Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Tue Mar 11, 2003; substantive revision Mon May 10, 2004

‘Memory’ is a label for a diverse set of cognitive capacities by which humans and perhaps other animals retain information and reconstruct past experiences, usually for present purposes. Our particular abilities to conjure up long-gone episodes of our lives are both familiar and puzzling. We remember experiences and events which are not happening now, so memory seems to differ from perception. We remember events which really happened, so memory is unlike pure imagination. Memory seems to be a source of knowledge, or perhaps just is retained knowledge. Remembering is often suffused with emotion. It is an essential part of much reasoning. It is connected in obscure ways with dreaming. Some memories are shaped by language, others by imagery. Much of our moral life depends on the peculiar ways in which we are embedded in time. Memory goes wrong in mundane and minor, or in dramatic and disastrous ways.

Although an understanding of memory is likely to be important in making sense of the continuity of the self, of the relation between mind and body, and of our experience of time, it has been curiously neglected by many philosophers. This entry's primary focus is on that part of contemporary philosophical discussion of memory which is continuous with the development of theories in the natural, cognitive, and social sciences, in which many investigations and debates about memory have philosophical presuppositions and implications. A related entry addresses epistemological issues about memory.

1. The Concept of Memory

At the end of an intricate discussion of remembering in chapter 9 of The Analysis of Mind, Bertrand Russell laments that "this analysis of memory is probably extremely faulty, but I do not know how to improve it" (1921, p. 187). In similar vein, one of Hume's editors complains that "the unsatisfactory nature of Hume's account of memory is noticed by nearly all his commentators. It is a fault however which he shares with nearly all other philosophers" (Macnabb 1962, p. 360). Why is memory so hard to understand?

The answer, in part, is that the term labels a great variety of phenomena. I remember the date of Descartes' death; I remember playing in the snow as a child; I remember the taste and the pleasure of this morning's coffee; I remember how to play chess and how to drive a car; I remember to feed the cat every night. "If I say, rightly, ‘I remember it’, the most different things can happen, and even merely this: that I say it" (Wittgenstein 1974, paragraph 131). Some philosophers take this heterogeneity as reason to be wary of any attempt to explain memory (Malcolm 1977, Deutscher 1989). But subtleties of subjective memory experience need not be neglected or obliterated by careful theorizing: an explanatory framework which omitted or precluded the phenomenological and interpersonal diversity of memory would fail on its own terms.

This point is worth reiterating. In a letter to Mersenne, Descartes asks why "what makes one man want to dance may make another want to cry": it may be, he suggests, that the second man has "never heard a galliard without some affliction befalling him", so that he cries "because it evokes ideas in [his] memory" (18 March 1630, in Descartes 1991, p. 20; see Sutton 1998, pp. 74-81). But this explanation on its own does not distinguish between two possibilities about the second man's memory. He may simply find himself tearful, the music making him sad because of its previous coupling with affliction in his experience, although he remains unaware of this association. Alternatively, he may be well aware of the specific and tragic past occasions on which he has heard the galliard, perhaps being able to give detailed affective, temporal, and contextual information about those past experiences, and perhaps even to use this knowledge to work through the revived emotions.

Philosophers have tended to focus on the latter kind of case, sometimes denying that the merely implicit learned association in the former case is a genuine form of memory at all. But scientific psychology is not, either in principle or in practice, restricted to the study of implicit learning and the varieties of conditioning. Indeed, the study of our rich capacities to monitor and recollect the sources, in our personal histories, of particular information in memory is at the heart of much current empirical and theoretical work (Johnson, Hashtroudi, and Lindsay 1993; Mitchell and Johnson 2000).

C.B. Martin and Max Deutscher concluded an influential analysis of memory by stressing "the complex and partly theoretical nature of our commonplace notion of remembering" (1966, p.196). Ordinary usage hides a battery of different but related concepts of memory, which are now investigated by philosophers and psychologists alike, marrying attention to conceptual distinctions and subjective experience to functional and empirical concerns about the nature and the basis of memory processes and systems.

1.1 The Varieties of Remembering

A rough consensus has emerged among philosophers and psychologists around one promising unified terminology for the kinds of long-term memory. Bergson (1908/1991) and Russell (1921) distinguished ‘recollective memory’ from ‘habit memory’, while Broad (1925) and Furlong (1948) further distinguished recollective memory from ‘propositional memory’. This classification (see also Ayer 1956, D. Locke 1971) is (roughly) consonant with more recent psychological terminology, used here for convenience in exposition. While precise definitions of these terms are controversial, general characterisations can be given.

Philosophers' ‘habit memory’ is psychologists' ‘procedural memory’, a label for embodied skills such as typing, playing golf, using a knife and fork, dancing, or solving jigsaw puzzles. We naturally refer to procedural memories with the grammatical construction ‘remembering how’.

‘Propositional memory’ is ‘semantic memory’ or memory for facts, the vast network of conceptual information underlying our general knowledge of the world: this is naturally expressed as ‘remembering that’, for example, that Descartes died in Sweden.

‘Recollective memory’ is ‘episodic memory’, also sometimes called ‘personal memory’ or ‘direct memory’ by philosophers: this is memory for experienced events and episodes, such as a conversation this morning or the death of a friend eight years ago. Episodic memories are naturally expressed with a direct object: I remember our argument about Descartes yesterday, and I remember my emotions and my bodily sensations as we talked. Such personal memories can be generic or specific, and they can be memories of more or less extended temporal periods.

Both semantic and episodic memories, whether linguistically expressed or not, usually aim at truth, and are together sometimes called ‘declarative memory’, in contrast to nondeclarative forms of memory, which don't seem to represent the world or the past in the same sense. The declarative vs nondeclarative contrast is sometimes lined up with a more controversial distinction between ‘explicit’ and ‘implicit’ memory: explicit memories, roughly, can be accessed verbally or otherwise by the subject, whereas implicit memory is memory without awareness. But the category of implicit memory includes a range of heterogeneous phenomena, and it may be better to see ‘implicit memory’ as a label for a set of memory tasks rather than a distinct variety or system of memory (Willingham and Preus 1995).

