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Units and Levels of Selection

First published Mon Aug 22, 2005

The theory of evolution by natural selection is, perhaps, the crowning intellectual achievement of the biological sciences. There is, however, considerable debate about which entity or entities are selected and what it is that fits them for that role. This article aims to clarify what is at issue in these debates by identifying four distinct, though often confused, concerns and then identifying how the debates on what constitute the units of selection depend to a significant degree on which of these four questions a thinker regards as central.

1. Introduction

For over twenty years, some participants in the “units of selection” debates have argued that more than one issue is at stake. Richard Dawkins, for example, introduced “replicator” and “vehicle” to stand for different roles in the evolutionary process (1978; 1982a,b). He proceeded to argue that the units of selection debates should not be about vehicles, as it formerly had been, but about replicators. David Hull, in his influential article, “Individuality and selection” (1980) suggested that Dawkins' “replicator” subsumes two distinct functional roles, and broke them up into “replicator” and “interactor.” Robert Brandon, arguing that the force of Hull's distinction had been underappreciated, analyzed the units of selection controversies further, claiming that the question about interactors should more accurately be called the “levels of selection” debate to distinguish it from the dispute about replicators, which he allowed to keep the “units of debate” title (1982).[1]

The purpose of this article is to delineate further the various questions pursued under the rubric of “units and levels of selection.” These are questions addressed by a number of researchers, including Robert Brandon, Richard Dawkins, Peter Godfrey-Smith, James Griesemer, David Hull, Ben Kerr, Philip Kitcher, Richard Lewontin, John Maynard Smith, Sandra Mitchell, Samir Okasha, Elliott Sober, Kim Sterelny, Michael Wade, Ken Waters, George C. Williams, David S. Wilson, William Wimsatt, Sewall Wright, and many others. Four quite distinct questions will be isolated that have, in fact, been asked in the context of considering, what is a unit of selection? In section 2, these distinct questions are described. Section 3 returns to the sites of several very confusing, occasionally heated debates about “the” unit of selection. Several leading positions on the issues are analyzed utilizing the taxonomy of distinct questions.

This analysis is not meant to resolve any of the conflicts about which research questions are most worth pursuing; moreover, there is no attempt to decide which of the questions or combinations of questions discussed ought to be considered “the” units of selection question.

2. Four Basic Questions

Four basic questions can be delineated as distinct and separable. As will be demonstrated in section 3, these questions are often used in combination to represent the units of selection problem. But let us begin by clarifying terms (see Lloyd 1992, 2001).

The term replicator, originally introduced by Dawkins but since modified by Hull, is used to refer to any entity of which copies are made. Dawkins classifies replicators using two orthogonal distinctions. A “germ-line” replicator, as distinct from a “dead-end” replicator, is “the potential ancestor of an indefinitely long line of descendant replicators” (1982a, p. 46). For instance, DNA in a chicken's egg is a germ-line replicator, whereas that in a chicken's wing is a dead-end replicator. An “active” replicator is “a replicator that has some causal influence on its own probability of being propagated,” whereas a “passive” replicator is never transcribed and has no phenotypic expression whatsoever (1982a, p. 47). Dawkins is especially interested in active germ-line replicators, “since adaptations ‘for’ their preservation are expected to fill the world and to characterize living organisms” (1982a, p. 47).

Dawkins also introduced the term vehicle, which he defines as “any relatively discrete entity…which houses replicators, and which can be regarded as a machine programmed to preserve and propagate the replicators that ride inside it” (1982b, p. 295). According to Dawkins, most replicators' phenotypic effects are represented in vehicles, which are themselves the proximate targets of natural selection (1982a, p. 62).

Hull, in his introduction of the term interactor, observes that Dawkins' theory has replicators interacting with their environments in two distinct ways: they produce copies of themselves, and they influence their own survival and the survival of their copies through the production of secondary products that ultimately have phenotypic expression. Hull suggests interactor for the entities that function in this second process. An interactor denotes that entity which interacts, as a cohesive whole, directly with its environment in such a way that replication is differential—in other words, an entity on which selection acts directly (Hull 1980, p. 318). The process of evolution by natural selection is “a process in which the differential extinction and proliferation of interactors cause the differential perpetuation of the replicators that produced them” (Hull 1980, p. 318; see Brandon 1982, pp. 317-318)

Hull also introduced the concept of “evolvers,” which are the entities that evolve as a result of selection on interactors: these are usually what Hull calls lineages (Hull 1980). So far, no one has directly claimed that evolvers are units of selection. They can be seen, however, to be playing a role in considering the question of who owns an adaptation and who benefits from evolution by selection, which we will consider in Sections 2.3 and 2.4.

2.1 The Interactor Question

In its traditional guise, the interactor question is, what units are being actively selected in a process of natural selection? As such, this question is involved in the oldest forms of the units of selection debates (Darwin 1859 (1964), Haldane 1932, Wright 1945). In his classic review article, Lewontin's purpose was “to contrast the levels of selection, especially as regards their efficiency as causers of evolutionary change” (1970, p. 7). Similarly, Slobodkin and Rapaport assumed that a unit of selection is something that “responds to selective forces as a unit—whether or not this corresponds to a spatially localized deme, family, or population” (1974, p. 184).

Questions about interactors focus on the description of the selection process itself, that is, on the interaction between entity, that entity's traits and environment, and on how this interaction produces evolution; they do not focus on the outcome of this process (see Wade 1977; Vrba and Gould 1986). The interaction between some interactor at a certain level and its environment is assumed to be mediated by “traits” that affect the interactor's expected survival and reproductive success. Here, the interactor is possibly at any level of biological organization, including a group, a kin-group, an organism, a gamete, a chromosome, or a gene. Some portion of the expected fitness of the interactor is directly correlated with the value of the trait in question. The expected fitness of the interactor is commonly expressed in terms of genotypic fitness parameters, that is, in terms of the fitness of combinations of replicators; hence, interactor success is most often reflected in and counted through, replicator success. Several methods are available for expressing such a correlation between interactor trait and (genotypic or genic) fitness, including partial regression, variances, and covariances[2].

In fact, much of the interactor debate has been played out through the construction of mathematical genetic models—with the exception of Wade and some of Wilson and Colwell's work on female-biased sex ratios (see especially Griesemer and Wade 1988). The point of building such models is to determine what kinds of selection, operating at which levels, may be effective in producing evolutionary change.

It is widely held, for instance, that the conditions under which group selection can effect evolutionary change are quite stringent and rare. Typically, group selection is seen to require small group size, low migration rate, and extinction of entire demes.[3] Some modelers, however, disagree that these stringent conditions are necessary. Matesi and Jayakar, for example, show that in the evolution of altruism by group selection, very small groups may not be necessary (1976, p. 384; contra Maynard Smith 1964). Wade and McCauley also argue that small effective deme size is not a necessary prerequisite to the operation of group selection (1980, p. 811). Similarly, Boorman shows that strong extinction pressure on demes is not necessary (1978, p. 1909). And finally, Uyenoyama develops a group selection model that violates all three of the “necessary” condition usually cited (1979).

