historical time that narrative presents, i.e., human time, is an interpersonal, public time. It is the time in which one can locate sequences of generations and the traces their lives have left behind. Furthermore, it is the time in which debts to predecessors have been incurred. Indeed, Ricoeur holds that without at least a latent sense of indebtedness to predecessors history would be meaningless.[20]

The constitutive features of a narrative form the basis for Ricoeur to hold that personal identity, itself constituted by an idem-identity and an ipse-identity, is a narrative identity. First, narratives draw together disparate and somehow discordant elements into the concordant unity of a plot that has a temporal span. Second, all the elements that a narrative unites are contingencies. All of them could have been different or even nonexistent. Nonetheless, as emplotted, these elements take on the guise of necessity or at least of likelihood. Taken by itself, an element of a story is of interest only if it is surprising. But when it is integrated into a plot it appears as a quasi-necessity. Third, narratives are made up not only of actions and events but also of characters or personages. Plots relate the mutual development of a story and a character or set of characters. Every character in a story of any complexity both acts and is acted upon. Finally, a narrative's characters only rise to the status of persons—fictional or real—who can initiate action when one evaluates their doings and sufferings and imputes them to the persons as praiseworthy or otherwise. One evaluates how the person responds when confronted by another living being who is in some need that the person can address (OAA, 141-45).[21]

In sum, a narrative about human persons tells of both the connections that unify multiple actions over a span of time performed, in most cases, by a multiplicity of persons and the connections that link multiple viewpoints on and assessments of those actions. “The narrative constructs the identity of the character, what can be called his or her narrative identity, in constructing that of the story told. It is the identity of the story that makes the identity of the character” (OAA, 147-48).[22]

We make sense of our own personal identities in much the same way as we do of the identity of characters in stories. First, in the case of stories, we come to understand the characters by way of the plot that ties together what happens to them, the aims and projects they adopt, and what they actually do. Similarly I make sense of my own identity by telling myself a story about my own life. In neither case is the identity like that of a fixed structure or substance. These identities are mobile. “Narrative identity takes part in the story's movement, in the dialectic between order and disorder.”[23] Until the story is finished, the identity of each character or person remains open to revision.

Second, each personage's individual identity always intersects those of other personages in the narrative. This intersection can give rise to second-order stories, e.g., stories about families, that narrate the intertwining of multiple individual stories. Similarly, the story by which I constitute my own identity shows that my life is always linked to others, not always in the way I would prefer. Hence, other persons are always constituents in my identity and vice versa. Indeed, our individual identities are incorporable into a we-identity, as for example the identity we share as fellow citizens of the United States.

Third, every personage that figures in a story that is not a piece of science fiction does so as a full fledged bodily being, a being of a determinate sex and age as well as the native speaker of a particular language. Each comes from a particular place and is the inheritor of a particular heritage. So it is with us. However cosmopolitan a person may become, he or she has a distinctive heritage that always matters.

Finally, all narratives have ethical dimensions. As narratives that contain promises clearly exemplify, narratives present characters in such a way that evaluations of what they do or suffer are ingredient in the very meaning of these events. But narratives also call for us to evaluate their characters as such. They especially prod us to evaluate their ethical probity by considering their talents and their use of them.

Furthermore, narratives show that from the standpoint of ethics there is a kind of primacy of the other-than-self over the self. Ethically considered, the narrative unity of a life is made up of the moments of its responsiveness or failure to respond to others. The responsive self is primarily concerned not with its own condition but rather with responding faithfully and thoughtfully to others. Thus the responsive self does not aim primarily to preserve a Kantianesque autonomy. It does not shrink from every sort of heteronomy. Rather, it lives in hope that its responsiveness to others can and will bring about a better life for all of them, a life in which they all participate with and for others (OAA, 165-68).

