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Set Theory: Constructive and Intuitionistic ZF

First published Fri Feb 20, 2009

Constructive and intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theories are axiomatic theories of sets in the style of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory (ZF) which are based on intuitionistic logic. They were introduced in the 1970's and constitute a foundation for mathematics based on intuitionistic logic (see the entry on constructive mathematics). They are formulated on the standard first order language of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory and make no direct use of inherently constructive ideas. In working in constructive and intuitionistic ZF we can thus to some extent rely on our familiarity with ZF and its heuristics.

Notwithstanding the similarities with classical set theory, the concepts of set defined by constructive and intuitionistic set theories differ considerably from that of the classical tradition; they also differ from each other. The techniques utilised to work within them, as well as to obtain metamathematical results about them, also diverge in some respects from the classical tradition because of their commitment to intuitionistic logic. In fact, as is common in intuitionistic settings, a plethora of semantic and proof-theoretic methods are available for the study of constructive and intuitionistic set theories.

In the following we introduce the main features of intuitionistic and constructive set theories and explain how they differ. As the field has grown considerably in recent years, we can discuss only some of the known results and available techniques. We shall focus on constructive set theory as we should like to highlight important foundational issues that arise within it.

1. The Essence of Constructive and Intuitionistic Set Theory

Constructive and intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theories are based on intuitionistic rather than classical logic. They arise as a foundation for mathematics based on intuitionistic logic. For constructive ZF, the main focus has been to represent the mathematical practice of Bishop (Bishop 1967, Bishop and Bridges 1985).

For the basic concepts and the driving ideas of intuitionistic logic, constructive mathematics and intuitionism, the reader may wish to consult the following entries:

For classical set theory, the entry on set theory.

Constructive and intuitionistic ZF are based on the same first-order language as classical ZF set theory, thus taking advantage of the simplicity of the set-theoretic language and of our familiarity with it. As with Bishop-style constructive mathematics, they are compatible with the classical tradition in the sense that all of their theorems are classically true. In fact, the two formal systems that we shall consider, Constructive Zermelo-Fraenkel (CZF) and Intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel (IZF), give rise to full classical ZF by the simple addition of the principle of the excluded middle.

1.1 Axiomatic freedom

Classical Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory is based on classical first-order predicate logic with equality. On top of the logical principles are axioms and schemata which describe the notion of set the theory codifies. These principles can be classified into three kinds. First, there are principles that enable us to form new sets from given ones. For example, the axiom of pair allows us to form a set which is the pair of two given sets. Secondly, there are principles that establish properties of the sets. For example, the axiom of extensionality identifies all sets having the same elements. Third, and finally, there are axioms asserting the existence of specific sets. Thus the axiom of infinity states that there is an infinite set. These principles all together are called the set-theoretic principles.

When introducing versions of ZF based on intuitionistic logic, the first step is to eliminate from the logic the principle of the excluded middle. The next step is to choose a good stock of set-theoretic principles which faithfully represent the desired notion of constructive set. This task turns out to be far more challenging than one at first might have expected. In fact, as is well known, systems based on a weaker logic have the ability to distinguish between principles which are equivalent from the point of view of a stronger logic. In the case of set theory, some of the ZF principles are often presented by one of many classically equivalent formulations. Classically it is only a matter of convenience which one to use at a specific time. When working on the basis of intuitionistic logic, however, various formulations of a classical axiom may turn out to be distinct (non-equivalent). One can even envisage new statements which are classically equivalent to the axiom but intuitionistically separate from it. In the case of versions of ZF based on intuitionistic logic, the principles of replacement, separation, powerset and foundation have attracted most attention. For the exact formulation of these principles see the supplementary document:

Axioms of CZF and IZF.

The following is a typical scenario. The classical proof of equivalence of two forms of a single set-theoretic principle requires, at some point, an instance of the excluded middle. Therefore, this proof of equivalence will not be valid when working within an intuitionistic context. Consequently, these two forms of one principle may result in two distinct principles, and choosing one rather than the other of them may influence the notion of set we thus define.

In the specific case of the axiom of foundation, however, the situation is more complex. We need extra care in choosing an appropriate statement for foundation because its standard formulation yields instances of the excluded middle (on the basis of minimal set-theoretic assumptions). Foundation is introduced to rule out sets which are members of themselves and thus ∈-chains of sets. The usual formulation of foundation asserts that each inhabited set (a set with at least one element) has a least element with respect to the membership relation. This statement can be shown to yield instances of excluded middle and thus has to be omitted from a set theory based on intuitionistic logic. For a proof, see the supplementary document:

Set-theoretic principles incompatible with intuitionistic logic.

