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Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling

First published Mon Oct 22, 2001

Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling (1775-1854) is, along with J.G. Fichte and G.W.F. Hegel, one of the three most influential thinkers in the tradition of ‘German Idealism’. Although he is often regarded as a philosophical Proteus who changed his conception so radically and so often that it is hard to attribute a clear philosophy to him, Schelling was in fact often an impressively rigorous logical thinker. In the era during which Schelling was writing, so much was changing in philosophy that a stable, fixed point of view was as likely to lead to a failure to grasp important new developments as it was to lead to a defensible philosophical system. Schelling's continuing importance today relates mainly to three aspects of his work. The first is his Naturphilosophie, which, although its empirical claims are largely indefensible, opens up the possibility of a modern hermeneutic view of nature that does not restrict nature's significance to what can be established about it in scientific terms. The second is his anti-Cartesian account of subjectivity, which prefigures some of the best ideas of thinkers like Nietzsche and Jacques Lacan, in showing how the thinking subject cannot be fully transparent to itself. The third is his later critique of Hegelian Idealism, which influenced Kierkegaard, Marx, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and others, and aspects of which are still echoed in contemporary thought by thinkers like Jacques Derrida.

1. Career

Schelling was born in Leonberg near Stuttgart on 27 January 1775. He attended a Protestant seminary in Tübingen from 1790 to 1795, where he was close friends with both Hegel and the poet and philosopher Friedrich Hölderlin. He moved to Leipzig in 1797, then to Jena, where he came into contact with the early Romantic thinkers, Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis, and, via Goethe's influence, took up his first professorship from 1798 to 1803. From 1803 to 1806 he lived in Würzburg, whence he left for Munich, where he mainly lived from 1806 onwards, with an interruption from 1820 to 1827, when he lived in Erlangen. He moved to Berlin in 1841 to take up what had, until Hegel's death in 1831, been Hegel's chair of philosophy. Although his lectures in Berlin were initially attended by such luminaries as Kierkegaard, Engels, Bakunin, Ranke, Burkhardt, and Alexander von Humboldt, he soon came to be largely ignored by most of the leading thinkers of the day. It is clear, however, that his philosophical thought still influenced many who rejected him on mainly political grounds. He died on 20 August 1854 in Bad Ragaz, Switzerland. Schelling's influence on many directions in modern philosophy has been seriously underestimated in the English-speaking world, though this underestimation is now beginning to be countered by renewed attention to his work.

2. Transcendental Philosophy and Naturphilosophie

The significance of the work of the early Schelling (1795-1800) lies in its attempts to give a new account of nature which, while taking account of the fact that Kant has irrevocably changed the status of nature in modern philosophy, avoids some of the problematic consequences of Kant's theory. For the Kant of the Critique of Pure Reason (1781, 1787) nature is largely seen in the ‘formal’ sense: nature is that which is subject to necessary laws. These laws are accessible to us, Kant argues, because cognition depends on the subject bringing necessary forms of thought, the categories, to bear on what it perceives. The problem this leads to is how the subject could fit into a nature conceived of in deterministic terms, given that the subject's ability to know is dependent upon its ‘spontaneous’ self-caused ability to judge in terms of the categories. Kant's response to this dilemma is to split the ‘sensuous’ realm of nature as law-bound appearance from the ‘intelligible’ realm of the subject's cognitive and ethical self-determination. However, if the subject is part of nature there would seem to be no way of explaining how a nature which we can only know as deterministic can give rise to a subject which seems to transcend determinism in its knowing and in its ethical doings. Kant himself sought to bridge the realms of necessity and spontaneity in the Critique of Judgement (1790), by suggesting that nature itself could be seen in more than formal terms: it also produces self-determining organisms and can give rise to disinterested aesthetic pleasure in the subject that contemplates its forms. The essential problems remained, however, that 1) Kant gave no account of the genesis of the subject that transcends its status as a piece of determined nature, and 2) such an account would have to be able to bridge the divide between nature and freedom.

The tensions in Schelling's philosophy of this period, which set the agenda for most of his subsequent work, derive, then, from the need to overcome the perceived lack in Kant's philosophy of a substantial account of how nature and freedom come to co-exist. Two ways out of Kantian dualism immediately suggested themselves to thinkers in the 1780s and 90s. On the one hand, Kant's arguments about the division between appearances and things in themselves, which gave rise to the problem of how something ‘in itself’ could give rise to appearances for the subject, might be overcome by rejecting the notion of the thing in itself altogether. If what we know of the object is the product of the spontaneity of the I, an Idealist could argue that the whole of the world's intelligibility is therefore the result of the activity of the subject, and that a new account of subjectivity is required which would achieve what Kant had failed to achieve. On the other hand, the fact that nature gives rise to self-determining subjectivity would seem to suggest that a monist account of a nature which was more than a concatenation of laws, and was in some sense inherently ‘subjective’, would offer a different way of accounting for what Kant's conception did not provide. Schelling seeks answers to the Kantian problems in terms that relate to both these conceptions. Indeed, it is possible to argue that the conceptions are in one sense potentially identical: if the essence of nature is that it produces the subjectivity which enables it to understand itself, nature itself could be construed as a kind of ‘super-subject’. The main thinkers whose work establishes these alternatives are J.G. Fichte, and Spinoza.