That different researchers reach such disparate conclusions about the efficacy of group selection is partly because they are using different models with different parameter values. Wade highlighted several assumptions, routinely used in group selection models, that biased the results of these models against the efficacy of group selection (1978). For example, he noted that many group selection models use a specific mechanism of migration; it is assumed that the migrating individuals mix completely, forming a “migrant pool” from which migrants are assigned to populations randomly. All populations are assumed to contribute migrants to a common pool from which colonists are drawn at random. Under this approach, which is used in all models of group selection prior to 1978, small sample size is needed to get a large genetic variance between populations (Wade 1978, p. 110; see discusssion in Okasha 2003).

If, in contrast, migration occurs by means of large populations, higher heritability of traits and a more representative sampling of the parent population will result. Each propagate is made up of individuals derived from a single population, and there is no mixing of colonists from the different populations during propagule formation. On the basis of Slatkin and Wade's analysis, much more between-population genetic variance can be maintained with the propagule model (1978, p. 3531). They conclude that, by using propagule pools as the assumption about colonization, one can greatly expand the set of parameter values for which group selection can be effective (Slatkin and Wade 1978, cf. Craig 1982).

Another aspect of this debate that has received a great deal of consideration concerns the mathematical tools necessary for identifying when a particular level of biological organization meets the criteria for being an interactor. Examples of suggested techniques within the philosophical community include Bandon's use of Salmon's notion of screening off, and the work by Wimsatt and Lloyd on the additivity approach (Wimsatt 1980, 1981; Lloyd [1988] 1994; see Sarkar 1994 and Godfrey-Smith 1992 for criticisms of this last approach, and Okasha 2004a for a partial defense of it). Biologists have also suggested a variety of statistical techniques for addressing this issue. See, for example, the work of Arnold and Fristrup, Heisler and Damuth, and Wade (Arnold and Fristrup 1982, Heisler and Damuth 1987, Damuth and Heisler 1988, and Wade 1985 respectively). Overall, while many of the suggested techniques have had strengths, no one approach to this aspect of the interactor question has been generally accepted and indeed it remains the subject of debate in biological circles (Okasha 2004b,c). Discussions of these issues within philosophy have been muted of late due to the influence of genic pluralism (see section 3.4) which regards the entire interactor debate as a mistake.

Note that the “interactor question” does not involve attributing adaptations or benefits to the interactors, or indeed, to any candidate unit of selection. Interaction at a particular level involves only the presence of a trait at that level with a special relation to genic or genotypic expected success that is not reducible to interactions at a lower level. A claim about interaction indicates only that there is an evolutionarily significant event occurring at the level in question; it says nothing about the existence of adaptations at that level. As we shall see, the most common error made in interpreting many of the interactor-based approaches is that the presence of an interactor at a level is taken to imply that the interactor is also a manifestor of an adaptation at that level.

2.2 The Replicator Question

The focus of discussions about replicators concerns just which organic entities actually meet the definition of replicator. Answering this question obviously turns on what one takes the definition of replicator to be. In this connection Hull's contribution turned out to be central. Starting from Dawkins' view, Hull refined and restricted the meaning of “replicator,” which he defined as “an entity that passes on its structure directly in replication” (Hull 1980, p.318). The terms replicator and interactor will be used in Hull's sense in the rest of this entry.

Hull's definition of replicator corresponds more closely than Dawkins' to a long-standing debate in genetics about how large or small a fragment of a genome ought to count as a replicating unit—something that is copied, and which can be treated separately in evolutionary theory (see especially Lewontin 1970). This debate revolves critically around the issue of linkage disequilibrium and led Lewontin, most prominently, to advocate the usage of parameters referring to the entire genome rather than to allele and genotypic frequencies in genetical models.[4] The basic point is that with much linkage disequilibrium, individual genes cannot be considered as replicators because they do not behave as separate units during reproduction. Although this debate remains pertinent to the choice of state space of genetical model, it has been eclipsed by concerns about interactors in evolutionary genetics.

This is not to suggest that the replicator question has been solved. Work on the replicator question is part of a rich and continuing research program; it is simply no longer a large part of the units debates. That this parting of ways took place is largely due to the fact that evolutionists and philosophers working on the units problems tacitly adopted Dawkins' suggestion that the replicator, whatever it turned out to be, be called the ‘gene’ (see Section 3.3). This move neatly removes the replicator question from consideration. Exactly why this move should have met with near universal acceptance is to some extent historical, however the fact that the intellectual tools (largely mathematical models) of the participants in the units debates were better suited to dealing with aspects of that debate other than the replicator question which requires mainly bio-chemical investigation, surely contributed to this outcome.

There is a very important class of exceptions to this general abandonment of the replicator question. Susan Oyama, Paul Griffiths, and Russell Gray have been leading thinkers in formulating a radical alternative to the interactor/replicator dichotomy known as Developmental Systems Theory (Oyama 1985; Griffiths and Gray 1994, 1997; Oyama, Griffiths, and Gray 2001). Here the evolving unit is understood to be the developing system as a whole, privileging neither the replicator nor the interactor.

James Griesemer has originated a profound reconception of the evolution by selection process, and has rejected the role of replicator as misconceived. He proposes in its place the role of "reproducer," which focuses on the material transference of genetic and other matter from generation to generation (Griesemer 2000a,b). The reproducer plays a central role, along with a hierarchy of interactors, in his much awaited book on the evolutionary process.

2.3 The Beneficiary Question

Who benefits from a process of evolution by selection? There are two predominant interpretations of this question: Who benefits ultimately in the long term, from the evolution by selection process? And who gets the benefit of possessing adaptations as a result of a selection process? Take the first of these, the issue of the ultimate beneficiary.

There are two obvious answers to this question—two different ways of characterizing the long-term survivors and beneficiaries of the evolution by selection process. One might say that the species or lineages (Hull's evolvers) are the ultimate beneficiaries of the evolutionary process. Alternatively, one might say that the lineages characterized on the genic level, that is, the surviving alleles, are the relevant long-term beneficiaries. I have not located any authors holding the first view, but, for Dawkins, the latter interpretation is the primary fact about evolution. To arrive at this conclusion, Dawkins adds the requirement of agency to the notion of beneficiary (see Hampe and Morgan 1988). For Dawkins, a beneficiary, by definition, does not simply passively accrue credit in the long term; it must function as the initiator of a causal pathway. Under this definition, the replicator is casually responsible for all of the various effects that arise further down the biochemical or phenotypic pathway, irrespective of which entities might reap the long-term rewards.

A second and quite distinct version of the beneficiary question involves the notion of adaptation. The evolution by selection process may be said to “benefit” a particular level of entity under selection, through producing adaptations at that level (Williams 1966, Maynard Smith 1976, Eldredge 1985, Vrba 1984). On this approach, the level of entity actively selected (the interactor) benefits from evolution by selection at that level through its acquisition of adaptations.

It is crucial to distinguish the question concerning the level at which adaptations evolve from the question about the identity of the ultimate beneficiaries of that selection process. One can think—and Dawkins does—that organisms have adaptations without thinking that organisms are the “ultimate beneficiaries” of the selection process.[5] This sense of “beneficiary” that concerns adaptations will be treated as a separate issue, discussed in the next section.

2.4 The Manifestor of Adaptation Question

At what level do adaptations occur? Or, as Sober puts this question, “When a population evolves by natural selection, what, if anything, is the entity that does the adapting?” (1984, p. 204).