The typical move then is to replace foundation with the classically equivalent schema of set induction, which does not have the same “side effects” but has similar consequences.[1]

Unlike foundation, principles such as powerset and separation present no incompatibility with intuitionistic logic, but different formulations of them may affect the strength of the whole theory in different ways. These principles may in fact introduce forms of impredicativity within the set theory (see the section on Predicativity in constructive set theory). The case of replacement versus collection is somehow more complex (see for example the articles (Friedman and Scedrov 1985) and (Rathjen 2005)).

To conclude, in formulating a set theory based on intuitionistic logic, the first task is to expel the principle of excluded middle, including those instances of it which might be hidden in familiar set-theoretic axioms. The next task is to choose one version of each classical principle which best characterises the desired notion of set. It should be stressed that from a constructive point of view this plurality of options (and thus systems), rather than causing uneasiness, is a highly desirable situation as it constitutes a form of “axiomatic freedom”. We can also say that it allows one to choose the notions and theory which best suit a given context. As one could expect, this freedom has a price, as a highly technical study of the axiomatic theories might be necessary to distinguish their principles as well as to unveil some of their subtleties. This again can be seen as an advantage, since it forces us to a deeper and clearer analysis of mathematical notions and prompts us to develop new sophisticated tools.

1.2 Constructive versus intuitionistic set theory

Although there are many possible systems of sets based on intuitionistic logic, we can distinguish two main trends within the literature. According to the first one, we take all of what is available in classical ZF set theory and only modify those principles, such as foundation, which have a clear incompatibility with intuitionistic logic. This gives rise to set theories such as Intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel, IZF, a variant of which was introduced as early as in (Friedman 1973a). (See Beeson 1985, Chapters 8 and 9 and Scedrov 1985 for two surveys on IZF.) The rationale behind these theories appears to be that of granting the mathematician the most powerful tools possible, as long as compatibility with intuitionistic logic is preserved. In the second approach, we also introduce restrictions on the set-theoretic principles admitted, as far as the resulting system complies with mathematical practice. Theories of this second kind can thus be seen as the outcome of a double process of restriction with respect to classical ZF. First there is a restriction to intuitionistic logic, then a restriction is imposed on the set-theoretic constructions allowed. The latter is motivated by the desire to adhere to a form of predicativity (see the next section for a clarification of this notion of predicativity). Paradigmatic examples of the latter kind of systems are Myhill's Constructive Set Theory (Myhill 1975), Friedman's system B (Friedman 1977) and Aczel's Constructive Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory CZF (Aczel 1978; 1982; 1986, Aczel and Rathjen 2001). We can also say that in this second approach the foundational predisposition influences the practice to a higher degree.

In the following we shall make use of the convention according to which the adjective “intuitionistic” refers to those set theories, such as IZF, which are impredicative, while “constructive” refers to set theories, such as CZF, which comply with a form of predicativity. It should be noted, however, that this convention is often not in place in the literature. In fact, the adjective “constructive” has also been used to denote impredicative theories, and “intuitionistic” often refers to predicative foundational theories such as Martin-Löf type theory (Martin-Löf 1975; 1984). It is also worth noting that the present convention on the use of the words “constructive” and “intuitionistic” differs from that made in the context of constructive mathematics (see for example the entry on constructive mathematics and also Bridges and Richman 1987).

1.3 Predicativity in constructive set theory

In this entry we shall not address the subject of predicativity in detail, for which the reader may wish to consult (Feferman 2005). Other references include, for example, the section on predicativism in the entry on philosophy of mathematics and the entry on paradoxes and contemporary logic. We need however to explain what we mean by predicativity in the present context.

Predicativism has its origins in the writings of Poincaré and Russell, who responded to the paradoxes that were discovered in Cantor's and Frege's set theories in the early 20th century. Weyl also made fundamental contributions to the study of predicativism. According to one notion, a definition is impredicative if it defines an object by reference to a totality which includes the object to be defined. With his Vicious Circle Principle (VCP), Russell intended to eliminate the circularity in mathematics that arises from such impredicative definitions. We recall here one of the formulations of the VCP:

Whatever contains an apparent variable must not be a possible value of that variable (Russell 1908, in van Heijenoort 1967, 163).