The source of Schelling's concern with Spinoza is the ‘Pantheism controversy’, which brought Spinoza's monism into the mainstream of German philosophy. In 1783 the writer and philosopher F.H. Jacobi became involved in an influential dispute with the Berlin Enlightenment philosopher Moses Mendelssohn over the claim that G.E. Lessing had admitted to being a Spinozist, an admission which at that time was tantamount to the admission of atheism, with all the dangerous political and other consequences that entailed. In his On the Doctrine of Spinoza in Letters to Herr Moses Mendelssohn, (1785, second edition 1789), which was influenced by his reading of Kant's first Critique, Jacobi revealed a problem which would recur in differing ways throughout Schelling's work. Jacobi's interpretation of Spinozism was concerned with the relationship between what he termed the ‘unconditioned’ and the ‘conditioned’, between God as the ground of which the laws of nature are the consequent, and the linked chains of the deterministic laws of nature. Cognitive explanation relies, as Kant suggested, upon finding a thing's ‘condition’. Jacobi's question is how finding a thing's condition can finally ground its explanation, given that each explanation leads to a regress in which each condition depends upon another condition ad infinitum. Any philosophical system that would ground the explanation of a part of nature thus ‘necessarily ends by having to discover conditions of the unconditioned’. For Jacobi this led to the need for a theological leap of faith, as the world's intelligibility otherwise threatened to become a mere illusion, in which nothing was finally grounded at all. In the 1787 Introduction to the first Critique Kant maintains this problem of cognitive grounding can be overcome by acknowledging that, while reason must postulate the ‘unconditioned (...) in all things in themselves for everything conditioned, so that the series of conditions should thus become complete’, by restricting knowledge to appearances, rather than allowing it to be of ‘things in themselves’, the contradiction of seeking conditions of the unconditioned can be avoided. As we have already seen, though, this gives rise precisely to the problem of how a subject which is not conditioned like the nature it comes to know can emerge as the ground of knowledge from nature.

The condition of the knowledge of appearances for Kant is the ‘transcendental subject’, but what sort of ‘condition’ is the transcendental subject? The perception that Kant has no proper answer to this problem initially unites Schelling and Fichte. Fichte insists in the Wissenschaftslehre (1794) that the unconditioned status of the I has to be established if Kant's system is to legitimate itself. He asserts that ‘It is (...) the ground of explanation of all facts of empirical consciousness that before all positing in the I the I itself must previously be posited’, thereby giving the I the founding role which he thought Kant had failed adequately to explicate. Fichte does this by extending the consequences of Kant's claim that the cognitive activity of the I, via which it can reflect upon itself, cannot be understood as part of the causal world of appearances, and must therefore be part of the noumenal realm, the realm of the ‘unconditioned’. For Fichte the very fact of philosophy's existence depends upon the free act of the I which initiates the reflective questioning of its own activity by the I.

Schelling takes up the issues raised by Jacobi and Fichte in two texts of 1795: Of the I as Principle of Philosophy or on the Unconditional in Human Knowledge, and Philosophical Letters on Dogmatism and Criticism. In a move which prefigures aspects of Heidegger's questioning of the notion of being, he reinterprets Kant's question as to the condition of possibility of synthetic judgements a priori as a question about why there is a realm of judgements, a manifest world requiring syntheses by the subject for knowledge to be produced, at all. In Of the I Schelling puts Kant's question in Fichtean terms: ‘how is it that the absolute I goes out of itself and opposes a Not-I to itself?’. He maintains that the condition of knowledge, the ‘positing’ by the I of that which is opposed to it, must have a different status from the determined realm which it posits: ‘nothing can be posited by itself as a thing, i.e. an absolute/unconditioned thing (unbedingtes Ding) is a contradiction’. However, his key worry about Fichte's position already becomes apparent in the Philosophical Letters, where he drops the Fichtean terminology: ‘How is it that I step at all out of the absolute and move towards something opposed (auf ein Entgegengesetztes)?’. The problem Schelling confronts was identified by his friend Hölderlin, in the light of Jacobi's formulation of the problem of the ‘unconditioned’. Fichte wished to understand the absolute as an I in order to avoid the problem of nature ‘in itself’ which creates Kantian dualism. For something to be an I, though, it must be conscious of an other, and thus in a relationship to that other. The overall structure of the relationship could not, therefore, be described from only one side of that relationship. Hölderlin argued that one has to understand the structure of the relationship of subject to object in consciousness as grounded in ‘a whole of which subject and object are the parts’, which he termed ‘being’. This idea will be vital to Schelling at various times in his philosophy.