As mentioned previously, the presence of adaptations at a given level of entity is sometimes taken to be a requirement for something to be a unit of selection.[6] Wright, in an absolutely crucial observation, distinguished group selection for “group advantage” from group selection per se (1980); in other words, he claimed that the combination of the interactor question with the question of what entity had adaptations had created a great deal of confusion in the units of selection debates in general.

Some, if not most, of this confusion is a result of a very important but neglected duality in the meaning of “adaptation” (in spite of useful discussions in Brandon 1978, Burian 1983, Krimbas 1984, Sober 1984). Sometimes “adaptation” is taken to signify any trait at all that is a direct result of a selection process at that level. In this view, any trait that arises directly from a selection process is claimed to be, by definition, an adaptation (e.g. Sober 1984; Brandon 1985, 1990; Arnold and Fristrup 1982). Sometimes, on the other hand, the term “adaptation” is reserved for traits that are “good for” their owners, that is, those that provide a “better fit” with the environment, and that intuitively satisfy some notion of “good engineering.”[7] These two meanings of adaptation, the selection-product and engineering definitions respectively, are distinct, and in some cases, incompatible.

Williams, in his extremely influential book, Adaptation and Natural Selection, advocated an engineering definition of adaptation (1966). He believed that it was possible to have evolutionary change result from direct selection favoring a trait without having to consider that changed trait as an adaptation. Consider, for example, his discussion of Waddington's (1956) genetic assimilation experiments. Williams interprets the results of Waddington's experiments in which latent genetic variability was made to express itself phenotypically because of an environmental pressure (1966, pp. 70-81; see the lucid discussion in Sober 1984, pp. 199-201). Williams considers the question of whether the bithorax condition (resulting from direct artificial selection on that trait) should be seen as an adaptive trait, and his answer is that it should not. Williams instead sees the bithorax condition as “a disruption…of development,” a failure of the organism to respond (1966, pp. 75-78). Hence, Williams drives a wedge between the notion of a trait that is a direct product of a selection process and a trait that fits his stronger engineering definition of an adaptation (see Gould and Lewontin 1979; Sober 1984, p. 201; cf. Dobzhansky 1956).[8]

In sum, when asking whether a given level of entity possesses adaptations, it is necessary to state not only the level of selection in question but also which notion of adaptation—either selection-product or engineering—is being used. This distinction between the two meanings of adaptation also turns out to be pivotal in the debates about the efficacy of higher levels of selection, as we will see in sections 3.1 and 3.2.

2.5 Summary

In this section, four distinct questions have been described that appear under the rubric of “the units of selection” problem, What is the interactor? What is the replicator? What is the beneficiary? And what entity manifests any adaptations resulting from evolution by selection? There is a serious ambiguity in the meaning of “adaptation”; which meaning is in play has had deep consequences for both the group selection debates and the species selection debates (Lloyd 2001). Commenting on this analysis, John Maynard Smith wrote in Evolution: “ [Lloyd 2001] argues, correctly I believe, that much of the confusion has arisen because the same terms have been used with different meanings by different authors. . . [but] I fear that the confusions she mentions will not easily be ended” (Maynard Smith 2001, p. 1497). In Section 3, this taxonomy of questions is used to sort out some of the most influential positions in four debates: group selection (3.1), species selection (3.2), genic selection (3.3), and genic pluralism (3.4).

3. An Anatomy of the Debates

3.1 Group Selection

George Williams' famous near-deathblow to group panselectionism was, oddly enough, about benefit. He was interested in cases in which there was selection among groups and the groups as a whole benefited from organism-level traits (including behaviors) that seemed disadvantageous to the organism. (Similarly for Maynard Smith 1964). Williams argued that the presence of a benefit to the group was not sufficient to establish the presence of group selection. He did this by showing that a group benefit was not necessarily a group adaptation. (Hence, Williams is here using the term benefit to signify the manifestation of an adaptation at the group level.) His assumption was that a genuine group selection process results in the evolution of a group-level trait—a real adaptation—that serves a design purpose for the group. The mere existence however, of traits that benefit the group is not enough to show that they are adaptations; in order to be an adaptation, under Williams' view, the trait must be an engineering adaptation that evolved by natural selection. Williams argued that group benefits do not, in general, exist because they benefit the group; that is, they do not have the appropriate causal history (see Brandon 1981, 1985, p. 81; Sober 1984, p. 262 ff.; Sober and Wilson 1998).

Implicit in Williams' discussion is the assumption that being a unit of selection at the group level requires two things: (1) having the group as an interactor, and (2) having a group-level engineering-type adaptation. That is, Williams combines two different questions, the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question, and calls this combined set the unit of selection question. These requirements for “group selection” make perfect sense given that Williams' prime target was Vero Wynne-Edwards, who promoted a view of group selection that incorporated this same two-pronged definition of a unit of selection.

This combined requirement of engineering group-level adaptation in addition to the existence of an interactor at the group level is a very popular version of the necessary conditions for being a unit of selection within the group selection debates. David Hull claims that the group selection issue hinges on “whether entities more inclusive than organisms exhibit adaptations” (1980, p. 325). John Cassidy states that the unit of selection is determined by “Who or what is best understood as the possessor and beneficiary of the trait” (1978, p. 582). Similarly, Eldredge requires adaptations for an entity to count as a unit of selection, as does Vrba (Eldredge 1985, p. 108; Vrba 1983, 1984).

Maynard Smith (1976) also ties the engineering notion of adaptation into the version of the units of selection question he would like to consider. In an argument separating group and kin selection, Maynard Smith concludes that group selection is favored by small group size, low migration rates, and rapid extinction of groups infected with a selfish allele and that “the ultimate test of the group selection hypothesis will be whether populations having these characteristics tend to show ‘self-sacrificing’ or ‘prudent’ behavior more commonly than those which do not” (1976, p. 282). This means that the presence of group selection or the effectiveness of group selection is to be measured by the existence of nonadaptive behavior on the part of individual organisms along with the presence of a corresponding group-level adaptation. Therefore, Maynard Smith does require a group-level adaptation from groups to count as units of selection. As with Williams, it is significant that he assumes the engineering notion of adaptation rather than the weaker selection-product notion. As Maynard Smith puts it, “an explanation in terms of group advantage should always be explicit, and always calls for some justification in terms of the frequency of group extinction” (1976, p. 278; cf. Wade 1978; Wright 1980).

In contrast to the preceding authors, Sewall Wright separated the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation questions in his group selection models (see Lewontin 1978; Gould and Lewontin 1979). Wright distinguishes between what he calls “intergroup selection,” that is, interdemic selection in his shifting balance process, and “group selection for group advantage” (1980, p. 840; see Wright 1929, 1931). He cites Haldane (1932) as the originator of the term “altruist” to denote a phenotype “that contributes to group advantage at the expense of disadvantage to itself” (1980, p. 840). Wright connects this debate to Wynne-Edwards, whom he characterizes as asserting the evolutionary importance of “group selection for group advantage.” He argues that Hamilton's kin selection model is “very different” from “group selection for the uniform advantage of a group”(1980, p. 841; like Arnold and Fristrup 1982; Damuth and Heisler 1988; Heisler and Damuth 1987). See Goodnight and Stevens (1997) for an excellent summary of the empirical and theoretical discoveries enabled by Wright-style group selection models.