Poincaré, Russell and Weyl's foundational analysis of predicativity has paved the way for a variety of logical analyses of the notion. The most commonly accepted analysis is due to Feferman and Schütte (independently) following lines indicated by Kreisel (Kreisel 1958, Feferman 1964 and Schütte 1965, 1965a). Here proof theory has played a pivotal role. The idea was to single out a collection of theories (a transfinite progression of systems of ramified second order arithmetic indexed by ordinals) by means of which to characterise a certain notion of predicative ordinal. Feferman and Schütte's proof theoretic analysis of these theories has identified an ordinal (usually referred to as Γ0) which is the least non-predicative ordinal according to this notion. Then a formal system is considered as predicatively justifiable if it is proof-theoretically reducible to a system of ramified second order arthmetic indexed by an ordinal less then Γ0. (See Feferman 2005 for a more accurate informal account of this notion of predicativity and for further references).

For constructive foundational theories a more “liberal” approach to predicativism has been suggested, starting from work in the late 1950's of Lorenzen, Myhill and Wang (see e.g. Lorenzen and Myhill 1959). The driving idea is that so-called inductive definitions ought to be allowed in the realm of constructive mathematics. The intuitive justification of inductive definitions is related to the fact that they can be expressed by means of finite rules, in a “bottom-up” way. The proof-theoretic strength of theories of inductive definitions goes well beyond Feferman and Schütte's bound (Buchholz, Feferman, Pohlers and Sieg 1981). Thus relatively strong theories are considered predicative in today's foundations of constructive mathematics. This more liberal notion of predicativity has often been termed generalised predicativity. We shall reserve the term predicative for generalised predicativity, and call strictly predicative a theory conforming with Feferman and Schütte's criteria.[2]

1.3.1 The universe of sets

The shift from classical to intuitionistic logic, as well as the requirement of predicativity, reflects a conflict between the classical and the constructive view of the universe of sets. This also relates to the time-honoured distinction between actual and potential infinity. According to one view often associated to classical set theory, our mathematical activity can be seen as a gradual disclosure of properties of the universe of sets, whose existence is independent of us. This tenet is bound up with the assumed validity of classical logic on that universe. Brouwer abandoned classical logic and embarked on an ambitious programme to renovate the whole mathematical landscape. He denounced that classical logic had wrongly been extrapolated from the mathematics of finite sets, had been made independent from mathematics, and illicitly applied to infinite totalities.

In a constructive context, where the rejection of classical logic meets the requirement of predicativity, the universe is an open concept, a universe “in fieri”. This coheres with the constructive rejection of actual infinity (Dummett 2000, Fletcher 2007). Intuitionism stressed the dependency of mathematical objects on the thinking subject. Following this line of thought, predicativity appears as a natural and fundamental component of the constructive view. If we construct mathematical objects, then resorting to impredicative definitions would produce an undesirable form of circularity. We can thus view the universe of constructive sets as built up in stages by our own mathematical activity and thus open-ended.

In set theories based on intuitionistic logic, predicativity is usually expressed by restricting the axioms of separation and powerset, as these appear to be the main sources of impredicativity (when the infinity axiom is assumed). We also notice that two related components of predicativity come into play in the restrictions on separation and powerset. On the one side there is an attempt to avoid the circularity implied by defining an object by reference to itself (Russell's VCP); on the other side there is our supposed inability to survey the whole universe of sets.

1.3.2 Restrictions on Powerset

The powerset axiom allows us to form a set of all subsets of a given set. A typical example of impredicative use of powerset is given by the definition of a new set Y as the intersection of all subsets of a given set, say B, which satisfy a certain property. That is, one uses powerset in conjunction with separation to form a set Y = ∩{D ∈ Pow(B) : φ(D)}. A form of impredicativity may arise here if Y itself satisfies the formula φ and is thus among the sets which are needed to define it.

A fundamental objection to powerset has been raised by Myhill in (Myhill 1975). From a constructive point of view, powerset is seen as problematic because “we have no idea of what an arbitrary subset of an infinite set is; there is no way of generating them all and so we have no way to form the set of all of them ” (Myhill 1975, 354). Myhill also writes:

Power set seems especially nonconstructive and impredicative compared with the other axioms: it does not involve, as the others do, putting together or taking apart sets that one has already constructed but rather selecting out of the totality of all sets those that stand in the relation of inclusion to a given set. (Myhill 1975, 351).