In the 1790s, then, Schelling is seeking a way of coming to terms with the ground of the subject's relationship to the object world. His aim is to avoid the fatalist consequences of Spinoza's system by taking on key aspects of Kant's and Fichte's transcendental philosophy, and yet not to fall into the trap Hölderlin identified in Fichte's conception of an absolute I. In his Naturphilosophie (philosophy of nature), which emerges in 1797 and develops in the succeeding years, and in the System of Transcendental Idealism of 1800, Schelling wavers between a Spinozist and a Fichtean approach to the ‘unconditioned’. In the Naturphilosophie the Kantian division between appearing nature and nature in itself is seen as resulting from the fact that the nature theorised in cognitive judgements is objectified in opposition to the knowing subject. This objectification, the result of the natural sciences' search for fixed laws, fails to account for the living dynamic forces in nature, including those in our own organism, with which Kant himself became concerned in the third Critique and other late work, and which had played a role in Leibniz's account of nature. Nature in itself is thought of by Schelling as a ‘productivity’: ‘As the object [qua ’conditioned condition’] is never absolute/unconditioned (unbedingt) then something per se non-objective must be posited in nature; this absolutely non-objective postulate is precisely the original productivity of nature’. The Kantian dualism between things in themselves and appearances is a result of the fact that the productivity can never appear as itself and can only appear in the form of ‘products’, which are the productivity ‘inhibiting’ itself. The products are never complete in themselves: they are like the eddies in a stream, which temporarily keep their shape via the resistance of the movement of the fluid to itself that creates them, despite the changing material flowing through them.

Schelling next tries to use the insights of transcendental philosophy, while still avoiding Kant's dualism, to explain our knowledge of nature. The vital point is that things in themselves and ‘representations’ cannot be absolutely different because we know a world which exists independently of our will which can yet be affected by our will:

one can push as many transitory materials as one wants, which become finer and finer, between mind and matter, but sometime the point must come where mind and matter are One, or where the great leap that we so long wished to avoid becomes inevitable.

The Naturphilosophie includes ourselves within nature, as part of an interrelated whole, which is structured in an ascending series of ‘potentials’ that contain a polar opposition within themselves. The model is a magnet, whose opposing poles are inseparable from each other, even though they are opposites. As productivity nature cannot be conceived of as an object, since it is the subject of all possible real ‘predicates’, of the ‘eddies’ of which transient, objective nature consists. However, nature's ‘inhibiting’ itself in order to become something determinate means that the ‘principle of all explanation of nature’ is ‘universal duality’, an inherent difference of subject and object which prevents nature ever finally reaching stasis. At the same time this difference of subject and object must be grounded in an identity which links them together, otherwise all the problems of dualism would just reappear. In a decisive move for German Idealism, Schelling parallels the idea of nature as an absolute producing subject, whose predicates are appearing objective nature, with the spontaneity of the thinking subject, which is the condition of the syntheses required for the constitution of objectivity, thus for the possibility of predication in judgements. The problem for Schelling lies in explicating how these two subjects relate to each other.

In the System of Transcendental Idealism Schelling goes back to Fichtean terminology, though he will soon abandon most of it. He endeavours to explain the emergence of the thinking subject from nature in terms of an ‘absolute I’ coming retrospectively to know itself in a ‘history of self-consciousness’ that forms the material of the system. The System recounts the history of which the transcendental subject is the result. A version of the model Schelling establishes will be adopted by Hegel in the Phenomenology of Mind. Schelling presents the process in terms of the initially undivided I splitting itself in order to articulate itself in the syntheses, the ‘products’, which constitute the world of knowable nature. The founding stages of this process, which bring the world of material nature into being, are ‘unconscious’. These stages then lead to organic nature, and thence to consciousness and self-consciousness. Schelling claims, in the wake of Fichte, that the resistance of the noumenal realm to theoretical knowledge results from the fact that ‘the [practical] act [of the absolute I] via which all limitation is posited, as condition of all consciousness, does not itself come to consciousness’. He prophetically attempts to articulate a theory which comes to terms with the idea that thought is driven by forces which are not finally transparent to it, of the kind later to become familiar in psychoanalysis. How, though, does one gain access by thought to what cannot be an object of consciousness? This access is crucial to the whole project because without it there can be no understanding of why the move from determined nature to the freedom of self-determining thinking takes place at all.