We sometimes use ‘remember’ in its declarative senses as a ‘success-word’, so that ‘false memories’ are not ‘memories’ at all. However, classification of the many varieties of false ‘memory’ is also an intriguing philosophical task (Hacking 1995; Hamilton 1999); and the attempt to understand and explain any features, both phenomenological and causal, which veridical remembering and (some cases of) imagining, confabulating, and misremembering might have in common is a legitimate part of the overall interdisciplinary enquiry into memory. The very idea of truth in memory, and the attendant possibility of error, implies that we are naturally realists about the past: but this fact about us doesn't dictate answers to questions about just how, or how often, we do remember the past truly.

Much 20th-century philosophical discussion of memory addressed its status as a source of knowledge, either in the context of general sceptical concerns about knowledge of the past, or in investigating criteria for the reliability of particular memory beliefs (Owens 1999; and see the entry on memory: epistemological problems). But philosophers also have a special concern with the nature of human personal memory for episodes and experiences in the autobiographical past.

1.2 Episodic Memory and Autobiographical Memory

John Locke took memory to be a power of the mind "to revive Perceptions, which it has once had, with this additional perception annexed to them, that it has had them before" (1690/1975, p. 150; see also Owens 1996). The psychologist William Brewer defines recollective episodic memory in similar terms, as a ‘reliving’ of the individual's phenomenal experience from a specific moment in their past, accompanied by a belief that the remembered episode was personally experienced by the individual in their past (1996, pp. 60-61). Significant psychological complexity is required, on such views, for genuine episodic remembering.

When I remember an episode of my personal history, I come into contact with events and experiences which are no longer present, and my conception of my own life involves narratives in which such experiences are interrelated. We find it easy to engage in the peculiar sort of ‘mental time travel’ involved in such autobiographical memory, although we're often aware of significant limits to its reliability. We are oriented to events as having occurred at particular past times (Tulving 1983, 1993, 1999; Campbell 1994, 1997; Suddendorf and Corballis 1997). This capacity is so sophisticated that it has been seen as unique to humans, with the lives of apes (for example) being in contrast "lived entirely in the present" (Donald 1991, p. 149; see McCormack 2001 for review and discussion on episodic memory in animals).

Not all autobiographical memories, in the broadest sense, are episodic: I can non-experientally remember facts about my own life (such as the date and place of my birth). But the converse question, whether all episodic memories are autobiographical, remains open. For Christoph Hoerl, episodic memories "are necessarily memories of particular events or situations, namely of episodes in the subject's autobiography" (1999, p. 235). But some developmental psychologists want to leave open the possibility that genuine episodic memories may be distinct from full-blown autobiographical memories. Melissa Welch-Ross, for example, argues that "before the autobiographical memory system develops, prelinguistic infants and young children possess long-term, episodic memory" (1995, p. 339). One issue here is whether it's useful to define autobiographical memories as those which are unusually significant (Nelson 1993). But more important in deciding if episodic memory predates full-blown autobiographical memory is the question whether the remembered episodes which come to be shaped into narratives, either by being organized around a self-schema (Howe and Courage 1997; Howe 2000), or by joint reminiscing between parents and children (Nelson and Fivush 2000), are already oriented to particular past experiences in the requisite way.

Because autobiographical memory thus connects my present self with my own particular past actions and experiences, it has naturally played a role in philosophical theories about the continuity of the self. The suitability of a ‘memory criterion’ for deciding questions of the persistence of personal identity over time has been much debated since John Locke's discussions of memory-swapping and amnesia (see the entry on personal identity). Those philosophers of personal identity who are uneasy with relying on unstable intuitions in science-fictional thought experiments instead examine case studies of fugues, amnesias, and dissociation (Wilkes 1988; Sacks 1985, chapters 2, 12, 15; and compare the remarkable case studies in Campbell and Conway 1995), or cognitive-psychological theories of autobiographical memory (Schechtman 1994).

Marya Schechtman, for example, argues that autobiographical memory does not, and need not, provide simple connections between discrete past and present moments of consciousness, as suggested by some ‘psychological continuity’ theories of personal identity. Rather, it is by summarizing, constructing, interpreting, and condensing life experiences, often smoothing over the boundaries between different moments in our lives, that autobiographical memory produces any coherent narrative sense of a personal past (compare Glover 1988, chapter 14; Engel 1999, chapter 4). Neither total nor precise recall is required, on this view, for the persistence of self: rather, what matters is the rich web of causal connections and dependencies between past experiences and present psychological states. The implications for the personal identity debate of this common-sense notion of causal connectedness between past and present experiences are still unclear (compare Slors 2001). But it is of central importance for further elucidation of our concept of personal memory.

1.3 Memory and Causal Connectedness

For me to have a personal episodic memory, my present act of remembering must be causally connected in an appropriate way to the past experience being recollected. Even if it happens to be true that, as a child of four, I got lost in a shopping mall, we would deny that I personally remember the experience if I had completely forgotten it, and have only later been told about it by my parents, or had such a possibility suggested to me by a therapist or an experimental psychologist. Genuine episodic memories, then, causally depend in certain ways on the particular remembered experiences (Martin and Deutscher 1966; Shoemaker 1970; Perner 2000).

Martin and Deutscher (1966), developing a causal theory of memory, argued that the past experience itself must have been causally operative in producing (intervening) states which are in turn causally operative in producing the present recollective experience. While some degree of prompting may be necessary to trigger my present recollection (Deutscher 1989), this recollection of a past experience must also causally derive from internal states of mine which themselves causally derive from that experience. What's surprising about this analysis is that it suggests that built in to common sense concepts of memory is a reliance on the existence of some kind of ‘memory trace’ as a continuous bridge across the temporal gap, causally connecting past and present.

If we had no grasp of these kinds of causal connection in memory, it is arguable that our autobiographical narratives would not get off the ground. We are often aware, of course, of the selective and gappy nature of these narratives: but our ability sometimes to identify such gaps and errors in memory, some philosophers have argued, itself presupposes a conception of the causal connectedness of the self. John Campbell (1997), for example, posits tight conceptual connections between autobiographical memory, a grasp of time as linear, and a strong conception of the spatio-temporal continuity of the self. Children need to grasp that both world and self have a history for genuine autobiographical remembering to emerge. This suggests that a temporal asymmetry is built in to autobiographical memory, in that (again) we are inevitably realists about the past, conceiving of past events as being all, in principle, integratable on a single temporal sequence. Various principles of plot construction thus ground our ordinary memory practices: we assume, for example, that the remembered I has traced "a continuous spatio-temporal route through all the narratives of memory, a route continuous with the present and future location of the remembering subject" (Campbell 1997, p. 110).