Myhill's crucial observation was that powerset is not needed for constructive mathematics Bishop-style, as it can be replaced by one of its consequences. This is often called Myhill's exponentiation axiom and states that we can form a set of all functions from one given set to another. This axiom is clearly equivalent to powerset in a classical context, where subsets of a given set may be represented by characteristic functions. In the absence of the principle of excluded middle, however, powerset and exponentiation are not equivalent. Myhill justifies exponentiation by noting that a function is a rule, a finite object which can actually be given (contrary to infinite sets). He also writes that the case of powerset is different from that of exponentiation as:

even in the case of infinite sets A and B we do have an idea of an arbitrary mapping from A into B. An arbitrary mapping from Z into Z is a partial recursive function together with a proof that the computation always terminates; a similar account can be given of an arbitrary real function. There is no corresponding axplanation of “arbitrary subset”. (Myhill 1975, 354).

Myhill's exponentiation axiom (in fact, a strengthening of it in the case of CZF) is now part of all major systems of constructive set theory. A form of exponentiation can also be found in constructive type theory.

1.3.3 Restrictions on Separation

The schema of separation allows us to form a subset of a given set whose elements satisfy a given property expressed by a formula in the language of set theory. Given a set B and a formula φ(X), separation allows us to construct a new set informally represented as: {XB : φ(X)}. This schema may lead to impredicativity in case the formula φ contains unbounded quantifiers ranging over the whole universe of sets. Unrestricted separation seems in this case to require our ability to survey the whole universe of sets and check if a given property holds of each set. Another way to look at the impredicativity of separation is to note that in defining a new set we may need to refer to this very set, contradicting Russell's VCP. For example, if we define a set C by separation as {XB : ∀Y ψ(X,Y)}, then C is among the Y's that need to be checked for the property ψ. The impredicativity of the separation schema is dealt with by requiring that quantifiers in the formula range only over previously constructed sets. Syntactically, this means that all quantifiers in the formula are bounded (that is, they occur only in contexts ∀X (XY → ...) and ∃X(XY ∧ ...)).

Having introduced appropriate constraints to powerset and separation, we could now face a substantial objection. Constructive and intuitionistic set theories can be seen as modifications of classical ZF set theory that are obtained by: (1) replacing classical with intuitionistic logic, then (2) accurately choosing, among various classically equivalent principles, those which seem more appropriate to represent a certain mathematical practice. The resulting notion of set, however, might become obscure and the choice of the set-theoretic principles might appear as arbitrary. In the case of intuitionistic ZF, one can justify the choice of the set-theoretic principles by examining its semantical interpretations, as Heyting semantics, or by looking at its categorical models. In the case of constructive set theory, to hinder this kind of objection, Aczel has given an interpretation of CZF in a version of Martin-Löf type theory (Aczel 1978). The claim is then that a clear constructive meaning is thus assigned to CZF's notion of set by looking at its meaning in Martin-Löf type theory, whose constructiveness is presupposed.

2. Origins of Constructive and Intuitionistic Set Theories

Intuitionistic versions of Zermelo-Fraenkel set theories were introduced in the early 1970s by Friedman and Myhill. In (Friedman 1973) the author presents a study of formal properties of various intuitionistic systems and introduces for them an extension of Kleene's realisability method. The realisability technique is applied in (Myhill 1973) to show the existence property for a version of intuitionistic Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory (with replacement in place of collection). In another fundamental contribution Friedman extends the double negation translation of intuitonistic logic to relate classical and intuitionistic set theories (Friedman 1973a). One could thus say that the first appearance of systems of intuitionistic set theory is rather technical in nature. These first papers already clarify a key feature of intuitionistic set theory, mainly that it is amenable to non-classical semantic interpretations and enjoys properties which are typical of the constructive approach.

Constructive set theory from the very start has a more distinctive foundational vocation and it is bound up with Bishop's mathematics. In fact, in 1967 Bishop published the book “Foundations of constructive analysis” (Bishop 1967), which opened up a new era for mathematics based on intuitionistic logic (see the entry on constructive mathematics). The monograph stimulated fresh attempts in the logical community to clarify and formally represent the principles which were used by Bishop, though only at an informal level. First attempts by Goodman and Myhill (Goodman and Myhill 1972) made use of versions of Gödel's system T (see also (Bishop 1970) for a similar attempt). Myhill came though to the conclusion that the resulting formalisation was too complex and artificial (Myhill 1975, 347). Myhill proposed instead a system which is closer to the informal notion of set originally utilised by Bishop and also closer to the set-theoretic tradition. Myhill writes (1975, 347):

We refuse to believe that things have to be this complicated - the argumentation of (Bishop 1967) looks very smooth and seems to fall directly from a certain concpet of what sets, functions, etc. are, and we wish to discover a formalism which isolates the principles underlying this conception in the same way that Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory isolates the principles underlying classical (nonconstructive) mathematics. We want these principles to be such as to make the process of formalization completely trivial, as it is in the classical case.