Ricoeur's analysis of personal narrative identity yields four conclusions that are basic to his anthropology. They are:

  1. Because my personal identity is a narrative identity, I can make sense of myself only in and through my involvement with others.
  2. In my dealings with others, I do not simply enact a role or function that has been assigned to me. I can change myself through my own efforts and can reasonably encourage others to change as well.
  3. Nonetheless, because I am bodily and hence have inherited both biological and psychological constraints, I cannot change everything about myself. And because others are similarly constrained, I cannot sensibly call for comprehensive changes in them.
  4. Though I can be evaluated in a number of ways, e.g., physical dexterity, verbal fluency, technical skill, the ethical evaluation in the light of my responsiveness to others is, on the whole, the most important evaluation.

In The Course of Recognition, his last book, Ricoeur returns to the topic of personal identity. Here again he develops his position through an analysis of the fundamental capabilities and vulnerabilities that are constitutive of human existence. But here his focus is on these capabilities in their exercise and not simply in their potentiality. In their exercise these capabilities always more or less explicitly implicate at least one other person. I speak to someone. I affect someone by the doings and makings I either perform or leave undone. Every narrative I construct always involves the intersection of at least two human lives. And every imputation that I make implies at least two persons, one of whom bears some responsibility for someone else's well being.

When one focuses on the exercise of these capabilities their vulnerabilities appear more strikingly. Even though whenever I exercise one of my basic capabilities I necessarily make some reference to another person, I need not, and all too often do not, recognize him or her as someone fundmentally like me. I may regard this other person in a multiplicity of ways other than that which makes possible the mutual recognition of the humanity we share.

Properly to understand myself in and through the capabilities and vulnerabilities that constitute me I must unmask the many temptations I have to deny our mutuality. I must learn that even though you and I are irreducibly different from each other, as human beings we both have the same basic constitution. Our common constitution demands mutual recognition. Nonetheless, because our vulnerabilities are never eliminated, we must constantly struggle to achieve it. This is "a struggle against the misrecognition of others at the same time that it is a struggle for recognition of oneself by others" (CR, 258).

The analyses of personal identity , especially in OAA, and of mutual recognition, in CR, supply essential parts of the groundwork for Ricoeur's reflections on history, both as made and as studied. They also undergird his contributions to the study of both ethics and politics.

3.5 Memory and History

Throughout his career Ricoeur has worked to make sense of the past and our ongoing involvement with it. Something about the past is undoubtedly no longer accessible to us. Nonetheless, traces of the past remain. Through them we try to represent the past in the present. We do so through memory and through the writing and reading of history. But memory is notoriously fallible and historical accounts, since they cannot represent the past just as it was, are at best only partial and are therefore subject to the charge that they misrepresent, rather than represent, the past.

Ricoeur has consistently opposed any claim that historical knowledge can be or even rightly aspire to be definitive or absolute knowledge. He rejects, on the one hand, claims such as Hegel's or Marx's that there is one universal history in which all local histories are incorporated and made fully intelligible. On the other hand, he has also resisted the positivistic notion that there are bare, unchallengeable and uninterpreted facts that are accessible either to memory or to the historian. Nonetheless, he holds that there can be objective historical knowledge that deserves to be called true.

His Memory, History, Forgetting gives his fullest argument for this lifelong conviction. Ricoeur's argument begins with an account of things purportedly remembered, for without memories there could be no history involving people. There is the individual's memory of what he or she has encountered or done or suffered. And analogously, there is a set of memories that individuals share with other members of their group. Through this “collective memory,” a group of people has access to past events and deeds that have been reconstructed and recounted to them. Indeed, from one perspective, this collective memory antedates individual memories. We are born into a “familial” discourse replete with accounts of our group's (family, locale, nation, etc.) past. Our individual memories take shape against the backdrop of this collective memory.

Nevertheless, collective memory presupposes someone's report that he or she has witnessed something and recalled it accurately. This person in effect testifies: “I witnessed x occurring. If you don't believe me, ask someone else who was there.” Testimony of this sort, given and received, underpins a group's collective memory, its “common knowledge.” It also shows that there is a social bond among the group's members that undergirds their trust in one another's words.

The task of writing history, of what Ricoeur calls the historiographical operation, is to support, correct, or refute collective memory. This operation does not deal directly with individual memory except as reported to and believed by others. It has three distinct but inseparable constituents, all of which are interpretative activities.