Wright takes Maynard Smith, Williams and Dawkins to task for mistakenly thinking that because they have successfully criticized group selection for group advantage, they can conclude that “natural selection is practically wholly genic.” Wright argues, “none of them discussed group selection for organismic advantage to individuals, the dynamic factor in the shifting balance process, although this process, based on irreversible local peak-shifts is not fragile at all, in contrast with the fairly obvious fragility of group selection for group advantage, which they considered worthy of extensive discussion before rejection” (1980, p. 841).

This is a fair criticism of Maynard Smith, Williams, and Dawkins. According to Wright, the problem is that these authors failed to distinguish between two questions: the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question. Wright's interdemic group selection model involves groups only as interactors, not as manifestors of group-level adaptations. Further, he is interested only in the effect the groups have on organismic adaptedness and expected reproductive success. More recently, modelers following Sewall Wright's interest in structured populations have created a new set of genetical models that are also called “group selection” models and in which the questions of group adaptations and group benefit play little or no role.[9]

For a period spanning two decades, however, Maynard Smith, Williams, and Dawkins did not acknowledge that the position they attacked, namely Wynne-Edwards', is significantly different from other available approaches to group selection, such as Wright's, Wade's, Wilson's, Uyenoyama's or Lewontin's. Ultimately, however, both Williams and Maynard Smith recognized the significance of the distinction between the interactor question and the manifestor-of-an-adaptation question. In 1985, Williams wrote, “If some populations of species are doing better than others at persistence and reproduction, and if such differences are caused in part by genetic differences, this selection at the population level must play a role in the evolution of the species,” while concluding that group selection “is unimportant for the origin an maintenance of adaptation” (Williams 1985, pp. 7-8).

And in 1987, Maynard Smith made an extraordinary concession:

There has been some semantic confusion about the phrase “group selection,” for which I may be partly responsible. For me, the debate about levels of selection was initiated by Wynne-Edwards' book. He argued that there are group-level adaptations…which inform individuals of the size of the population so that they can adjust their breeding for the good of the population. He was clear that such adaptations could evolve only if populations were units of selection…. Perhaps unfortunately, he referred to the process as “group selection.” As a consequence, for me and for many others who engaged in this debate, the phrase cane to imply that groups were sufficiently isolated from one another reproductively to act as units of evolution, and not merely that selection acted on groups.

The importance of this debate lay in the fact that group-adaptationist thinking was at that time widespread among biologists. It was therefore important to establish that there is no reason to expect groups to evolve traits ensuring their own survival unless they are sufficiently isolated for like to beget like…. When Wilson (1975) introduced his trait-group model, I was for a long time bewildered by his wish to treat it as a case of group selection and doubly so by the fact that his original model…had interesting results only when the members of the group were genetically related, a process I had been calling kin selection for ten years. I think that these semantic difficulties are now largely over. (1987, p. 123).

Dawkins also seems to have rediscovered the evolutionary efficacy of higher-level selection processes in an article on artificial life. In this article, he is primarily concerned with modeling the course of selection processes, and he offers a species-level selection interpretation for an aggregate species-level trait (Dawkins 1989a). Still, he seems not to have recognized the connection between this evolutionary dynamic and the controversies surrounding group selection because in his second edition of The Selfish Gene (Dawkins 1989b) he had yet to accept the distinction made so clearly by Wright in 1980. This was in spite of the fact that by 1987, the importance of distinguishing between evolution by selection processes and any engineering adaptations produced by these processes had been acknowledged by the workers Dawkins claimed to be following most closely, Williams and Maynard Smith.

The most recent significant entry into these debates is Elliott Sober and David Sloan Wilson's Unto Others which they published in 1998. In this work Sober and Wilson develop a case for group selection based on the need to account for the existence of biological altruism. Biological altruism is any behaviour that benefits another organism at some cost to the actor. Such behavior must always reduce the actor's fitness but it may, as Sober and Wilson (following the work of Haldane and Wright) show, increase the fitness of certain groups within a structured population. While the biological modelling in Unto Others was not new, the book did bring the issues involved in the group selection debates to the attention of the larger philosophic community.

3.2 Species Selection

Ambiguities about the definition of a unit of selection have also snarled the debate about selection processes at the species level. The combining of the interactor question and the manifestor-of-adaptation question (in the engineering sense) led to the rejection of research aimed at considering the role of species as interactors, simpliciter, in evolution. Once it is understood that species-level interactors may or may not possess design-type adaptations, it becomes possible to distinguish two research questions: Do species function as interactors, playing an active and significant role in evolution by selection? And does the evolution of species-level interactors produce species-level engineering adaptations and, if so, how often?

For most of the history of the species selection debate, these questions have been lumped together; asking whether species could be units of selection meant asking whether they fulfilled both the interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation roles. For example, Vrba used Maynard Smith's treatment of the evolution of altruism as a touchstone in her definition of species selection (1984). Maynard Smith argued that kin selection could cause the spread of altruistic genes but that it should not be called group selection (1976). Again, this was because the groups were not considered to possess design-type adaptations themselves. Vrba agreed that the spread of altruism should not be considered a case of group selection because “there is no group adaptation involved; altruism is not emergent at the group level” (1984, p. 319; Maynard Smith gives different reasons for his rejection). This amounts to assuming that there must be group benefit in the sense of a design-type group-level adaptation in order to say that group selection can occur. Vrba's view was that evolution by selection is not happening at a given level unless there is a benefit or engineering adaptation at that level. She explicitly equates units of selection with the existence of an interactor plus adaptation at that level (1983, p. 388); furthermore, it seems that she has adopted the stronger engineering definition of adaptation.

Eldredge also argues that species selection does not happen unless there are species-level adaptations (1985, pp. 196, 134). Eldredge rejects certain cases as higher-level selection processes overall because “frequencies of the properties of lower-level individuals which are part of a high-level individual simply do not make convincing higher-level adaptations” (1985, p. 133).

Vrba, Eldredge, and Gould all defined a unit of selection as requiring an emergent, adaptive property (Vrba 1983, 1984; Vrba and Eldredge 1984; Vrba and Gould 1986). This amounts to asking a combination of the interactor and manifestor of adaptation questions.

But consider the lineage-wide trait of variability. Treating species as interactors has a long tradition (Dobzhansky 1956, Thoday 1953, Lewontin 1958). If species are conceived as interactors (and not necessarily manifestors-of-adaptations), then the notion of species selection is not vulnerable to Williams' original antigroup-selection objections>[10]. The old idea was that lineages with certain properties of being able to respond to environmental stresses would be selected for, that the trait of variability itself would be selected for, and that it would spread in the population of populations. In other words, lineages were treated as interactors. The earlier researchers spoke loosely of adaptations where adaptations were treated in the weak sense as equivalent simply to the outcome of selection processes (at any level). They were explicitly not concerned with the effect of species selection on organismic level traits but with the effect on species-level characters such as speciation rates, lineage-level survival, and extinction rates of species. Lloyd and Gould argue that this sort of case represents a perfectly good form of species selection even though some balk at the thought that variability would then be considered, under a weak definition, a species-level adaptation (Lloyd and Gould 1993, Lloyd [1988] 1994).

Vrba also eventually recognized the advantages of keeping the interactor question separate from a requirement for an engineering-type adaptation. In her more recent review article, she has dropped her former requirement that, in order for species to be units of selection, they must possess species-level adaptations (1989). Ultimately, her current definition of species selection is in conformity with a simple interactor interpretation of a unit of selection (cf. Damuth and Heisler 1988; Lloyd [1988] 1994).