Schelling adopts the idea from the early Romantic thinkers Friedrich Schlegel and Novalis, whom he knew in Jena at this time, that art is the route to an understanding of what cannot appear as an object of knowledge. Philosophy cannot represent nature in itself because access to the sphere of the unconscious must be via what appears to consciousness in the realm of theoretical knowledge. The work of art is evidently an empirical, appearing object like any other, but if it is not more than what it is qua determinable object it cannot be a work of art, because this requires both the free judgement of the subject and the object's conveying of something beyond its objective nature. Although the System's own very existence depends upon the transition from theoretical to practical philosophy, which requires the breaking-off of Jacobi's chain of ‘conditions’ by something unconditioned, Schelling is concerned to understand how the highest insight must be into reality as a product of the interrelation of both the ‘conscious’ and the ‘unconscious’. Reality is not, therefore, essentially captured by a re-presentation of the objective by the subjective. Whereas in the System nature begins unconsciously and ends in conscious philosophical and scientific knowledge, in the art work: ‘the I is conscious according to the production, unconscious with regard to the product’. The product cannot be understood via the intentions of its producer, as this would mean that it became a ‘conditioned’ object, something produced in terms of a pre-existing rule, and would therefore lack what makes mere craft into art. Art is, then, ‘the only true and eternal organ and document of philosophy, which always and continuously documents what philosophy cannot represent externally’. The particular sciences can only follow the chain of conditions, via the principle of sufficient reason, and must determine any object via its place in that chain, a process which has no necessary end. The art object, on the other hand, manifests what cannot be understood in terms of its knowable conditions, because an account of the materials of which it is made or of its status as object in the world does not constitute it as art. Art shows what cannot be said. Philosophy cannot positively represent the absolute because ‘conscious’ thinking operates from the position where the ‘absolute identity’ of the subjective and the objective has always already been lost in the emergence of consciousness.

Although Schelling's early work did not fully satisfy either himself, or anybody else, it manages to address, in a cogent and illuminating fashion, a great deal of topics which affect subsequent philosophy. The model presented in the System impresses not least because, at the same time as establishing the notion of the history of self-consciousness that would be decisive for Hegel, it offers, in a manner which goes beyond its sources in Fichte, a model of the relationship between the subject and its conceptually inaccessible motivating forces which would affect significant parts of nineteenth century thought from Schopenhauer, to Nietzsche, to Freud.

3. Identity Philosophy

Although the period of Schelling's ‘identity philosophy’ is usually dated from the 1801 Presentation of My System of Philosophy until sometime before the 1809 On the Essence of Human Freedom, the project of that philosophy can be said to be carried on in differing ways throughout his work. The identity philosophy derives from Schelling's conviction that the self-conscious I must be seen as a result, rather than as the originating act it is in Fichte, and thus that the I cannot be seen as the generative matrix of the whole system. This takes him more in the direction of Spinoza, but the problem is still that of articulating the relationship between the I and the world of material nature, without either reverting to Kantian dualism or failing to explain how a purely objective nature could give rise to subjectivity.

Schelling's mature identity philosophy, which is contained in the System of the Whole of Philosophy and of Naturphilosophie in Particular, written in Würzburg in 1804, and in other texts between 1804 and 1807, breaks with the model of truth as correspondence. It does so because:

It is clear that in every explanation of the truth as a correspondence (Übereinstimmung) of subjectivity and objectivity in knowledge, both, subject and object, are already presupposed as separate, for only what is different can agree, what is not different is in itself one.

The crucial problem is how to explain the link between the subject and object world that makes judgements possible, and this cannot be achieved in terms of how a subject can have thoughts which correspond to an object essentially separate from it. For there to be judgements at all what is split and then synthesised in the judgement must, Schelling contends, in some way already be the same. This has often been understood as leading Schelling to a philosophy in which, as Hegel puts it in the Phenomenology, the absolute is the ‘night in which all cows are black’, because it swallows all differentiated knowledge in the assertion that everything is ultimately the same, namely an absolute which excludes all relativity from itself and thus becomes inarticulable. This is not a valid interpretation of Schelling's argument, and Hegel's remark seems, incidentally, not to have been directed against Schelling anyway.

In order to try to get over the problem in monism of how the One is also the many, Schelling, following the idea outlined above from Hölderlin, introduces a notion of ‘transitive’ being, which links mind and matter as predicates of itself. Schelling explains this ‘transitivity’ via the metaphor of the earth:

you recognise its [the earth's] true essence only in the link by which it eternally posits its unity as the multiplicity of its things and again posits this multiplicity as its unity. You also do not imagine that, apart from this infinity of things which are in it, there is another earth which is the unity of these things, rather the same which is the multiplicity is also unity, and what the unity is, is also the multiplicity, and this necessary and indissoluble One of unity and multiplicity in it is what you call its existence (...) Existence is the link of a being (Wesen) as One, with itself as a multiplicity.