The first constituent is the building up and use of archives that contain, in some form, (e.g., documents, artifacts), traces of the past. The main traces are documents that record testimonies and reports about their contexts. Archival work is itself an interpretative activity. Guided by their interests, historians, librarians, etc. determine which traces to preserve. And questions or hypotheses framed by historians, without which archives would remain mute, lead them to detect "facts, capable of being asserted in singular, discrete propositions, most often having to do with the mentioning of dates, places, proper names, verbs that name an action or state" (MHF, 178). These are not positivistic facts. They do not correspond directly either to what actually occurred or to the living memory that an eye-witness might have had of them. Facts are established only through the historian's questions and thus are themselves interpretations of the archives.

The second constituent of the historiographical operation is that of explanation/comprehension, the activity by which historians relate facts to one another. Ricoeur rejects the longstanding supposed dichotomy between explanation of facts in terms of “external” causes and their comprehension through reasons or intentions. Because action is always interaction and therefore a mixture of doing and undergoing, there is no uniquely privileged model for historical accounts. The historian must be attentive to the multiple meanings of “why” that are relevant to making action intelligible.

The third constituent of the historiographical operation is the activity of producing a verbal representation of some part of the past in a text. This inscription is always rhetorical and therefore interpretative. Indeed, the historiographical operation as a whole forms a kind of “circle of interpretation,” for the historian's writings themselves are candidates for archivation, material for subsequent explanation/comprehension, and subject to re-writing.

Given the interpretative nature of the entire historiographical operation, historical knowledge, like medical diagnosis and prognosis, always has the character of likelihood or credibility rather than certainty. Furthermore, the historiographical operation, like memory, is always bound up with the forgotten. There is always something pertinent to a historical topic that is left aside, unnoticed, or vanished. Something of the past is always irretrievably gone and no actual remembering encompasses everything available for recall. Ultimately, “"we have nothing better than testimony and the critique of testimony to give credibility to the historian's representation of the past" (MHF, 278, translation modified).[24]

Even though the historiographical operation is thoroughly interpretative, it is still possible to speak of the objectivity and truthfulness of the historian's account. This operation has its point of departure in testimony. Even false testimony refers to a world in which something actually occurred, something objective. Furthermore, all testimony refers, at least implicitly, to some specific group and the social bond that supports the activity of giving and receiving testimony among its members. To the extent that historians perform the historiographical operation well they give a substitute representation of the past . A well made substitute is faithful to the available evidence and so deserves to be called true even though it is always amendable or reformable.

3.6 Ethics

Though the terms ‘ethics’ and ‘morality’ are often used interchangeably, Ricoeur stipulates a distinction between them. In his usage, ethics deals with the domain of that which is taken to belong to a good human life. It is concerned with the overall aim of a life of action. Morality refers to the expression of this aim in terms of norms that are regarded as somehow obligatory. Moral norms are taken to be universal and to exercise some constraint on conduct. In standard terminology, ethics is teleologically and morality is deontologically oriented. For Ricoeur, these orientations are complementary, not incompatible.

At the base of both ethical and moral reflection are two fundamental capabilities described in Ricoeur's anthropology, namely action and imputation. Persons are capable of initiating some new action and what they do is imputable to them as their own freely chosen deed. An event is not an action unless it is imputable to an agent who has a durable identity. Recognition of the imputability of action opens the way for consideration of the ethical and moral determinations of action.

Ricoeur's reflections on these matters find expression in his Oneself as Another as well as in a host of essays he has published during the past twenty-five years.[25] They are informed by and use resources drawn from the works of Aristotle, Kant, and Hegel as well as a number of his contemporaries, most notably Rawls.[26]

In brief, the position that Ricoeur develops in Oneself as Another has its point of departure in the Aristotelian view that action always aims at some good. More specifically, its ultimate aim is to be a constituent in a “‘good life’ with and for others in just institutions” (OAA, 262). For a good life, one must have associates with and for whom one acts. Furthermore, societal institutions, particularly political institutions, set the context for action and significantly affect its efficacy. For a good life, we aim to have institutions that meet our sense of justice in the obligations they impose and the privileges and opportunities they grant (OAA, 180).[27] Thus, in terms close to those of Hannah Arendt, “it is in the interesse that the wish for a good life finds its fulfillment. It is as citizens that we become human. The wish to live within just institutions signifies nothing else.”[28]