In autobiographical memory, we thus assign causal significance to specific events, so that our temporal orientation is by particular times rather than simply by rhythms or phases. Because we can grasp the temporal relations between different cycles or phases, we have a conception of the connectedness of time which gives us the concept of the past (Campbell 1994, chapter 2). For Christoph Hoerl (1999, pp. 240-7), this feature of our concept of time grounds our awareness of the singularity of events and especially of actions. We are thus "sensitive to the irrevocability of certain acts", so that we, unlike other animals and (perhaps) some severely amnesic patients, incorporate a sense of the uniqueness and potential significance of particular choices and actions into our plans and our conceptions of how to live.

Evaluation of this analysis of memory and time requires attention to comparative ethology and cognitive anthropology as well as the clinical neuropsychology of amnesia. The psychological status of the putative principles of plot construction in memory needs clarification, and the sophistication of this cluster of allegedly interconnected features of self-conscious thinking divides us more thoroughly from other animals than will be acceptable to some philosophers. But this example suggests that the immediate future of the cognitive philosophy of memory will be bewilderingly and excitingly interdisciplinary (see also section 3.2 below).

On any view which accepts that requirements of causal connectedness are built in to our concept of memory, remembering is a core instance of the general, flexible human capacity to think about events and experiences which are not present, so that mental life isn't entirely determined by the current environment and the immediate needs of the organism. Since we are often able to remember without having any such traces in our current external environment (such as photographs or words written in a diary), many philosophers and scientists have postulated memory traces or representations in the individual mind or brain.

2. Memory and Representation

Although it takes many significantly different forms, the idea that a ‘trace’ acquired in past experience somehow ‘represents’ that experience, or carries information about it, is at the heart of ‘representative’ or ‘indirect’ realism in the philosophy of memory. This has been the dominant view of memory in modern philosophy of mind, and it is assumed in much work on memory in cognitive science. Research programmes for representative realism thus seek to clarify the nature of representations in memory, and the various processes in which they are involved. Before examining views on these topics, we need to look at criticisms of the entire representative realist framework. Some of the recent work in the cognitive sciences of memory described in section 3 below is intended to respond to and incorporate the more powerful of these criticisms within revised forms of representative realism.

2.1 Representative Realism and Direct Realism

In contrast to the representative realist, direct realists and others hostile to the memory trace claim that in the act of remembering I am in direct contact with past events. Memory is "an immediate knowledge of something past" (Reid 1785/ 1849, p. 357), or "the mind's awareness of past things themselves" (Laird 1920, p. 56).

It is helpful to distinguish two ways of setting up the dispute between direct and representative realists. The central question is whether our access to the past is mediated by representations which exist in the present. But first we examine the separate issue of whether we are aware of representations.

Are we aware of memory representations?

Some critics of representations have complained that, in memory, there is no direct awareness of a trace or idea from which, in a two-step process, the subject then indirectly infers the past event or experience. In making this point, they are attacking specific versions of representative realism. Some representative realists (especially before the 1960s) took representations to be immaterial or ontologically ambiguous mental items which are first scanned and then interpreted by a non-physical soul. This form of representative realism makes our awareness of the past indirect in an obvious sense, and critics were right to see it as a form of dualism (Woozley 1949; Gibson 1979, p. 223).

But if traces are taken to be physical items, within a broadly naturalistic ontology, it is clear that they are not immediate objects of experience which a subject then consciously puts to use. The ‘inference’ involved in remembering is unconscious, so representationists are not relying on incorrigible present awareness of a private inner object from which the past is somehow read off. Memory may involve representations of the past, most modern representationists argue, without involving awareness of those representations themselves.

Are there memory representations?

It might then seem that ‘direct awareness’ of the past is in fact compatible with the involvement of representations in memory. If that is so, there is no genuine conflict between direct and representative realism: we can be directly aware of the past just by virtue of a trace in the present. A memory trace could then mediate between past and present without rendering our access to the past problematically indirect. Indeed, the contrast between ‘direct’ and ‘indirect’ access to the past may seem to lose its grip if representations are not thought of as objects of immediate awareness (compare Schwartz 1996 on perception).

But the availability of this conciliatory position has rarely dissolved the debate about memory representations. In fact many critics of memory traces argue that representative realism is fundamentally flawed even if it does not posit awareness of representations themselves. The objections to representations evaluated below do not depend on the ‘two-step’ interpretation of representative realism: these criticisms are meant to strike at the heart of any theory which relies on representations in memory.

The debate has been pursued primarily in epistemological contexts, in which arguments from the more extensive parallel debate about perception play an important role (Shoemaker 1967; Dancy 1985, chapter 12; Audi 1998, chapter 2; and see the entries on the epistemological problems of memory and on the epistemological problems of perception). But it is also vital in the philosophy of mind and cognitive science, where philosophers of various persuasions have attacked "those ‘traces’ that still plague psychology" (Grene 1985, p. 43).

Since memory traces, impressions, or images have figured in theories of memory from Aristotle, through Descartes and theorists of the association of ideas, into the 21st century, it may seem that little progress has been made. The concept of some static, permanent, distinct storage form that experiences leave in the organism seems to link old and modern models. For some, this erodes confidence in contemporary science: David Krell, noting "the staying-power of the ancient model for memory", hopes to expose "the failure of neurophysiological research to render plausible accounts of long-term memory" (1990, p. 5, p. xi). There is continuity too in metaphors for the spatial organization of memory as containing rooms, palaces, or purses, as a bottle or a dictionary, as tape recorder or junk box (Roediger 1980, p. 233). Critics also point out that external technologies for recording information or for keeping items safe, from wax tablets and aviaries through the camera obscura and the photograph to digital computers and holograms, seem to be wheeled in almost arbitrarily in the search for a model of internal processes (Draaisma 2000).

But there are stronger and weaker versions of representative realism, versions which make quite different assumptions about the nature of the memory trace. The most extreme ‘localist’ account takes memory to be a place in which independent traces or ‘atomic’ items are laid down separately by every experience (or perhaps every part of every experience), and stored at a separate location, until called out again in the reproduction of that experience. A clear historical statement of this localist version of trace theory is that of the 17th-century English natural philosopher Robert Hooke, who took memory ideas in the brain "to be material and bulky, that is, to be certain Bodies of determinate Bigness": for Hooke, memory was a "Repository of Ideas" in which separate items were laid down on the "coils" or "spirals" of the brain, for later extraction by an executive mechanism. Hooke's model was localist in the sense that all ideas in memory are "in themselves distinct; and therefore that not two of them can be in the same space, but that they are actually different and separate one from another" (Hooke 1682/ 1705, p. 142; Sutton 1998, pp. 137-8).