‘Absolute identity’ is, then, the link of the two aspects of being, which, on the one hand, is the universe, and, on the other, is the changing multiplicity which the knowable universe also is. Schelling insists now that ‘The I think, I am, is, since Descartes, the basic mistake of all knowledge; thinking is not my thinking, and being is not my being, for everything is only of God or the totality’, so the I is ‘affirmed’ as a predicate of the being by which it is preceded. In consequence he already begins to move away, albeit inconsistently, from the German Idealist model in which the intelligibility of being is regarded as a result of its having an essentially mind-like structure.

Schelling is led to this view by his understanding of the changing and relative status of theoretical knowledge. It is the inherent incompleteness of all finite determinations which reveals the nature of the absolute. His description of time makes clear what he means: ‘time is itself nothing but the totality appearing in opposition to the particular life of things’, so that the totality ‘posits or intuits itself, by not positing, not intuiting the particular’. The particular is determined in judgements, but the truth of claims about the totality cannot be proven because judgements are necessarily conditioned, whereas the totality is not. Given the relative status of the particular there must, though, be a ground which enables us to be aware of that relativity, and this ground must have a different status from the knowable world of finite particulars. At the same time, if the ground were wholly different from the world of relative particulars the problems of dualism would recur. As such the absolute is the finite, but we do not know this in the manner we know the finite. Without the presupposition of ‘absolute identity’, therefore, the evident relativity of particular knowledge becomes inexplicable, since there would be no reason to claim that a revised judgement is predicated of the same world as the preceding -- now false -- judgement.

Schelling summarises his theory of identity as follows:

for being, actual, real being is precisely self-disclosure/revelation (Selbstoffenbarung). If it is to be as One then it must disclose/reveal itself in itself; but it does not disclose/reveal itself in itself if it is not an other in itself, and is in this other the One for itself, thus if it is not absolutely the living link of itself and an other.

The link between the ‘real’ and the ‘ideal’ cannot be regarded as a causal link. Although there cannot be mental events without physical events, the former cannot be reduced to being the causal results of the latter: ‘For real and ideal are only different views of one and the same substance’. Schelling wavers at this time between a ‘reflexive’ position of the kind which Hegel will soon try to articulate, in which, in Schelling's terms, ‘the sameness of the subjective and the objective is made the same as itself, knows itself, and is the subject and object of itself’, in the ‘identity of identity and difference’, and the sense that this position cannot finally circumscribe the structure of the absolute. The structure of reflection, where each aspect reflects itself and then is reflected in the other, upon which this account of the identity of subject and object relies, must be grounded in a being which carries it:

reflection (...) only knows the universal and the particular as two relative negations, the universal as relative negation of the particular, which is, as such, without reality, the particular, on the other hand, as a relative negation of the universal.(...) something independent of the concept must be added to posit the substance as such.

Without this independent basis subject and object would merely be, as Schelling thinks they are in Fichte, relative negations of each other, leading to a circle ‘inside which a nothing gains reality by the relation to another nothing’. Schelling prophetically distinguishes between the cognitive -- reflexive -- ground of finite knowledge and the real -- non-reflexive -- ground that sustains the movement of negation from one finite determination to another. As a two-sided relationship reflection alone always entails the problem that the subject and the object in a case of reflection can only be known to be the same via that which cannot appear in the reflection. If I am to recognise myself as myself in a mirror, rather than see a random object in the world, I must already be familiar with myself before the reflection, in a way which is not part of the reflection. This means a complete system based on reflection is impossible, because, in order for the system to be grounded, it must presuppose as external to itself what it claims is part of itself. Schelling will, in his philosophy from the 1820s onwards, raise this objection against Hegel's system of ‘absolute reflection’.

Schelling's own dissatisfaction with his early versions of identity theory derives from his rejection of Spinozism. Spinoza regards the move from God to the world of ‘conditions’ as a logical consequence of the nature of God. Schelling becomes convinced that such a theory gives no reason why the absolute, the ‘unconditioned’, should manifest itself in a world of negative ‘conditions’ at all. Schelling is therefore confronted with explaining why there is a transition from the absolute to the finite world. In Philosophy and Religion, of 1804, he claims, like Jacobi, that there is no way of mediating between conditioned and unconditioned, and already makes the distinction between ‘negative’ and ‘positive’ philosophy, which will form the heart of his late work. Explicating the structure of the finite world leads to ‘negative philosophy, but much has already been gained by the fact that the negative, the realm of nothingness, has been separated by a sharp limit from the realm of reality and of what alone is positive’. The question which comes to concern Schelling is how philosophy can come to terms with a ground which cannot be regarded as the rational explanation of the finite world.