Myhill appears to have been the first to notice that the full strength of powerset is not needed for the actual development of the mathematics in Bishop's book. We observe here that Myhill's constructive set theory had distinguished notions of function, natural number and set; it thus closely represented a constructive tradition in which functions and natural numbers are conceptually independent from sets. Another fundamental step in the development of constructive set theory has been Friedman's “Set-theoretical foundations for constructive analysis” (Friedman 1977). Here, among other systems, a system called B is defined which has further restrictions on the set-theoretic principles compared with Myhill's (in particular, it has no set induction). System B is there shown to be expressive enough to represent the constructive mathematical practice of Bishop whilst being at the same time proof-theoretically very weak (due to the absence of set induction). System B is in fact a conservative extension of arithmetic (thus it is well below the limit of strict predicativity). Myhill and Friedman's systems were subsequently modified by Aczel, to obtain a system, CZF (Constructive Zermelo-Fraenkel), that is fully compatible with the ZF language (Aczel 1978, 1982, 1986; Aczel and Rathjen 2001). Aczel also gave an interpretation of CZF in Martin-Löf type theory with the aim of corroborating the constructive nature of the set theory. He also strengthened some principles (namely, collection and exponentiation) of Myhill's system on the ground that the stronger versions are practically useful and are validated by the interpretation in type theory.

It should be mentioned that other foundational systems for Bishop-style constructive mathematics were introduced in the early 1970's. For example: explicit mathematics by S. Feferman (Feferman 1975), and the already mentioned Intuitionistic Type Theory (Martin-Löf 1975; 1984). Constructive type theory is usually considered the most satisfactory foundation for constructive mathematics Bishop-style. Both formalisms can be seen as making more explicit the computational content of constructive mathematics.

The aim of recovering the computational content of mathematics, lost by the widespread application of classical logic to infinite domains, drives Bishop and his followers. Constructive and intuitionistic set theories share this objective, but they display their computational content only indirectly through their semantic interpretations (see e.g. (Lipton 1995) and the section on Semantic techniques).

3. The Axioms Systems CZF and IZF

For a reader who is already familiar with ZF set theory, we now briefly recall the axioms of the systems CZF and IZF. For a full list and an explanation of their axioms we refer instead to the supplementary document:

Axioms of CZF and IZF.

CZF and IZF are formulated on the basis of intuitionistic first-order logic with equality, having only ∈ (membership) as an additional non-logical binary predicate symbol. Their set-theoretic axioms are as follows.


Extensionality (same)
Pair (same)
Union (same)
Infinity (same)
Separation Restricted Separation
Collection Strong Collection
Powerset Subset Collection
Set Induction (same)

Note that in IZF the schema of separation is unrestricted. For CZF, Collection is strengthened to compensate for restricted separation. Subset collection is a strengthening of Myhill's exponentiation axiom, thus substituting for ZF's Powerset.

4. Constructive Choice Principles

One usually considers ZFC (the axiom system ZF plus the axiom of choice) as a foundation for mathematics (see the entry on set theory). The axiom of choice (AC) has been often considered the most controversial principle of set theory. In constructive contexts one witnesses a peculiar phenomenon. The usual form of the axiom of choice is validated by intensional theories of types such as Martin-Löf type theory, where the Curry-Howard correspondence holds.[3] On the other hand, the assumption of the axiom of choice gives rise to instances of the excluded middle in extensional contexts, where a form of separation is also available. This is the case for constructive and intuitionistic ZF. (For the proof, see the supplementary document on Set-theoretic principles incompatible with intuitionistic logic.)

The incompatibility of AC with extensional set theories based on intuitionistic logic seems to have been first noticed by Diaconescu in the context of categorical models of intuitionistic set theory (Diaconescu 1975). Goodman and Myhill give an argument for set theories based on intuitionistic logic (Goodman and Myhill 1978). (The reader may also wish to see the discussion on choice principles in the entry on constructive mathematics.)