The ethical aim, however, is insufficient to guide one to proper conduct. The threat of violence is ineliminable from action because to act is always to impinge upon another. An action does not necessarily inflict violence. But because it always affects another's capacity to act, any action may do so. Hence the actual implementation of any specific ethical aim could turn out to be violent. This danger calls into question the adequacy of both our aims and the practices, values, and institutions that our society supports. Therefore, “by reason of the fact of violence, morality must not be ignored. One must pass on to the imperative, to duty, to interdiction.”[29] Every actual aim must be submitted to the “sieve of the norm” (OAA, 170).

Two important versions of this sieve are Kant's principle of the universalizability of any genuine moral norm and Rawls's two principles that any just allocation of goods must satisfy. By using some verson of this kind of sieve, we move to a second stage of ethical reflection, namely the stage of morality. At this stage the sense of justice operative in the first stage is transformed into the rule of justice. But neither of these versions of the sieve, nor any other proposed version, turns out to be sufficient to guide concrete conduct. All proposed versions are abstract and ahistorical. Each in its own fashion would always require one to give priority to some universal norm or law over concern for how a strict adherence to that norm would affect the particular persons the deed would impinge upon. For Ricoeur, it is simply ingredient in what he calls the tragedy of action that at times one can harm another precisely by observing some universal norm.

In those cases in which respect for another person and respect for a universal law conflict, as cases of promises that would harm the promisee if kept illustrate, one needs to resort to a practical wisdom to determine what genuine solicitude for the other person would require. This practical wisdom is akin to Aristotelian phronesis. Ricoeurian “practical wisdom consists in inventing conduct that will best satisfy the exception that solicitude requires by breaking the rule to the smallest extent possible” (OAA, 269, translation modified). It has three distinctive features for dealing with the exigencies of particular cases, especially serious and difficult ones.[30] First, practical wisdom never denies the principle of respect for persons. It considers how to express this respect in the case at hand. Second, practical reason always searches for an Aristotelianesque “just mean.” It looks for a way to reconcile opposed claims that is, unlike a simple compromise, more fitting than either of them. Third, practical wisdom avoids arbitrariness. A person exercises practical wisdom by engaging in discussion with other qualified persons and by consulting the most competent advisors available.[31] In other terms, practical wisdom's guiding light is the solicitude we ought to have for each person in his or her uniqueness. This solicitude is a “‘critical’ solicitude that has passed through the double test of the moral conditions of respect and the conflicts arising therefrom. This critical solicitude is the form that practical wisdom takes in the region of interpersonal relations" (OAA, 273, translation modified). Ultimately, critical solicitude rests on mutual recognition of one another as capable, vulnerable selves.

3.7 Politics

For Ricoeur, as for Aristotle, the political institution is the most comprehensive of social institutions. It provides the social space for other institutions, e.g., religious institutions, economic institutions, and protects each of them from being encroached upon by any of the others. Thus the political institution, especially if it unites people as fellow citizens in a state, embodies the power that makes possible the full expression of all basic human capabilities. Furthermore, it gives stability and durability to what its people achieve.

But political power is inherently ambivalent or paradoxical. On the one hand, this power is power-in-common, a power that springs directly from the capacity people have to join with one another in common action. Together they can do things that none could do alone (OAA, 194-95).[32] Hence there is truth in Eric Weil's definition of the state as “the organization of a historical community; organized into a state, the community is capable of making decisions.”[33]

On the other hand, all politics about which we know anything involves a distinction between the ruler and the ruled. The ruler has domination over and can compel obedience from the ruled. Hence there is truth in Max Weber's view that political power always threatens violence. Paradoxically, then, “[n]o historical community can exist without a power that surpasses the play of individual interests, without a State. But on the other hand, power can only appear as a force that does violence, as a constraint that limits interests, limits even the vocation of individuals. The State… is a force of unconditional constraint. It is legitimate violence in history.”[34]

The defining task for any defensible politics is to learn what justice calls for and to establish and protect the institutions that make justice effective. This is tantamount to saying that the ultimate objective of all defensible political practice is to make power-in-common prevail as far as possible over domination. But because dominations is never wholly eliminable, defensible politics is inherently fragile.