4. The ‘Ages of the World’

Schelling's work from his middle period (1809-1827) is usually referred to as the philosophy of the Ages of the World (WA = Weltalter), after the title of the unfinished work of that name he worked on in the period 1809-1827. The work characteristic of this period begins with the 1809 On the Essence of Human Freedom (FS = Freiheitsschrift) (written in Stuttgart). The WA philosophy is an attempt to explain the emergence of an intelligible world at the same time as coming to terms with mind's inextricable relation to matter. The initial concern is to avoid Spinoza's fatalism, which renders the human freedom to do good and evil incomprehensible. Schelling's crucial objection is to the idea that evil should be understood as merely another form of negativity which can be comprehended by insight into the inherent lack in all finite parts of a totality, rather than as a positive fact relating to the nature of human freedom. He now sees the fundamental contradictions of the Naturphilosophie in terms of the relationship of the intelligibility of nature and ourselves to a ground without which there could be no intelligibility, but which is not the explicable cause of intelligibility. In an attempt to get to grips with the problem of the ground of the finite world Schelling introduces a Kant-derived conception of ‘willing’ in the FS which will be influential for Schopenhauer's conception of the ‘Will’: ‘In the last and highest instance there is no other being but willing. Willing is primal being, and all the predicates of primal being only fit willing: groundlessness, eternity, being independent of time, self-affirmation’. Schelling now establishes a more conflictual version of the structure of the identity philosophy. The ‘ground’ is ‘groundless’ -- in the sense of ‘uncaused’ -- and it must be understood in terms of freedom if a Spinozist determinism is to be avoided. This means there cannot be an explanation of the finite world, because that would entail taking the ground as a cause and thus rendering freedom non-existent.

At the same time Schelling insists there must be that against which freedom can be manifest -- a being which is not free and is therefore necessitated -- for it to be meaningful freedom at all. The theory is based on the antagonisms between opposing forces which constitute the ‘ages of the world’, the past, present, and future. He argues that the world whose origins the WA wishes to understand must entail the same conflicting forces which still act, though not necessarily in the same form, in this world, of which the mind is an aspect: ‘Poured from the source of things and the same as the source, the human soul has a co-knowledge/con-science (Mitwissenschaft) of creation’. Schelling suggests that there are two principles in us: ‘an unconscious, dark principle and a conscious principle’, which must yet in some way be identical. The same structure applies to what Schelling means by ‘God’. At this point his account of the ground is not consistent, but this inconsistency points to the essential issue Schelling is trying to understand, namely whether philosophy can give a rational account of the fact of the manifest world. As that which makes the world intelligible, God relates to the ground in such a way that the ‘real’, which takes the form of material nature, is ‘in God’ but ‘is not God seen absolutely, i.e. insofar as He exists; for it is only the ground of His existence, it is nature in God; an essence which is inseparable from God, but different from Him’. The point is that God would be meaningless if there were not that which He transcends: without opposition, Schelling argues, there is no life and no sense of development, which are the highest aspects of reality. The aim of the move away from Spinoza is to avoid the sense of a world complete in itself which would render freedom illusory because freedom's goal would already be determined as part of the totality. Schelling starts to confront the idea that the reconciliation of freedom and necessity that had been sought by Kant in the acknowledgement of the necessity of the law, and which was the aim of German Idealism's attempt to reconcile mind and nature, might be intrinsically unattainable.

Wolfram Hogrebe has convincingly claimed that the WA philosophy is an ontological theory of predication. Being, as initially One and enclosed within itself, is not manifest, and has no reason to be manifest. Hogrebe terms this ‘pronominal being’. The same being must also, given that there is now a manifest world, be ‘predicative being’ (ibid.), which ‘flows out, spreads, gives itself’. The contradiction between the two kinds of being is only apparent. Schelling maintains, in line with the identity philosophy, that the ‘properly understood law of contradiction really only says that the same cannot be as the same something and also the opposite thereof, but this does not prevent the same, which is A, being able, as an other, to be not A’. One aspect of being, the dark force, which he sometimes terms ‘gravity’, is contractive, the other expansive, which he terms ‘light’. Dynamic processes are the result of the interchange between these ultimately identical forces: if they were wholly separate there would either be no manifest universe or the universe would dissipate at infinite speed. If something is to be as something it must both be, in the positive sense in which everything else is, which makes it indeterminately positive, pronominal, and it must have a relationship to what it is not, in order to be determinate, which brings it into the realm of predication by taking it beyond itself. In the WA the One comes into contradiction with itself and the two forces constantly vie with each other. Differences must, however, be grounded in unity, as otherwise they could not be manifest at all as differences. The ground is now increasingly regarded as the source of the transitory nature of everything particular, and less and less as the source of tranquil insight into how we can be reconciled to finite existence. The mood of the WA is summed up in Schelling's reference to the ‘veil of melancholy which is spread over the whole of nature, the deep indestructible melancholy of all life’. The source of this melancholy is that everything finite must ‘go to ground’ and that we are aware of this.