This localist view of memory representations suggests that the memory system, which has no intrinsic dynamics of its own, is separate from other cognitive systems. Storage is distinct from processing, and an executive mechanism must search for and extract information in memory before it can be used. Some models of human memory developed in classical Artificial Intelligence research employ local representations of this sort, relying on an analogy with the random-access storage systems of digital computers. The passivity and independence of such memory representations is one reason such models have trouble dealing with the ways we can sometimes automatically update relevant background knowledge without explicit search (see Copeland 1993, chapters 4-5).

But local representations are not the only option available for understanding how a ‘trace’ might represent past experience. There are also quite different weaker or ‘distributed’ models of memory traces (section 3.3 below) which should not be collapsed into this localist view. Nevertheless, anti-representationists have often assumed that their criticisms apply indiscriminately to any version of representative realism about memory.

2.2 Objections to Representations

In a taxonomy and evaluation of criticisms of memory representations and traces, this section synthesizes the polemics of theorists who hold quite different positive views about memory. The answers sketched here to some of these criticisms obviously leave open a number of issues. In particular, the issue of how the content of memory representations is determined is barely mentioned: and the question of how memory traces could provide the right causal connections between past and present if they are not static and permanent inner items is postponed to section 3. Again, the key question here is whether memory does involve representation of the past.

One initial objection mischaracterizes its target. Some critics complain that trace theorists see an episode of remembering as entirely determined by the nature of the stored item. But, they note, many factors other than internal brain states affect remembering. As Wittgenstein notes, "whatever the event does leave behind, it isn't the memory" (1980, paragraph 220). Trace theorists, however, can accept this point: "the engram (the stored fragments of an episode) and the memory … are not the same thing" (Schacter 1996, p. 70). Traces (whatever they may be) are "merely potential contributors to recollection", providing one kind of continuity between experience and remembering; so traces are invoked merely as one relevant causal/ explanatory factor. In fact, psychologists' attention is increasingly focussed on the context of recall: research on what Endel Tulving calls "synergistic ecphory" (1983, pp. 12-14), for example, addresses the conspiratorial interaction of the present cue and circumstances with the trace (Schacter 1982, pp. 181-9; 1996, pp. 56-71). Developmental psychologist Susan Engel argues that often "one creates the memory at the moment one needs it, rather than merely pulling out an intact item, image, or story" (1999, p. 6). So there is no inevitable reduction of the multicausal nature of remembering to a single inner cause (see further sections 3.4 and 3.5 below).

The role of empirical evidence

Could memory traces be discovered? Wittgenstein sought to undermine our confidence in the empirical nature of representationism, asking of ordinary cases of memory "Why must a trace have been left behind?" (1980, paragraph 905). Perhaps trace theorists are misguidedly seeking, on a priori grounds, to "dictate to science what to discover in the brain" (Zemach 1983, pp. 32-3).

Some defenders of the trace seek in response to drain it of empirical content. Deborah Rosen, for example, develops a "logical notion of the memory trace" which is distanced from "scientific notions for which the logical notion provides only a philosophical underpinning" (1975, p. 3). But giving up the ideal of an independent characterization of the trace may not be necessary. Perhaps the postulation of traces is empirical, but the relevant empirical domain is not psychology. What's doing the work is the physical assumption that there is no macroscopic action at a temporal distance, that mechanisms in fact underlie apparent cases of direct action between temporally remote events. This assumption may be mistaken, but challenges to it must offer some positive alternative theoretical framework. It seems weak to point to the mere logical possibility of a unique kind of "mnemic causation" which does operate at a temporal distance (Heil 1978, pp. 66-69; Anscombe 1981, pp. 126-7), or simply to deny the existence of the temporal gap between past and present (Malcolm 1963, p. 238). The genuine phenomenology of ‘direct’ access to the past, as in a vivid memory which immediately returns me, as I might say, to a past emotional and bodily state, cannot be deemed primitive and inexplicable.

Critics respond by denying that the retention involved in memory requires any continuous storage (Squires 1969; Malcolm 1977, pp. 197-9; Bursen 1978). This worry rightly pinpoints the need for trace theorists to be explicit on the relation between occurrent remembering and dispositional memories. We do need models of the mechanism by which enduring dispositions are actualized. But the criticism does not show that there is anything deeply mysterious in the notion of underlying causal processes which ground memory abilities (Warnock 1987, pp. 50-2; Deutscher 1989). The kind of ‘storage’ invoked by trace theorists need not be the storage of independent atomic items localized in particular places, like sacks of grain in a storehouse.

A dilemma: circularity or solipsism?

How does the postulated trace come to play a part in the present act of recognition or recall? Trace theorists must resist the idea that it is interpreted or read by some internal homunculus who can match a stored trace with a current input, or know just which trace to seek out for a given current purpose. Such an intelligent inner executive explains nothing (Gibson 1979, p. 256; Draaisma 2000, pp.212-29), or gives rise to a vicious Rylean regress in which further internal mechanisms operate in some "corporeal studio" (Ryle 1949/1963, p. 36; Malcolm 1970, p. 64).

But then the trace theorist is left with a dilemma. If we avoid the homunculus by allowing that the remembering subject can just choose the right trace, then our trace theory is circular, for the abilities which the memory trace was meant to explain are now being invoked to explain the workings of the trace (Bursen 1978, pp. 52-60; Wilcox and Katz 1981, pp. 229-232; Sanders 1985, pp. 508-10). Or if, finally, we deny that the subject has this circular independent access to the past, and agree that the activation of traces cannot be checked against some other veridical memories, then (critics argue) solipsism or scepticism results. There seems to be no guarantee that any act of remembering does provide access to the past at all: representationist trace theories thus cut the subject off from the past behind a murky veil of traces (Wilcox and Katz 1981, p. 231; Ben-Zeev 1986, p. 296).