Although the axiom of choice is incompatible with both constructive and intuitionistic ZF, other choice principles may be added to the basic systems without producing the same undesirable results. For example one could add the principle of countable choice (AC0) or that of dependent choice (DC), which are often employed in the constructive mathematical practice. (For their exact formulation see the supplementary document on Axioms of CZF and IZF.)

Aczel also considered a choice principle called the Presentation Axiom (Aczel 1978). This principle asserts that every set is the surjective image of a so-called base. A base is a set, say B, such that every relation with domain B extends a function with domain B. In other terms presentation states that for each set A we can find another set B which is a base and such that each element of A can be “represented” by an element of B. Intuitively, a base should represent the concept of a “well presented set”, one for which membership of an element in the set is witnessed by a proof. In this context, countable choice can be seen as saying that the natural numbers form a base.

The compatibility of all these forms of choice with constructive set theory has been proved by Aczel; his proof proceeds by extending his interpretation of CZF in Martin-Löf type theory (Aczel 1982). Rathjen has also considered various constructive choice principles and their mutual relations (Rathjen 2006).

A final remark: although constructive and intuitionistic set theories are compatible with the principles of choice just mentioned, the set theories are usually defined without any choice principle. This has the aim of allowing for a “pluralistic” foundational approach. In particular, one would like to obtain a foundational theory compatible with those contexts (e.g. categorical models of set theory) in which even these weaker principles of choice may not be validated. For similar ideas in the context of constructive type theory, see (Maietti and Sambin 2005). We wish also to mention here Richman's recent appeal for a constructive mathematics which makes no use of choice principles (Richman 2000, 2001).

5. Proof Theory and Semantics of Constructive and Intuitionistic ZF

When considering a certain mathematical practice (or a theory used to codify it) from a philosophical perspective, we should like to clarify with the greatest possible precision the assumptions which are made within it as well as the consequences which arise from those assumptions. This is particularly true when working with theories which are based on a weaker logic than the classical one, for which a deeper, more precise insight is mandatory. Many technical tools are available which can help us clarify those aspects. Among the available instruments, there are proof-theoretic techniques, such as proof-theoretic interpretations, as well as semantic techniques, such as realisability, Kripke models, Heyting-valued semantics. In fact, in the literature one often witnesses the interplay of proof-theoretic and semantic techniques. We here give a simplified look into some of these topics and suggest further reading.

5.1 Proof-theoretic strength

When moving from classical ZF to its intuitionistic variants, the choice of the set-theoretic axioms can considerably affect the proof-theoretic strength of the resulting theory. For the notion of proof-theoretic strength and for recent surveys on proof theory see for example (Rathjen 1999, 2006b). We here only note that investigations on the proof-theoretic strength of a theory are rich and informative. For example, a proof-theoretic analysis may contribute to establish if a certain theory complies with a given mathematical framework (e.g., predicativity, finitism, etc.). Further, as a by-product of the proof-theoretic analysis we sometimes obtain simple independence proofs. In fact, we can show that a theory cannot prove a specific principle because adding it to the theory would increase the theory's proof-theoretic strength. Proof-theoretic interpretations have also been employed to compare constructive set theory with other foundational systems for constructive mathematics, such as constructive type theory and explicit mathematics (see e.g. Tupailo 2003).

Although CZF and IZF are the most widely studied systems, numerous other systems for constructive and intuitionistic set theory have been considered in the literature so far. Their proof-theoretic strength has been established by various tools, e.g., an extension to set theory of the double negation interpretation (Friedman 1973a) and a series of proof-theoretic interpretations between theories (Griffor and Rathjen 1994). Some of the systems analysed are as weak as arithmetic, as for example Friedman's system B (Friedman 1977); other systems are as strong as full classical ZF, as IZF (Friedman 1973a). There are also systems of intermediate strength, as CZF. The strength of the latter theory, in fact, equals that of a theory of one inductive definition known as ID1 (Buchholz, Feferman, Pohlers and Sieg 1981). The fact that CZF has the same strength as ID1 confirms the generalised predicativity of the set theory, while it shows that it exceeds the limit of strict predicativity.