The abandonment of his residual Spinozism leads Schelling to a growing concern with the tensions which result from contradictions that are also embodied in human beings. The ages of the world are constituted by the development of forms and structures in the material and the mental world. This development depends upon the expanding force's interaction with the contracting force's slowing of any expansion, which allows transient but determinate forms to develop. This process also gives rise to language, which Schelling regards as the model for the development of the whole world because it manifests how expansion and the release of tension can lead to intelligibility, rather than mere dissipation:

It seems universal that every creature which cannot contain itself or draw itself together in its own fullness, draws itself together outside itself, whence e.g. the elevated miracle of the formation of the word in the mouth belongs, which is a true creation of the full inside when it can no longer remain in itself.

Language as ‘contracted’ material signifier, and ‘expanding’ ideal meaning repeats the basic structure of the WA, and Schelling insists that, like the material world without the ‘ideal’ capacity for expansion, language can become ‘congealed’. This interaction between what is contained in itself and what draws something beyond itself is also what gives rise to consciousness, and thus to an inherent tension within consciousness, which can only be itself by its relation to an other. Hegel uses a related model of subjectivity, but Schelling will come to reject Hegel's model for its conjuring away of the ultimately irresolvable tension in all subjectivity. Schelling's later philosophy will present a subject whose origin prevents it from ever achieving the ‘self-presence’ Hegel thinks he can explicate via the completed structure of ‘self-reflection’ in the other. Schelling's WA philosophy is never completed: its Idealist aim of systematically unifying subject and object by comprehending the real development of history from the very origins of being founders on problems concerning the relationship between philosophical system and historical contingency which do not admit of solutions. Furthermore, the structures he develops lead him to ideas which take him beyond Idealism and make him one of the crucial precursors of existential and other non-Idealist forms of modern philosophy.

5. Positive and Negative Philosophy, and the Critique of Hegel

Schelling has usually been understood as providing the transitional ‘objective idealist’ link between Fichte and Hegel. By regarding Hegel's system as the culmination of German Idealism this interpretation fails to do justice to Schelling's real philosophical insights. Many of these insights, particularly in the later philosophy (1827-1854), directly and indirectly influenced the ideas of thinkers, like Feuerbach, Kierkegaard, Nietzsche, and Heidegger, who were critical of Hegel's claim to articulate a complete philosophical system.

The differences between Hegel and Schelling derive from their respective approaches to understanding the absolute. For Hegel the absolute is the result of the self-cancellation of the finite. It can therefore be presented in the form of the successive overcoming of finite determinations, the ‘negation of the negation’, in a system whose end comprehends its beginning. For Hegel the result becomes known when the beginning moves from being ‘in itself’ to being ‘for itself’ at the end of the system, thus in a process in which it reflects itself to itself. Schelling already becomes publicly critical of Hegel while working on a later version of the WA philosophy in Erlangen in the 1820s, but makes his criticisms fully public in lectures given in Munich in the 1830s, and in the 1840s and 1850s as professor in Berlin. The aim of the Idealist systems was for thought to reflect what it is not -- being -- as really itself, even as it appears not to be itself, thereby avoiding Kant's dualism. The issue between Schelling and Hegel is whether the grounding of reason by itself is not in fact a sort of philosophical narcissism, in which reason admires its reflection in being without being able fully to articulate its relationship to that reflection. Like Hegel, Schelling argues that it is not the particular manifestation of knowledge which tells me the truth about the world, but rather the necessity of moving from one piece of knowledge to the next. However, a logical reconstruction of the process of knowledge can, for Schelling, only be a reflection of thought by itself. The real process cannot be described in philosophy, because the cognitive ground of knowledge and the real ground, although they are inseparable from each other, cannot be shown to reflect each other.

Dieter Henrich characterises Hegel's conception of the absolute as follows: ‘The absolute is the finite to the extent to which the finite is nothing at all but negative relation to itself’. Hegel's system depends upon showing how each particular way of conceiving of the world has an internal contradiction. This necessarily leads thought to more comprehensive ways of grasping the world, until the point where there can be no more comprehensive way because there is no longer any contradiction to give rise to it. The very fact of the finite limitations of empirical thought therefore becomes what gives rise to the infinite, which, in Hegel's terms, is thought that is bounded by itself and by nothing else.