We'll see below (section 3.3) that this dilemma recurs in directly empirical contexts in the difference between supervised and unsupervised learning rules in connectionist cognitive-scientific models of memory. There, as in this general context, the natural response is to take the second prong of the dilemma, and deal with the threat of solipsism or scepticism. The trace theorist must show how in practice the past can play roles in the causation of present remembering. The past is not uniquely specified by present input, and there is no general guarantee of accuracy: but the demand for incorrigible access to the past can be resisted.

Structural isomorphism

How can memory traces represent past events or experiences? How can they have content? This is in part a general problem about the meaning of mental representations (see the entry on mental representation). But specific problems seem to crop up for naturalistic trace theories of memory. In stating the causal theory of memory, Martin and Deutscher argued that an analysis of remembering should include the requirement that (in cases of genuine remembering) "the state or set of states produced by the past experience must constitute a structural analogue of the thing remembered" (1966, pp. 189-191), although they denied that the trace need be a perfect analogue, "mirroring all the features of a thing". But is there a coherent notion of structural isomorphism to be relied on here? If memory traces are not seen as images in the head, somehow directly resembling their objects, and if we are to cash out unanalysed and persistent metaphors of imprinting, engraving, copying, coding, or writing (Krell 1990, pp. 3-7), then what kind of "analogue" is the trace?

One option is to align trace theory with the one available general approach to content determination which does retain resemblance as the core explanatory notion. According to the structuralist theory of mental representation developed by Robert Cummins (1996), Paul Churchland (1998), and by Gerard O'Brien and Jon Opie (2004), there is an objective relation of ‘second-order resemblance’ between the system of representing vehicles in our heads and their represented objects. ‘First-order resemblance’ involves the sharing of some physical properties, and is thus unlikely to ground mental representation, since no traces in my brain share relevant physical properties with (say) the elephants or the conversations which I remember. But in second-order resemblance, the relations among a system of representing vehicles mirror the relations among their objects. In the case of brain traces, second-order structural resemblances hold when some physical relations among certain brain states (such as distance relations in the activation space of a neural network) preserve some system of relations among represented objects (O'Brien and Opie 2004, sections 3-4).

This general defence of the notion of a structural analogue is controversial. But there is another (compatible yet independent) response. We can weaken the requirement of isomorphism further, remembering that the target for a theory of memory in the philosophy of psychology is not restricted to cases of genuine veridical remembering. Details which crop up in remembering an experience need not have been permanently encoded in the same enduring determinate trace as that experience. We often tell more than we (strictly speaking) remember. Even where memory for the gist of an event is roughly accurate, details may shift as the trace is filtered through other beliefs, dreams, fears, or wishes (compare Schacter 1996, pp. 101-113). The causal connections between events and traces, and between traces and recollection, may be multiple, indirect, and context-dependent. The structures which underpin retention, then, need not remain the same over time, or might not always involve identifiable determinate forms over time.

This more dynamic vision of traces, rejecting the idea of permanent storage of independent items, may satisfy both recent developments in cognitive science (section 3 below) and some of the positive suggestions with which critics of static traces have accompanied their objections. In notes of 1935/6, Wittgenstein had wondered "whether the things stored up may not constantly change their nature" (quoted in Stern 1991, p. 204). Gibsonian direct realists in psychology, like some phenomenologists and Wittgensteinians in philosophy, have sometimes tended to assimilate all theories of memory traces or representations to the vision of passive, separate entities each with a fixed location in an inner archive. Writers in these diverse traditions have rightly pointed to the importance of various ways in which remembering often relies on information left in the external world, and have argued that we should see the internal aspects of memory more as an active resonance or attunement to information of certain kinds than as the encoding and reproduction of determinate images (Gibson 1966/1982, 1979; Wilcox and Katz 1981; Casey 1987; ter Hark 1995; Toth and Hunt 1999). These ideas have had considerable influence on recent theorizing in dynamical cognitive science, and on views of memory and mind as embodied, embedded, and extended (section 3 below). But they do not rule out weaker, dynamic notions of the memory trace. As the great English psychologist of memory Frederic Bartlett argued, "though we may still talk of traces, there is no reason in the world for regarding these as made complete, stored up somewhere, and then re-excited at some much later moment. The traces that our evidence allows us to speak of are interest-determined, interest-carried traces. They live with our interests and with them they change" (1932, pp. 211-2).

3. Memory in the Philosophy of Cognitive Science

3.1 Constructive Remembering

"A variety of conditions exist", notes Daniel Schacter, "in which subjectively compelling memories are grossly inaccurate" (1995, p. 22). Cognitive and developmental psychologists have recently come to a broad but striking consensus about the the constructive nature of remembering. To say that memory is a constructive process is not to focus unrealistically on cases where it goes wrong, for there is no reason to think that ‘constructed memories’ must be false.

Careful attention to the phenomenology of remembering supports the idea that truth in memory is compatible with some transformation at the time of recollection. For example, for many quite ordinary and obviously genuine autobiographical memories, most people can ‘flip’ perspectives. Sometimes one takes "the position of an onlooker or observer, looking at the situation from an external vantage point and seeing oneself ‘from the outside’"; or one can remember the same scene from one's own (past) perspective, with roughly the field of view available in the original situation, without ‘seeing oneself’ (Nigro and Neisser 1983, pp.467-8). This availability of both ‘observer’ and ‘field’ points of view in personal memory is puzzling in many respects, but is at least a simple example of compiling or reconstruction in remembering, which does not threaten our common sense trust in the reliability of memory.

Fierce disputes in psychology around 1990 between ‘ecological’ and ‘laboratory’ approaches to memory (see for example Middleton and Edwards 1990, and the review in Koriat and Goldsmith 1996) have since the mid-1990s given way to this consensus about constructive memory. Perhaps this was partly in response to the political and institutional crisis over recovered memories and false memories (Hacking 1995). But to say that psychologists of memory have turned their research efforts to the study of suggestibility, misinformation, and distortion is not, of course, to say that accuracy in memory has suddenly been shown by science to be impossible or unlikely. Most cognitive psychologists, in fact, believe that a better understanding of the mechanisms of distortion and confusion will also illuminate the general reliability of memory, by revealing processes which also operate in veridical remembering (Mitchell and Johnson 2000, pp. 179-180). Neither ‘accuracy’ or ‘reliability’ is a transparent notion in this context, and ‘truth’ in memory, though not forever inaccessible, is neither a single nor a simple thing. Verbatim recall and other forms of exact reproduction are rarely necessary for success in remembering (Rubin 1995).