It is easy to see how the two-pronged definition of a unit of selection—as interactor and manifestor-of-adaptation—held sway for so long in the species selection debates. After all, it dominated much of the group selection debates until just recently. Some of the confusion and conflict over higher-level units of selection arose because of an historical contingency—Wynne-Edwards' implicit definition of a unit of selection and the responses it provoked.

3.3 Genic Selection: The Originators

One may understandably think that Dawkins is interested in the replicator question because he claims that the unit of selection ought to be the replicator. This would be a mistake. Dawkins is interested primarily in a specific ontological issue about benefit. He is asking a special version of the beneficiary question, and his answer to that question dictates his answers to the other three questions flying under the rubric of the "units of selection".

Briefly, Dawkins argues that because replicators are the only entities that “survive” the evolutionary process, they must be the beneficiaries. What happens in the process of evolution by natural selection happens for their sake, for their benefit. Hence, interactors interact for the replicators' benefit, and adaptations belong to the replicators. Replicators are the only entities with real agency as initiators of causal chains that lead to the phenotypes; hence, they accrue the credit and are the real units of selection.

Dawkins' version of the units of selection question amounts to a combination of the beneficiary question plus the manifestor-of-adaptation question. There is little evidence that he thinks he is answering the predominant interactor question; rather, he argues that people who focus on interactors are laboring under a misunderstanding of evolutionary theory. One reason he thinks this might be that he takes as his opponents those who hold a combination of the interactor plus manifestor-of-adaptations definition of a unit of selection (e.g., Wynne-Edwards). Unfortunately, Dawkins ignores those who are pursuing the interactor question alone; these researchers are not vulnerable to the criticisms he poses against the combined interactor-adaptation view. Section 3.4 addresses those who interpret themselves as arguing against the interactor question itself.

In the next few paragraphs, two aspects of Dawkins' own version of the units of selection problem shall be characterized. I will attempt to clarify the key issues of interest to Dawkins and to relate these to the issues of interest to others.

Dawkins believes that interactors, which he calls “vehicles,” are not relevant to the units of selection problem. The real units of selection, he argues, should be replicators, “the units that actually survive or fail to survive” (1982b, pp. 113-116). Organisms or groups as “vehicles” may be seen as the unit of function in the selection process, but they should not, he argues, be seen as the units of selection because the characteristics they acquire are not passed on (1982b, p.99). Here, he is following Williams' line. Genotypes have limited lives and fail to reproduce themselves because they are destroyed in every generation by meiosis and recombination in sexually reproducing species; they are only temporary (Williams 1966, p. 109). Hence, genes are the only units that survive in the selection process. The gene (replicator) is the real unit because it is an “indivisible fragment,” it is “potentially immortal” (Williams 1966, pp. 23-4; Dawkins 1982b, p. 97).

The issue, for Dawkins, is “Whether, when we talk about a unit of selection, we ought to mean a vehicle at all, or a replicator” (1982b, p. 82). He clearly distinguishes the dispute he would like to generate from the group-versus-organismic selection controversy, which he characterizes as a disagreement “about the rival claims of two suggested kinds of vehicles" (1982b, p. 82). In his view, replicator selection should be seen as an alternative framework for both organismic and group selection models.

There are two mistakes that Dawkins is not making. First, he does not deny that interactors are involved in the evolutionary process. He emphasizes that it is not necessary, under his view, to believe that replicators are directly “visible” to selection forces (1982b, p. 176). Dawkins has recognized from the beginning that his question is completely distinct from the interactor question. He remarks, in fact, that the debate about group versus organismic selection is “a factual dispute about the level at which selection is most effective in nature,” whereas his own point is “about what we ought to mean when we talk about a unit of selection” (1982a, p. 46). He also states that genes or other replicators do not “literally face the cutting edge of natural selection. It is their phenotypic effects that are the proximal subjects of selection” (1982a, p. 47). We shall return to this issue in Section 3.4.

Second, Dawkins does not specify how large a chunk of the genome he will allow as a replicator; there is no commitment to the notion that single genes are the only possible replicators. He argues that if Lewontin, Franklin, Slatkin and others are right, his view will not be affected (see Section 2.2). If linkage disequilibrium is very strong, then the “effective replicator will be a very large chunk of DNA” (Dawkins 1982b, p. 89). We can conclude from this that Dawkins is not interested in the replicator question at all; his claim here is that his framework can accommodate any of its possible answers.

On what basis, then, does Dawkins reject the question about interactors? I think the answer lies in the particular question in which he is most interested, namely, What is “the nature of the entity for whose benefit adaptations may be said to exist?”[11]

On the face of it, it is certainly conceivable that one might identify the beneficiary of the adaptations as—in some cases, anyway—the individual organism or group that exhibits the phenotypic trait taken to be the adaptation. In fact, Williams seems to have done just that in his discussion of group selection.[12] But Dawkins rejects this move, introducing an additional qualification to be fulfilled by a unit of selection; it must be “the unit that actually survives or fails to survive” (1982a, p. 60). Because organisms, groups, and even genomes are destroyed during selection and reproduction, the answer to the survival question must be the replicator. (Strictly speaking, this is false; it is copies of the replicators that survive. He therefore must mean replicators in some sense of information and not as biological entities (see Hampe and Morgan 1988; cf. Griesemer in press).

But there is still a problem. Although Dawkins concludes, “there should be no controversy over replicators versus vehicles. Replicator survival and vehicle selection are two aspects of the same process” (1982a, p. 60), he does not just leave the vehicle selection debate alone. Instead, he argues that we do not need the concept of discrete vehicles at all. This is what we shall investigate in Section 3.4.

The important point for now is that, on Dawkins' analysis, the fact that replicators are the only survivors of the evolution-by-selection process automatically answers also the question of who owns the adaptations. He claims that adaptations must be seen as being designed for the good of the active-gene-line replicator for the simple reason that replicators are the only entities around long enough to enjoy them over the course of natural selection. He acknowledges that the phenotype is “the all important instrument of replicator preservation,” and that genes' phenotypic effects are organized into organisms (that thereby might benefit from them in their lifetimes) (1982b, p. 114). But because only the active germ-line replicators survive, they are the true locus of adaptations (1982b, p. 113; emphasis added). The other things that benefit over the short term (e.g., organisms with adaptive traits) are merely the tools of the real survivors, the real owners. Hence, Dawkins rejects the vehicle approach partly because he identifies it with the manifestor of adaptation approach, which he has answered by definition, in terms of the long-term beneficiary.

The second key aspect of Dawkins' views on interactors is that he seems to want to do away with them entirely. Dawkins is aware that the vehicle concept is “fundamental to the predominant orthodox approach to natural selection” (1982b, p. 116). Nevertheless, he rejects this approach in The Extended Phenotype, claiming, “the main purpose of this book is to draw attention to the weaknesses of the whole vehicle concept” (1982b, p. 115). But his “vehicle” approach is not equivalent to "the interactor question"; it encompasses a much more restricted approach.

In particular, when Dawkins argues against “the vehicle concept,” he is only arguing against the desirability of seeing the individual organism as the one and only possible vehicle. His target is explicitly those who hold what he calls the “Central Theorem,” which says that individual organisms should be seen as maximizing their own inclusive fitness (1982b, pp. 5, 55). Dawkins' arguments are indeed damaging to the Central theorem, but they are ineffective against other approaches that define units of selection as interactors.