As a final remark: while the strength of CZF is well below that of second-order arithmetic, the simple addition of excluded middle to CZF gives us (full) ZF. This should be contrasted with IZF, which already has the strength of ZF (Friedman 1973a). The limited proof theoretic strength of CZF compared with IZF has often been considered one of the main advantages of constructive over intuitionistic set theory. Interestingly, when some large set axioms have been added to constructive set theory, a similar pattern has emerged, as the strength of the resulting theory is well below that of the corresponding classical theory.

5.2 Large sets in constructive and intuitionistic ZF

A prominent area of research in classical set theory is that of large cardinals (see the entry on set theory). In constructive contexts, the ordinals are not linearly ordered. (For the notion of constructive ordinal and a brief discussion of its properties, see the supplementary document on: set-theoretic principles incompatible with intuitionistic logic.) As a consequence, cardinal numbers do not play the same role as in the classical setting.

One can nonetheless study the impact of “reflection principles” of the form of large set axioms. The addition of large set axioms to intuitionistic ZF was first proposed by Friedman and Scedrov (Friedman and Scedrov 1984). One of the aims of this program is to shed light on the corresponding classical notions; another is to study the impact of these principles on metatheoretical properties of the original set theories. Friedman and Scedrov have shown, for example, that the addition of large set axioms does not compromise the validity of the disjunction and numerical existence properties for IZF.

In the context of constructive set theory, large sets have been introduced by Aczel in the form of so-called regular sets to allow inductive definitions of sets (Aczel 1986). Rathjen and Crosilla have considered inaccessible sets (Rathjen al. 1998; Crosilla and Rathjen 2001) and Mahlo sets (Rathjen 2003a). Nevertheless, an objection could be raised to extensions of constructive set theory by large set axioms. In classical set theory, large cardinals can be seen as an incarnation of higher infinity. How do we justify these principles constructively? The constructive justification of these notions relies again on the type theoretic interpretation. The addition of these principles corresponds in fact to that of universes and W-types in constructive type theory. The justification of extensions by large sets is thus bound up with the question of the limits of foundational systems for constructive mathematics (e.g. Rathjen 2005). We also note that in the case of inaccessible set axioms, their addition to a subsystem of CZF with no set induction produces a theory of strength Γ0, the ordinal singled out by Feferman and Schütte as the limit of strict predicativity (Crosilla and Rathjen 2001; see also section 1.3). Thus by working in a constructive, predicative context, traditionally strong set-theoretic notions might become predicatively justifiable.

5.3 Metamathematical properties of constructive and intuitionistic ZF and semantic techniques

A variety of interpretations for intuitionistic logic have been extended to intuitionistic and constructive set theories, such as realisability, Kripke models and Heyting-valued semantics. All these techniques have been applied to obtain metamathematical results about the set theories.

5.3.1 Metamathematical properties of constructive and intuitionistic ZF

Some intuitionistic set theories satisfy certain “hallmark” metamathematical features, such as the disjunction and the existence properties. They can also be shown to be consistent with principles which go beyond our usual perception of constructiveness. Among these are for example Church Thesis and Markov's principle. For a description of these principles in the context of intuitionistic logic, the reader may wish to consult sections 4.2 and 5.2 of the entry on intuitionistic logic or Troelstra and van Dalen's Constructivism in Mathematics (Troelstra and van Dalen 1988).

We here recall the disjunction and existence property, formulated for a set theory T. In the following ω denotes the set of von Neumann natural numbers (for simplicity we do not distinguish each natural number n from the n-th element of ω).

A theory T has the disjunction property (DP) if whenever T proves (φ ∨ ψ) for sentences φ and ψ of T, then T proves φ or T proves ψ.

The existence property has two distinct versions in the context of set theory: the numerical existence property (NEP) and the existence property (EP). Let θ(x) be a formula with at most x free. We say that:

(1) T has the NEP if whenever T proves ∃x ∈ ω θ(x), then, for some natural number n, T proves θ(n).

(2) T has the EP if whenever T proves ∃xθ(x), then there is a formula φ(x) with exactly x free, so that T proves ∃!x(φ(x) ∧ θ(x)).

In the case of constructive and intuitionistic ZF, the study of the disjunction and existence properties has required advanced tools. For a survey on results in intuitionistic set theory see (Beeson 1985, Chapter IX). For the corresponding developments in CZF, see (Rathjen 2005b).