This section continues with an overview of issues in the philosophy of science arising from memory research. It then addresses two related aspects of the psychological investigations into constructive remembering: the more flexible and dynamic accounts of long-term ‘storage’ and ‘traces' offered by connectionist models, and increased attention to the contexts of recall. The entry concludes with a discussion of the role of memory in recent attempts to link the cognitive sciences and the social sciences by way of the ‘extended mind ’ hypothesis.

3.2 Interdisciplinarity in the Sciences of Memory

Even if cognitive science is still ‘a mere babe in the woods of science’ (von Eckardt 1999, p. 221), the cognitive sciences of memory nevertheless harness a vast institutional, technological, and textual apparatus more typical of Kuhnian normal science than of an entirely pre-paradigmatic era. Yet because memory is studied in many different disciplines, from neurobiology to narrative psychology, there is no obvious unity to either the objects of enquiry or the methods employed.

Are the various disciplines and subdisciplines which study memory autonomous for principled reasons? Or is memory research a case in which lack of contact between natural sciences, social sciences, and humanities is damaging? Could there be a positive framework for understanding the relations between levels of explanation and between disciplines in the sciences of memory?

The relevant relation between different theories would not be the wholesale unification of all relevant sciences, as in the dream of classical reductionism (see the entry on intertheory relations in physics). Rather, we might seek the elucidation of local points of contact between different (sub)disciplines, in the search for interfield theories (Darden and Maull 1977), or in pinpointing genuinely interdependent phenomena at different levels of explanation (Kitcher 1992, pp. 6-7; Sutton, 2004).

A number of philosophers of psychology have found case studies in interdisciplinary theory-construction in the sciences of memory. The possibility that liberalized conceptions of reduction might fit work on the neural bases of associative learning and of spatial memory has been developed by Schaffner (1992), Bickle (1998), and Bechtel (2001). In contrast, others retain stricter notions of reduction and then argue that these cases don't meet their tighter criteria (Stoljar and Gold 1998; Gold and Stoljar 1999; Schouten and Looren de Jong 1999). Lindley Darden and Carl Craver bypass debates about reduction in developing positive accounts of levels and mechanisms in experimental neurobiology (Craver and Darden 2001; Craver 2002). Valerie Hardcastle offers a detailed narrative of the integration of interdisciplinary traditions, methods, and theories in the development of the distinction between implicit and explicit memory (1996, pp. 105-139). She sees it as a typically "complicated and cluttered" interdisciplinary theory, which relies actively on the methods and underlying assumptions of a number of different research traditions, in this case including developmental psychology, clinical neuropsychology, animal neurobiology, and experimental cognitive psychology. Although Hardcastle herself sees this account as anti-reductionist, it's not obviously inconsistent with the acceptance by ‘new-wave’ reductionists that any reductions in neuropsychological practice are "bound to be patchy" (Schaffner 1992, p. 337) and domain-specific (see the entries on the philosophy of neuroscience and multiple realizability).

While these writers address relations between the neural and the cognitive sciences of memory, there has been less work on cognitive psychology's relations with the developmental, personality, or social psychology of memory. Is there a clear and principled division between the cognitive and the social sciences of memory? We return to this question in discussing the role of context and environment below, after first examining the internal mechanisms of constructive remembering.

3.3 Distributed Models of Memory

If we want to retain the notion of memory traces, to account for causal continuity between past and present, but we deny that they are not stored in fixed and independent form in the brain, then what form do traces take? What are the mechanisms by which they link experience and recollection?

Research on constructive remembering in cognitive and developmental psychology has developed fairly independently of the connectionist computational modelling with which philosophers have been more concerned (see the entry on connectionism. Connectionism offers one way to cash out the more flexible and dynamic understanding of the format of stored mental representations which we saw was required to deflect direct realist and phenomenological criticisms. The internal plasticity of memory which ‘distributed’ models suggest is one of the most curious and characteristic features of human memory, and one which clearly differentiates our cognitive systems from the ‘memories’ of current digital computers. It's useful for the contents of the files stored on my computer to remain exactly the same from the moment I close them at night to the time I open them again in the morning. But various kinds of reorganization and realignment often happen to the information retained in my brain over the same period. In us, memories do not naturally sit still in cold storage.

In connectionist cognitive science, occurrent remembering is the temporary reactivation of a particular pattern or vector across the units of a neural network. This reconstruction is possible because of the conspiring influences of current input and the history of the network, where this history is sedimented in the particular connection weights between units. Memory traces are not stored statically between experience and remembering, but are piled together or ‘superposed’ in the same set of weights. In fully distributed representation, the same resources or vehicles are thus used to carry many different contents (van Gelder 1991). As McClelland and Rumelhart put it,

We see the traces laid down by the processing of each input as contributing to the composite, superimposed memory representation. Each time a stimul us is processed, it gives rise to a slightly different memory trace — either because the item itself is different or because it occurs in a different context that conditions its representation — the traces are not kept separate. Each trace contributes to the composite, but the characteristics of particular experiences tend nevertheless to be preserved, at least until they are overridden by canceling characteristics of other traces. Also, the traces of one stimulus pattern can coexist with the traces of other stimuli, within the same composite memory trace. (1986, p. 193)

This framework postulates two abstract features: distinct transient patterns of activity, and composite enduring (but modifiable) dispositional states. It is not tied to current computational models, for these two features can be implemented in different physical systems, and were clearly described in a number of theories of memory before the 20th century (Sutton 1998). The term ‘trace’ in this context is systematically ambiguous: it can be applied either to the fleeting patterns which constitute an explicit, occurrent representation, or to the persisting dispositions which underlie and ground the (re)construction of such occurrent patterns.

Connectionist remembering is thus an inferential process, constructive not reproductive. Rather than the retrieval of a discrete stored symbol, it is the filling in of a pattern on the basis of particular (perhaps partial or distorted) input. Information that has been processed survives only in dispositional form: "the data persist only implicitly by virtue of the effect they have on what the system knows" (Elman 1993, p. 89). Within the single network at least, "there is no difference between reconstructing a previous state, and constructing a totally new state (confabulating)" (Bechtel and Abrahamsen 1991, p. 64; compare McClelland 1995, pp. 69-70).