One way to interpret the Central Theorem is that it implies that the individual organism is always the beneficiary of any selection process. Dawkins seems to mean by “beneficiary” both the manifestor of adaptation and that which survives to reap the rewards of the evolutionary process. He argues, rightly and persuasively, I think, that it does not make sense always to consider the individual organism to be the beneficiary of a selection process.

But it is crucial to see that Dawkins is not arguing against the importance of the interactor question in general, but rather against a particular definition of a unit of selection. The view he is criticizing assumes that the individual organism is the interactor, and the beneficiary, and the manifestor of adaptation. Consider his main argument against the utility of considering vehicles: the primary reason to abandon thinking about vehicles is that it confuses people (1982b, p. 189). But look at his examples; their point is that it is inappropriate always to ask how an organism's behavior benefits that organism's inclusive fitness. We should ask instead, says Dawkins, “whose inclusive fitness the behavior is benefiting” (1982b, p. 80). He states that his purpose in the book is to show that “theoretical dangers attend the assumption that adaptations are for the good of…the individual organism” (1982b, p. 91).

So, Dawkins is quite clear about what he means by the “vehicle selection approach”; it always assumes that the organism is the beneficiary of its accrued inclusive fitness. Dawkins advances powerful arguments against the assumption that the organism is always the interactor cum beneficiary cum manifestor of adaptations. This approach is clearly not equivalent to the approach to units of selection characterized as the interactor approach. Unfortunately, Dawkins extends his conclusions to these other approaches, which he has, in fact, not addressed. Dawkins' lack of consideration of the interactor definition of a unit of selection leads to two grave problems with his views.

One problem is that he has a tendency to interpret all group selectionist claims as being about beneficiaries and manifestors of adaptations as well as interactors. This is a serious misreading of authors who are pursuing the interactor question alone.

Consider, for example, Dawkins' argument that groups should not be considered units of selection:

To the extent that active germ-line replicators benefit from the survival of the group of individuals in which they sit, over and above the [effects of individual traits and altruism], we may expect to see adaptations for the preservation of the group. But all these adaptations will exist, fundamentally, through differential replicator survival. The basic beneficiary of any adaptation is the active germ-line replicator (1982b, p. 85).

Notice that Dawkins begins by admitting that groups can function as interactors, and even that group selection may effectively produce group-level adaptations. The argument that groups should not be considered real units of selection amounts to the claim that the groups are not the ultimate beneficiaries. To counteract the intuition that the groups do, of course, benefit, in some sense, from the adaptations, Dawkins uses the terms “fundamentally” and “basic,” thus signaling what he considers the most important level. Even if a group-level trait is affecting a change in gene frequencies, “it is still genes that are regarded as the replicators which actually survive (or fail to survive) as a consequence of the (vehicle) selection process” (1982b, p. 115). Thus, the replicator is the unit of selection, because it is the beneficiary, and the real owner of all adaptations that exist.

Saying all this does not, however, address the fact that other researchers investigating group selection are asking the interactor question and sometimes also the manifestor of adaptation question, rather than Dawkins' special version of the (ultimate) beneficiary question. He gives no additional reason to reject these other questions as legitimate; he simply reasserts the superiority of his own preferred unit of selection. In sum, Dawkins has identified three criteria as necessary for something to be a unit of selection: it must be a replicator; it must be the most basic beneficiary of the selection process; and it is automatically the ultimate manifestor of adaptation through being the beneficiary.

In the next section, we will consider some relatively more recent work in which genic selectionism is defended through a pluralist approach to modeling. What matters in the final analysis, though, is exactly what matters to Dawkins, and that is the search for the ultimate beneficiary of the evolution by selection process.

3.4 Genic Selection: The Pluralists

As we saw in the previous section, Dawkins had particular problems with his treatment of the interactor. While he admitted that the “vehicle” was necessary for the selection process, he did not want to accord it any weight in the units of selection debate because it was not the beneficiary, but rather an agent of the beneficiary. Starting with Ken Waters' work in 1986, though, there emerged a new angle available to genic selectionists. The line of argument was pursued by Sterelny and Kitcher (1988), by Waters (1991), and by Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters (1990). While there are substantive differences between their views, especially about scientific realism, the discussion will be restricted here to what they have to say narrowly about genic selectionism and genic pluralism.

The new "genic pluralism," as Sterelny and Kitcher call it, appears to let one bypass the interactor question, by, in effect, turning genes into interactors.

Kim Sterelny and Philip Kitcher proposed in 1988 that there are two “images” of natural selection, one in which selection accounts are given in terms of a hierarchy of entities and their traits' environments, the other of which is given in terms of genes having properties that affect their abilities to leave copies of themselves (see Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters 1990, Sterelny 1996a,b). Waters (1986, 1991) made similar claims. They all argue that something significant follows from the fact that hierarchical models or selection processes can be reformulated in terms of the genic level.[13]

The big payoff of the genic point of view, according to Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters, is: “Once the possibility of many, equally adequate, representations of evolutionary processes has been recognized, philosophers and biologists can turn their attention to more serious projects than that of quibbling about the real unit of selection.” (1990, p. 161).

By “quibbling about the real unit of selection,” here, they seem to be referring to the large range of articles in which evolutionists have tried to give concrete evidence and requirements for something to serve as an interactor in a selection process.

As an aside, it is important to note that neither Sterelny, Kitcher, nor Waters is advocating genic selectionism to the exclusion of other views. What interests them is a proposed equivalence between being able to tell the selection story one way, in terms of interactors and replicators, and to tell the same story another way, purely in terms of “genic agency”. Thus, they are pluralists, in that they are not ultimately arguing in favor of the genic view; they are, however, expanding the genic selectionist view beyond its previous limits.

The pluralists attack the view that “for any selection process, there is a uniquely correct identification of the operative selective forces and the level at which each impinges” (Waters 1991, p. 553). Rather, they claim, “We believe that asking about the real unit of selection is an exercise in muddled metaphysics” (Kitcher et al. 1990, p 159). The basic view is that “the causes of one and the same selection process can be correctly described at different levels” (including the genic one) (Waters 1991, p.555). Moreover, these descriptions are on equal ontological footing.[14]

The pluralists seem to be arguing against the utility of the notion of the interactor in studying the selection process. Echoing Dawkins, their idea is that the whole causal story can be told at the level of genes, and that no higher level entities need be proposed or considered in order to have an accurate and complete explanation of the selection process. But, arguably, the genic level story cannot be told without taking the functional role of interactors into account, and thus the pluralists cannot avoid quibbling about interactors, as they claim (see Lloyd 2005a).

Let us recall what the interactor question in the units of selection debate amounts to: What levels of entities interact with their environments through their traits in such a way that it makes a difference to replicator success? As mentioned before, there has been much discussion in the literature about how to delineate and locate interactors among multilayered processes of selection. Each of these suggestions leads to slightly different results and different problems and limitations, but each also takes the notion of the interactor seriously as a necessary component to understanding a selection process.