Among the most important reasons for the fragility of politics is that the kind of discourse proper to political life is rhetoric, specifically what Aristotle calls deliberative or political rhetoric.[35] Rhetoric is distinct from both rational demonstration with its fully warranted conclusions and the sheer sophistry of clever talk designed to extort agreement from people by the use of threats or false promises.

Political action is primarily oriented to the future. But one cannot have certitude about the future, only an opinion. Rhetoric is the kind of discourse appropriate for stating and discussing opinions. As a consequence, the results of political deliberations are never beyond reasonable contestation. No proposed constitution, law, or political undertaking can be definitively justified. Therein lies the fragility of politics.

People can become frustrated with the inability of political discourse to achieve certitude. This tempts them to embrace some doctrine or method that claims to yield incontrovertible conclusions rather than merely likely ones. For example, some people are tempted to adopt a utopian program that claims to lead to an achievable ideal society. Others are tempted by an ideology that claims to prescribe the true path that a political society ought to travel. And still others are tempted to embrace a method or procedure, e.g., cost benefit analysis or rational choice theory that purports to yield results that are immune to reasonable challenge. Finally, there are those who are tempted to opt out of political discourse on the grounds that its results are too meager to be worthwhile.[36]

Those who succumb to any of these temptations at least implicitly call for the exclusion of some people from the discourse that determines political action. Those who opt out exclude themselves. Those who give in to any of the other temptations mentioned above would exclude those who do not share their approach. The ineliminable possibility- and historically, the likelihood- of such exclusions makes politics fragile. Every exclusion gives the included some domination over the excluded. Since the objective of responsible politics is to have power-in-common prevail as far as possible over domination, exclusions are always to be minimized. Or, more positively, the opinions of as many people as possible ought to be represented in political discourse, for doing so best promotes power-in-common.

Political responsibility is born of the fragility of politics. The basic responsibility of citizens is twofold. On the one hand, they ought to recognize that the political domain is relatively autonomous vis-à-vis other domains. It has its own proper objective and norms. Accordingly, citizens ought to resist efforts to subject political action to norms belonging to other domains, such as economics, or technology, or religion. On the other hand, citizens ought to work to have political institutions and practices promote as widespread political participation as is feasible.

For Ricoeur, this two-fold responsibility has both a domestic and an international dimension. History shows that domestic exclusions can come from any number of sources, e.g., poverty, racial or religious prejudice, etc. Citizens ought to oppose all such exclusions. Indeed, they ought to support the rehabilitation even of those who have excluded themselves by committing crimes.[37]

Many political problems today, e.g., how to deal with environmental degradation, the proliferation of terrible weaponry, epidemics, cannot be successfully dealt with by any particular state alone. Only international cooperation can succeed. Historically, any number of factors, e.g., language, religion, race, military conquest, have been obstacles to cooperation of this sort. It is incumbent on citizens to do what they can to encourage their societies to remove or at least weaken these obstacles. To do so one need not promote any form of world government. Rather, citizens ought both to work through the institutions of civil society to pardon other people and states for the harms they have caused and to support treaties and pacts that all affected states can reasonably be urged to commit themselves to.[38]

In short, responsible citizens always look for ways to increase the number of people, both domestically and internationally, whose relevant opinions can be taken seriously in political deliberations. There is no set of rules that can rightly specify just how citizens ought to discharge this responsibility. As in personal ethics, they have to draw on a practical wisdom. Doing so is the only way to work for power-in-common to prevail over domination and to protect genuine politics from the threats to which it is always subject.[39]


Books by Ricoeur

Selected Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

action | Aristotle | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | identity | Kant, Immanuel | memory | Rawls, John | Sartre, Jean-Paul | time