Truth in memory is a glaring problem in such a framework. Some connectionist simulations employ supervised learning rules, in which a network is given explicit feedback in response to its output as its weights are adjusted so as to minimize error. The importance of supervised learning in human development is considerable (Strauss and Quinn 1997, pp.76-9): but we cannot always compare our current memories with some independent version of the past. If we could, the postulation of even the dynamic distributed memory trace would be redundant. As Paul Churchland notes, we need "to escape the unreality of an omniscient teacher" (1989, p. 246). But just as the circularity prong of the trace theorist's dilemma (section 2.2 above) has this empirical realization, so the alternative, unsupervised connectionist learning algorithms seem to run the risk of solipsism or scepticism. In unsupervised learning, networks must evolve processing strategies which find similarities among inputs, progressively accommodating to their objective distribution (Churchland 1989, pp. 246-8; P.S. Churchland and Sejnowski 1992, pp. 96-7, 202-221). If the charge of solipsism or scepticism has to be met by a guarantee of incorrigible access to the past, as some direct realist critics demand (Turvey and Shaw 1979, p. 178), this influence of the world on the memory system would not be enough. But a fallibilist realist about the past can reject the requirement of certainty.

In unsupervised distributed models, memory systems thus extract information from inputs, becoming attuned, in context-dependent fashion, to what the environment affords. It would be strange if empirical theories of memory described the mind/brain as faithfully retaining or reflecting the past in its full presence, as the demand for epistemologically unquestionable remembering requires. Better metaphors are those of the continual filtering, deformation, revision, and melding of representations over time. Of course truth in memory is a problem, when multiple causes drive any act of remembering. There is seldom a simple, direct transmission from a single past experience through discretely stored inner items to a cleanly defined moment of recall, for each memory is many memories. Outside philosophy and the courtroom, perhaps we only recognise human memory as operating ‘normally’ when its successes are shot through with instances of forgetting, selection, condensation, interference, and distortion. Yet the experienced sedimentations of memory in the body, and of emotion in memories, make it blindly obvious that the real past, for all its occasional obscurity and its opacity to conscious or complete capture, does affect the present.

3.4 Memory, Distributed Cognition, and Social Science

The conditioning of representations by context, to which McClelland and Rumelhart refer, applies to encoding, ‘storage’, and retrieval phases alike. Increasing recognition of the context-dependent nature of memory links cognitive psychology with a diverse body of recent work on cognition as ‘distributed’ across the body and the world as well as the brain. How can we set the connectionist mechanisms of transformation and reconstruction on internal representations into a broader picture of the operation of personal memory in an intricate interpersonal and cultural world? Might the case of memory challenge the easy, institutionally-entrenched idea that cognitive psychology studies the individual mind, while social processes must be treated separately by the social sciences?

If memories are not fixed mental images or discrete items of any kind, permanently stored in the individual mind or brain, then the relatively unstable individual memory may need support from more stable external scaffolding or props. Experience attunes us to certain information or regularities or artifacts which we can exploit in the present. This is not to deny the importance of our capacity sometimes to remember experiences which are not retained in some external medium (section 2 above), but to suggest that we may only understand such capacities fully by attending also to our habitual uses of present resources on which to anchor our versions of the past.

Both cognitive anthropologists and philosophers drawing on dynamical and situated approaches to cognition have suggested the need for such a general framework for memory science to make sense of traces both inside and outside the individual. This is not to collapse the distinction between external and internal representational formats: for a connectionist in particular, the kind of ‘storage’ mechanisms employed by the brain are quite distinct in format and process from those of most external linguistic or digital systems. The point rather is to see brain traces and external traces as potential parts of temporarily integrated larger systems, used by us so as more successfully to exploit and manipulate information in the environment. As Andy Clark puts it, "our brains make the world smart so that we can be dumb in peace" (1997, p. 180). Our interaction with different forms of external symbol systems and ‘cognitive technologies’ may in some contexts alter our cognitive capacities. Culture and technology are products of cognition and action, but in the human case, as Merlin Donald argues, such products in turn "have direct effects upon individual cognition" (1991, p. 10).

So the best explanations of the form and content of specific personal memories may often refer not simply to the past episode itself, but to multiple causes which span internal and external factors. Cognitive scientists cannot legitimately ignore the transmission and transformation of external representations. But, conversely, some explanations in the social sciences of memory will refer to appropriately flexible internal processes of schematization or reconstruction.

This point might counter scepticism among both naturalistic philosophers of mind and a number of sociologists and historians about the very idea of a social ontology of memory. In his account of memories of the Holocaust, James Young prefers to use the term ‘collected memory’ instead of ‘collective memory’, because "societies cannot remember in any other way than through their constituents' memories" (1993, p. xi). Discussing the work of the sociologist of memory Maurice Halbwachs, Fentress and Wickham worry that his concept of collective consciousness was "curiously disconnected from the actual thought processes of any particular person", leaving later sociological accounts with the danger of treating the individual as "a sort of automaton, passively obeying the interiorized collective will" (1992, pp. ix-x).

But this embarrassment about social memory may be unnecessary. Halbwachs was indeed critical of the individualism of the psychological theory of his time, but it's arguable that his positive views are closer to the ‘active externalism’ of recent proponents of the ‘extended mind’ hypothesis (section 3.5 below) than to any quasi-Jungian mysticism. What Halbwachs called ‘social frameworks of memory’ are not the simple product of isolated individual memories, constructed after the fact by combinations of separate reminiscences, but are rather, in part, their source, the instruments used in particular acts of recall. "There is no point in seeking where memories are preserved in my brain or in some nook of my mind to which I alone have access: for they are recalled to me externally" (Halbwachs 1925/1992, p. 38). The people and groups around me normally "give me the means to reconstruct" my memories. There's a sharp contrast, argues Halbwachs, between remembering and "the actual state of isolation" of a dreamer, who isn't capable directly of relying on these frameworks of collective memory: "it is not in memory but in the dream that the mind is most removed from society" (1925/1992, p. 42). Public scaffolding of various forms, in the physical, symbolic, and social environment, can trigger the specific form and content of individual memory (see also Connerton 1989; Olick and Robbins 1998; Winter and Sivan 2000).