The genic pluralists state that “All selective episodes (or, perhaps, almost all) can be interpreted in terms of genic selection. That is an important fact about natural selection” (Kitcher, Sterelny and Waters 1990, p. 160). Thus, the functional claim of the pluralists is that anything that a hierarchical selection model can do, a genic selection model can do just as well. Much attention is paid to showing that the two types of models can represent certain patterns of selection equally well, even those that are conventionally considered hierarchical selection. This is argued for using both specific examples and schema for translating hierarchical models into genic ones. Let us consider one challenging case here.

Take the classic account of the efficacy of interdemic or group selection, the case that even G.C. Williams acknowledged was hierarchical selection. Lewontin and Dunn (Lewontin and Dunn 1960, and Lewontin 1962), in investigating the house mouse, found first, that there was segregation distortion, in that over 80% of the sperm from mice heterozygous for the t-allele also carried the t-allele, whereas the expected rate would be 50%. They also found that male homozygotes (those with two t-alleles) tended to be sterile (in several populations they were lethal, but in the populations in question, they were sterile.) They also found a substantial effect of group extinction based on the fact that female mice would often find themselves in groups in which all males were sterile, and the group itself would therefore go extinct. This, then, is how a genuine and empirically robust hierarchical model was developed.

What the pluralists want to note about this case is very narrow, that is “whether there are real examples of processes that can be modeled as group selection can be asked and answered entirely within the genic point of view.” (Kitcher et al. 1990, p. 160). Just as a warning to the unwary, the key to understanding the genic reinterpretation of this case is to grasp that the pluralists use a concept of genetic environment that their critics ignore.

Waters tells how to “construct” a genic model of the causes responsible for the frequency of the t-allele. He writes that we must first distinguish “genetic environments that are contained within female mice that are trapped in small populations with only sterile males from genetic environments that are not contained within such females. In effect, the interactions at the group level would be built in as a part of one kind of genetic environment.” (1991, p. 563). In other words, various very detailed environments would have to be specified for various different t-alleles and wild-type alleles. In order to determine the invariant fitness parameter of a specific allele, let's call it 'A' for example, we would need to know what kind of environment it is in at the allelic level, e.g., whether it is paired with a t-allele. Then we would need to know a further detailed layer of the environment of 'A', such as what the sex is of the “environment” it is in. If it is in a t-allele arrangement, and it is also in a male environment, the allelic fitness of 'A' would be changed. Finally, we need to know the type of subpopulation or deme the 'A' allele is in. Is it in a small deme with many t-alleles? Then it is more likely to become extinct. So, as we can see, various aspects of the allele's environment are built up from the gene out, depending on what would make a difference to the gene's fitness in that very particular kind of environment. If you want to know the overall fitness of the 'A' allele, you add up the fitnesses in each set of specialized, detailed environments and weight them according to the frequency of that environment.

Waters writes, “What appears as a multiple level selection process (e.g., selection of the t-allele) to those who draw the conceptual divide [between environments] at the traditional level, appears to genic selectionists of Williams's style as several selection processes being carried out at the same level within different genetic environments” (1991, p. 571). The “same level” here means the “genic level,” while the genetic environments include everything from the other allele at the locus, to whether the genotype is present in a male or female mouse, to the size and composition of the the deme the mouse is in. This completes the sketch of the genic pluralist position. We now turn to its reception.

Genic pluralism's impact has been largely philosophic rather than biological (but see Shanahan 1997 and Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999). Within philosophy, the view has been widely disseminated and taught, and a steady stream of critical responses to the genic pluralist position has been forthcoming. These responses fall into two main categories: pragmatic and causal.

The pragmatic response to genic pluralism simply notes that in any given selective scenario the genic perspective provides no information that is not also available from the hierarchical point of view. This state of affairs is taken by critics of this type as sufficient reason to prefer whichever perspective is most useful for solving the problems facing a particular researcher. Examples of this approach include Glymour, Van der Steen and, to some extent, Shanahan (Glymour 1999, Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999, and Shanahan 1997). The weakness of this approach as a critique of genic pluralism is that it does not so much criticize genic pluralism as simply ignore it.

The other major form of critique of genic pluralism is based on arguments concerning the causal structure of selective episodes. The idea here is that while genic pluralism gets the “genetic book-keeping” (i.e., the input/output relations) correct, it does not accurately reflect the causal processes that bring about the result in question. This line of argument was first broached by William Wimsatt (1980, 1981). Examples of this approach used against the genic pluralists include Sober 1990, Sober and Wilson 1994 and Sober and Wilson 1998, all of which also appeal to aspects of the manifestor of adaptations and beneficiary questions to establish the failure of genic pluralism to represent certain selective events correctly. Causal concerns are also raised in the work of Shanahan, Van der Steen, Stanford and Glennan (Shanahan 1997, Van der Steen and Van den Berg 1999, Stanford 2001, and Glennan 2002), though without the focus on other units questions. The weakness of this line of criticism is its inability to isolate a notion of cause that is both plausible and plausibly true of hierarchical but not genic level models. This feature—that the genic and hierarchical models are so similar as to be indistinguishable—which appears as an insurmoutable problem in the context of debates about differing causal structure, turns out to be the locus of the most recent critical response to genic pluralism, which denies that the genic selectionists have any distinct and coherent genic level causes at all (Lloyd 2005a).

Genic pluralism presents alleles as independent causal entities, with the claim that the availability of such models makes hierarchical selection models—and the ensuing debates about how to identify interactors in selection processes—moot. Or, in a less contentious version of the argument, from Waters (1991), the hierarchical and genic models are fully developed causal alternatives. However in each case of the causal allelic models, these models are directly and completely derived from precisely the hierarchical models the authors reject. Moreover, causal claims made on behalf of alleles are utterly dependent on hierarchically identified and established interactors as causes, thus undermining their claims that the units of selection (interactor) debates are mere “quibbles” and are irrelevant to the representation of selection processes.

To say that the allelic level models are completely derivative from higher level models of selection processes, Lloyd 2005a uses the following guidelines. Two models that are mathematically equivalent may be semantically different, that is, they have different interpretations. Such models can be independent from one another or be one derivative from the other. In the genic selection case, the pluralists appear to be claiming that the genic level models are independent from the hierarchical models. The claim is: although the genic models are mathematically equivalent, they have different parameters, and a different interpretation, and they are completely independent from hierarchical models.

But, despite the pluralists' repeated claims, we can see from their own calculations and examples that theirs are derivative models, and thus, that their “genic” level causes are derivative from and dependent on higher level causes. Their genic level models depend for their empirical, causal, and explanatory adequacy on entire mathematical structures taken from the hierarchical models and refashioned.

As reviewed above, one example from their own writing comes from Waters' treatment of the t-allele case, a universally recognized case of three levels of selection operating simultaneously on a single allele. Waters actually offers, right before the t-allele case, a suggestion that a Williams's type analysis could be based on an application of Lloyd's additivity criterion for identifying interactors, which is strictly hierarchical (Waters 1991, p. 563; Lloyd [1988] 1994, Ch. 5). Thus, Waters is suggesting borrowing a method for identifying potential higher-level interactors in order to determine the genic environments and thus to have more adequate genic level models. Similarly, Sterelny and Kitcher resort to a traditional approach to identifying interactors in order to make their genic models work. Robert Brandon proposed that the statistical idea of screening off be used to identify which levels of entities are causally effective in the selection process; i.e., it is a method used to isolate interactors. But Sterelny and Kitcher propose using screening off to identify layers of allelic environments (1988, p. 354).