Schelling accepts such a conception, to which he substantially contributed in his early philosophy, as the way to construct a ‘negative’ system of philosophy, because it explains the logic of change, once there is a world to be explained. The conception does not, though, explain why there is a developing world at all, but merely reconstructs in thought the necessary structure of development on the basis of necessities in thought. Schelling's own attempt at explaining the world's ontological and historical facticity will lead him to a ‘philosophical theology’ which traces the development of mythology and then of Christian revelation in his Philosophy of Mythology and Philosophy of Revelation, which, like all his substantial works after 1811, are not published in his lifetime. The failure of his philosophical theology does not, though, necessarily invalidate his philosophical arguments against Hegel. His alternative to the ‘common mistake of every philosophy that has existed up to now’ -- the ‘merely logical relationship of God to the world’ (ibid.) -- Schelling terms ‘positive philosophy’. The ‘merely logical relationship’ entails a reflexivity, in which the world necessarily follows from the nature of God, and God and the world are therefore the ‘other of themselves’. Hegel's system tries to obviate the facticity of the world by understanding reason as the world's immanent self-articulation. Schelling, in contrast, insists that human reason cannot explain its own existence, and therefore cannot encompass itself and its other within a system of philosophy. We cannot, he maintains, make sense of the manifest world by beginning with reason, but must instead begin with the contingency of being and try to make sense of it with the reason which is only one aspect of it and which cannot be explained in terms of its being a reflection of the true nature of being.

Schelling contends that the identity of thought and being cannot be articulated within thought, because thought must presuppose that they are identical in a way which thought, as one side of a relation, cannot comprehend. By redefining the ‘concept’ in such a way that it is always already both subject and object, Hegel aims to avoid any presuppositions on either the subject or the object side, allowing the system to complete itself as the ‘self-determination of the concept’. Schelling presents the basic alternative as follows:

For either the concept would have to go first, and being would have to be the consequence of the concept, which would mean it was no longer absolute being; or the concept is the consequence of being, then we must begin with being without the concept.

Hegel attempts to merge concept and being by making being part of a structure of self-reflection, rather than the basis of the interrelation between subject and object. He invalidly assumes that ‘essence’, which is one side of the relationship between being and essence, can articulate its identity with the other side in the ‘concept’, because the other side is revealed as being ‘nothing’ until it has entered into a relationship which makes it determinate as a knowable moment of the whole process.

The problem which Hegel does not overcome is that this identity cannot be known, because, as Schelling claims of his concept of being, ‘existing is not here the consequence of the concept or of essence, but rather existence is here itself the concept and itself the essence’. The problem of reflection cannot be overcome in Hegel's manner: identifying one's reflection in a mirror as oneself (understood now as a metaphor for essence) entails, as we saw above, a prior non-reflexive moment if one is to know that the reflection is oneself, rather than a random reflected object. How far Schelling moves from any reflexive version of identity philosophy is evident in the following from the Introduction to the Philosophy of Revelation or Foundation of the Positive Philosophy of 1842-3:

our self-consciousness is not at all the consciousness of that nature which has passed through everything, it is precisely just our consciousness (...) for the consciousness of man is not = the consciousness of nature (...) Far from man and his activity making the world comprehensible, man himself is that which is most incomprehensible.

Schelling refuses to allow that reason can confirm its status via its reflection in being:

what we call the world, which is so completely contingent both as a whole and in its parts, cannot possibly be the impression of something which has arisen by the necessity of reason (...) it contains a preponderant mass of unreason.

Schelling is, then, one of the first philosophers seriously to begin the destruction of the model of metaphysics based on the idea of representation, a destruction which can be seen as one of the key aspects of modern philosophy from Heidegger to the later Wittgenstein and beyond. He is, at the same time, unlike some of his successors, committed to an account of human reason which does not assume that reason's incapacity to ground itself should lead to the Nietzschean abandonment of rationality. This is one of the respects in which Schelling has again become part of contemporary debate, where the need to seek means of legitimation which do not rely on the notion of a rationality inherent in the world remains a major challenge. Schelling's account of mind and world, particularly his insistence on the need not to limit our conception of nature to what is accessible to objectifying forms, is, in the light of the ecological crisis, proving to be more durable than his reception might until recently have suggested.


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Related Entries

Fichte, Johann Gottlieb | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Heidegger, Martin | Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich | Kant, Immanuel | Kierkegaard, Søren | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Nietzsche, Friedrich | Novalis [Georg Friedrich Philipp von Hardenberg] | Schleiermacher, Friedrich Daniel Ernst | Spinoza, Baruch