The development of the concept of ‘schema’ provides a positive example of fruitful interdisciplinary relations between psychology and cognitive anthropology. Theorists in both disciplines seek a vocabulary for relations between internal and external memory systems which neither collapses the distinction, nor sees the internal as merely a reflection of the social. When Frederic Bartlett imported the term ‘schema’ into the psychology of memory from neurophysiology, he worried about its static implications: "I strongly dislike the term ‘schema’. It is at once too definite and too sketchy. … It suggests some persistent, but fragmentary ‘form of arrangement’, and it does not indicate what is very essential to the notion, that the organised mass results of past changes … are actively doing something all the time" (1932, p. 201). So for Bartlett, a schema is not a definite or determinate cognitive structure at all, yet it's still a useful construct to capture the simultaneously conservative and creative aspects of memory. As an enduring but modifiable set of tendencies or dispositions, a schema may be invoked to explain, for example, the way a story may be normalized in the remembering or retelling, with the schema driving easy inferences to uncertain or untold parts of the story.

Cognitive-psychological accounts of the schema were then implemented in connectionist models in the 1980s. The history of past processing is ‘stored’ in the (enduring but modifiable) matrix of connection weights of the neural network, and thus influences (in a causally holistic fashion) the ongoing processing of input (Rumelhart, Smolensky, McClelland, and Hinton 1986). Cognitive anthropologists have found this a helpful way to model, simultaneously, both the ‘centripetal’ forces of cultural reproduction and the competing ‘centrifugal’ processes of variation and inconsistency. Claudia Strauss and Naomi Quinn, for example, employ connectionist schema theory to show how cultural learning produces responses which are permeated by tradition and yet not rigidly repetitive (1997, chapter 3). The traces culture leaves on individual brains and bodies are not downloaded copies of any specified (or specifiable) cultural instructions, but are dispositions to partial, flexible, and action-oriented responses. The dynamics of intrapersonal memories, feelings, and motives may be quite different from those of interpersonal messages and practices, even if the boundaries between inner and outer are permeable.

3.5 External Memory

But how plausible is the idea that there are traces outside the individual, in the world as well as the brain? How seriously can either cognitive or social scientists talk of ‘external memory’?

It's no accident that memory is at the heart of recent work on dynamical cognition and the embodied, embedded, and extended mind. On top of the connectionist focus on the plasticity of superpositionally stored memory traces, various theorists explore forms of interplay or ‘coupling’ between such flexible internal representations and the (natural and social) environment (see for example Donald 1991; Hutchins 1995; Clark 1997, 2002; Clark and Chalmers 1998; Haugeland 1998; Rowlands 1999; Dennett 2000; Auyang 2000, chapter 6; Giere 2002). Linked in various forms of "continuous reciprocal causation" (Clark 1997, pp. 163-6), brain and world are often engaged in an ongoing interactive dance through which adaptive action results. The vehicles of representation in memory, as well as the processes of remembering, may spread out of the brain and be left in the world. Just as our problem-solving abilities depend in part on "our abilities to dissipate reasoning" by building "designer environments" (Clark 1997, pp. 180, 191), so our capacities to access, manage, and manipulate large bodies of information depend on the technological and cultural symbolic networks we've constructed to plug ourselves into (Donald 1991, pp. 269-360; Rowlands 1999, pp. 119-147).

The claim that ‘external memory’ is no mere metaphor does not rest on the idea that some external ‘representations’ (such as information in notebooks) are identical to internal mental representations, provided that they meet certain criteria of accessibility and reliability (as is assumed for example in Adams and Aizawa 2001). Instead, the core idea is that quite disparate internal and external elements can be simultaneously coopted into integrated larger cognitive systems, which have properties distinct from those of either inner or outer elements alone. The external media on which we rely as cognitive scaffolding are, as Clark argues, "best seen as alien but complementary to the brain's style of storage and computation. The brain need not waste its time replicating such capacities. Rather, it must learn to interface with the external media in ways that maximally exploit their peculiar virtues" (1997, p. 220). For example, our internal working memory, with its limited capacity and unreliability, is not duplicated in the various systems of ‘exograms’ which humans have produced: "unlike the constantly-moving and fading contents of biological working memory, the contents of this externally-driven processor can be frozen in time, reviewed, refined, and reformatted" (Donald 1991, p. 316). So biological working memory is often best seen as a loop in processes that transform information in external structures (Rowlands 1999).

But different environmental media for the storage, transmission, and transformation of information have their own peculiar virtues. The various kinds of memory scaffolding which humans use, from knots, rhymes, codes, diagrams, slide-rules, and sketchpads to artificial memory techniques, photographs, books, rituals, and computers, have quite different properties, so that the resources of the historian, media theorist, and social scientist may again have a role within cognitive science. While the enduring and expandable nature of some external symbol systems has indeed altered the informational environment in which brains develop, not all such systems are designed to hold information permanently in a context- or medium-independent fashion, and not all systems which are designed to do so actually succeed (Kwint 1999; Renfrew and Scarre 1999). Sciences of the interface will have to deal with heterogeneous mnemonic systems involving tools, labels, and technologies as well as embodied brains. Perhaps lawlike regularities will then be hard to find: critics of the extended mind complain that "there just isn't going to be a science covering the motley collection of ‘memory’ processes found in human tool use" (Adams and Aizawa 2001, p.61). This, however, is a price other philosophers may be prepared to pay if it encourages a proliferation of informed multidisciplinary narrative case studies of memory in cognition and culture.


Warnock (1987) is a good introduction to a range of issues in the philosophy of memory. Hacking (1995) is a readable and provocative philosophical and historical account of problems about false memory and personal identity, while Campbell (2003) is an important new philosophical treatment of related issues. Draaisma (2000) and Krell (1990) include interesting and polemical surveys of the history of theories of memory. Carruthers (1990), Small (1997), and Yates (1966) are wonderfully detailed histories of ancient and Renaissance memory techniques and practices, while Sutton (1998) includes a treatment of early modern theories. Engel (1999) and Schacter (1996) are reliable and well-written introductions to the psychology of memory in general: Tulving and Craik (2000) is a thorough handbook on the cognitive psychology and neuropsychology of memory. Fentress and Wickham (1992) and Misztal (2003) include helpful overviews of studies of social memory and collective memory. Fara and Patterson (1998) is a diverse set of essays on memory for a non-specialist readership. Hoerl and McCormack (2001) is a difficult but rewarding collection of interdisciplinary papers on memory and time.

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with other suggestions]

Related Entries

connectionism | consciousness: unity of | memory: epistemological problems of | mental representation | neuroscience, philosophy of | perception: epistemological problems of | personal identity | time: the experience and perception of