Hence, Sterelny, Kitcher, and Waters all use the same methods for isolating relevant genic-level environments as others do for the traditional isolating of interactors. What, we may ask, is the real difference? Both can be seen as attempting to get the causal influences on selection right, because they are using the same methods. What is different is that the genic selectionists want to tell the causal story in terms of genes and not in terms of interactors and genes. Moreover--and perversely, given where they've gotten all their information from--they propose doing away with interactors altogether. Are we to think that renaming changes the metaphysics of the situation?

It seems that levels of interaction important to the outcome of the selection process are being discovered in the usual ways, i.e., by using approaches to interactors and their environments, and that that exact same information is being translated into talk of the differentiated and layered environments of the genes. But what is the pluralists' justification for helping themselves to the hierarchical information and using the tools and methods that were developed exclusively in the hierarchical context?

There is a standard response to this challenge, and it is winningly put by Waters:

It is not as if the diploid model owns the information above the alleles and the genic model owns the information below the diploid genotype (Waters 2005, p. 321, emphasis added).

One consideration here is the priority of actual discovery. When a factor--for example, a level of interactor--has been discovered to have an influence on the outcome of a selective process, via the application of a hierarchical model or method, it seems only reasonable to say that the hierarchical approach should be credited with that discovery. If the model is later translated into a genic model, and the genic advocates then complain that the hierarchalists don't own the higher-level information. . . in a sense that's true, but here they seem to be insensitive to the empirical side of the biology. It is an historical fact that the investigators of the sickle cell gene used a diploid model and not a genic one (Taliaferro and Huck 1923; Neel 1947). It is an historical fact that the discoverers of the full multi-level selection regime of the t-allele used a gametic model, a diploid model, and a demic model, not a genic one (Lewontin and Dunn 1960; Lewontin 1962). It is therefore an historical fact that the genic versions of these models are derivative.

But pluralist philosophers argue that it is irrelevant which model or method was involved in producing the actual higher-level information. What is important, according to these philosophers, is that it is possible to describe causality differently in the two different sorts of model, genic and hierarchical, and that both of these sorts of model draw on multiple levels of information. But, as mentioned above, there is no independent genic causality; it's completely derivative (see Lloyd 2005a for additional arguments).

Not only do genic selectionists not have any methods for detecting higher-level interaction, they have a long history of methodological dogmatism opposing the very existence of such methods. Suppose we were genic selectionists or pluralists unaware of higher-level interactions and their impact on evolutionary outcomes. Using the genic approach, how would we obtain such information? Famously, George Williams in 1966 advocated a rule of thumb for answering this question: Do not look for higher-level information at all unless the genic level has been proven to be empirically inadequate. Equally famously, the vast majority of evolutionists took this recommendation as a dogmatic law (see Lloyd [1988] 1994, pp. 95, 121-122). Thus, it was the hierarchical selectionists--and only the hierarchical selectionists--who successfully formulated the methods for seeking out and documenting the higher-level interactions that were involved in evolutionary dynamics involving kin groups, demes, etc. (Lloyd 2005a,b; Goodnight and Stevens 1997; Okasha 2004b).

In contrast, Waters proposes that “genic selectionists learn that a genic environment needs to be partitioned in a model if there are different selective pressures on the allele type in different spaces of the genic environment” (Waters 2005, p. 322). In other words, he needs to partition the environment just in case partitioning the environment makes a difference to gene fitness. Again, how will a genic theorist know this?

Waters claims that the genic selectionists are not just capable of representing truthfully, but also seeking out such higher-level interactions. But has he given any reasons for thinking that this is so? Is there any evidence to support this claim? Is there an example of genic selectionists successfully establishing a higher-level causal force where hierarchical selectionists missed it? No, no, and no.

It might appear to be the pluralists' hidden assumption in this argument that philosophy of science is not concerned with the empirical value of actual scientific theories, but only with their metaphysical implications. In other words, they seem unconcerned about which approach has yielded the crucial information required to advance the field. But surely they do not wish to return us to pre-Kuhnian days, wherein we sanitize our pure metaphysical questions about units of selection from details of the actual practice and history of the science. Given that the genic model construction and metaphysical conclusions are inextricably bound together in the arguments as the pluralists have formulated them, they are not free to slice off metaphysical questions as they wish.

In sum, “ownership” of the higher-level information does not rest on simple historical priority, although that is clear. Rather, methodologically, the hierarchical views have developed approaches and methods for seeking out higher-level information, and have been very effective at finding it, while the genic approaches have no such methods, making them epistemically and methodologically inferior. Moreover, they have a history of methodological dogmatism opposing the very existence of such methods. Furthermore, neither Sterelny, Kitcher, nor Waters has given any reason to believe that genic models hold any promise of grounding practices designed to obtain such information, without simply borrowing the methods already developed from hierarchical models, as they have done before. Finally, all of this is highly relevant because philosophical evaluation of the merits of the genic and hierarchical approaches--which all of the pluralists claim to be engaged in--demands consideration of their methodological and epistemological value, not only of their causal or metaphysical standing.

Let us summarize the consequences of derivativeness in terms of the science and metaphysics of the processes discussed. First, the genic pluralists end up offering not, as they claim, a variety of genuinely diverse causal versions of the selection process at different levels. This is because the causes of the hierarchical models, however determined, are simply transformed and renamed in the lower level models, but remain fully intact as relevant causes at the full range of higher and lower levels. More importantly, no new allelic causes are introduced. Second, while genic models may be derived from hierarchical models, they fail to sustain the necessary supporting methodology. Thus, they are methodologically and epistemically inferior. Third, the lack of genuine alternative causal accounts destroys the claims of pluralism or, at least, of any interesting philosophical variety, since there are no genuine alternatives being presented, unless you count renaming model structures as metaphysically significant[15].

This last point is especially confusing in the genic pluralists presentations, because they repeatedly rely on an assumption or intuition that, given an allelic state space, we are dealing with allelic causes. This last assumption is easily traced back to Williams' and Dawkins' views that alleles are the ultimate beneficiaries of any long term selection process; thus, the genic pluralist argument rests substantially on a view regarding the superior importance of the beneficiary question, which has been clearly delineated from the interactor question, above.

4. Conclusion

It makes no sense to treat different answers as competitors if they are answering different questions. We have reviewed a framework of four questions with which the debates appearing under the rubric of “units of selection” can be classified and clarified. Dawkins, Hull, and Brandon separated the classic question about the level of selection or interaction (the interactor question) from the issue of how large a chunk of the genome functions as a replicating unit (the replicator question). The interactor question should also be separated from the question of which entity should be seen as acquiring adaptations as a result of the selection process (the manifestor of adaptation question). In addition, there is a crucial ambiguity in the meaning of adaptation that is routinely ignored in these debates: adaptation as a selection product and adaptation as an engineering design. Finally, we can distinguish the issue of the entity that ultimately benefits from the selection process (the beneficiary question) from the other three questions.

This set of distinctions has been used to analyze leading points of view about the units of selection and to clarify precisely the question or combination of questions with which each of the protagonists is concerned. There are many points in the debates in which misunderstandings may be avoided by a precise characterization of which of the units of selection questions is being addressed.


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altruism: biological | biology: philosophy of | evolution | gene | genetics: evolutionary | natural selection | replication