5.3.2 Realisability

Realisability has been the main tool in the research surrounding set theories based on intuitionistic logic, starting from the early contributions by Friedman and Myhill (Friedman 1973, Myhill 1973). Realisability semantics for intuitionistic arithmetic were first proposed by Kleene (Kleene 1945) and extended to higher order Heyting arithmetic by Kreisel and Troelstra (Kreisel and Troelstra 1970). For the definition of realisability for arithmetic see also section 5.2 of the entry on intuitionistic logic. The main task in extending realisability to set theory is to give a good definition of the atomic cases and to appropriately specify the quantifier clauses. Different routes have been taken. Concerning the quantifier clauses, the approach most followed appears to be that by Kreisel and Troelstra, where the realizing numbers “go through” the quantifiers (Beeson 1985; Rathjen 2005b). A realisability similar to Kreisel and Troelstra was applied to intuitionistic set theory by Friedman (Friedman 1973). Myhill introduced a variant of this realisability which resembles Kleene's slash (Myhill 1973; Kleene 1962, 1963). He thus proved that a version of IZF with replacement in place of collection (called IZFRep) has the DP, the NEP and the EP. These results were further extended (Myhill 1975; Friedman and Scedrov 1983). While Friedman and Myhill gave realisability models for extensional set theories, Beeson developed a notion of realisability for non-extensional set theories. He obtained metatheoretical results for the extensional set theories via an interpretation in their non-extensional counterparts. He thus proved that IZF (with collection) has the DP and NEP (see Beeson 1985). Subsequently McCarty introduced realisability for IZF directly for extensional set theory (McCarty 1984; 1986). Realisability semantics for variants of CZF have been considered (Crosilla and Rathjen 2001; Rathjen 2006a). The realisability in the latter article is inspired by McCarty's and has the important feature that, as McCarty's for IZF, it is a self-validating semantics for CZF (that is, this notion of realisability can be formalised in CZF and each theorem of CZF is realised provably in CZF).

5.3.3 Kripke models and Heyting-valued semantics

Kripke models for intuitionistic set theories (Friedman and Scedrov 1985) have been used to show that IZF does not have the EP (combining this with the results in (Myhill 1973) shows that IZFRep does not prove IZF). Kripke models have more recently been applied by Lubarsky to show that Myhill's exponentiation does not imply Aczel's subset collection (Lubarsky 2005).

Heyting-valued semantics for intuitionistic set theories were obtained by Grayson (Grayson 1979) as a counterpart for Boolean models for classical set theory. They have found application to independence results (Scedrov 1981; 1982). A constructive treatment has been recently given (Gambino 2006).

5.3.4 Categorical models of constructive and intuitionistic set theory

Categorical models of constructive and intuitionistic set theories have flourished over the years. The notions of topos and sheaf play an essential role here (see e.g. Fourman 1980 and Fourman and Scott 1980). For an overview of the main concepts, see the entry on category theory and the references provided there. For the most recent developments that relate more specifically to constructive set theories, see e.g. (Simpson 2005) and S. Awodey's page on algebraic set theory.

6. Variants of Constructive and Intuitionistic Set Theories: Set Theories with Urelements and Non-extensional Set Theories

Sometimes systems of intuitionistic and constructive set theory have been presented with the natural numbers as a separate sort of urelements, that is, primitive objects with no elements (Friedman 1977; Myhill 1975; Beeson 1985). Constructively, this is a natural choice. It is certainly in agreement with ideas expressed by Bishop (Bishop 1967) (among others). In Bishop's monograph the natural numbers are taken as a fundamental concept in terms of which all the other mathematical concepts should be expressed. From a technical point of view, if the natural numbers are taken as primitive and distinct from their set-theoretic representations, the axiom of infinity then takes the form: “there is a set of natural numbers (as urelements)”. A more general form of urelements in constructive set theories have been considered (Cantini and Crosilla 2008).

The axiom of extensionality is a common feature of all the systems discussed so far. However, in a context in which the computational content of a statement is considered to be relevant, an intensional theory might be more appropriate. For example, constructive type theory and explicit mathematics both encapsulate some form of intensionality. Intuitionistic set theories without extensionality have been considered in the literature (Friedman 1973a, Beeson 1985). Their motivation has, however, been not computational but technical in nature. Extensionality, in fact, sometimes complicates matters for metatheoretical investigations of intuitionistic systems. To get around this difficulty, Friedman and Beeson have interpreted set theory with extensionality in a theory without it, and then carried out the work in the latter (see Beeson 1985).


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Brouwer, Luitzen Egbertus Jan | category theory | logic, history of: intuitionistic logic | logic: intuitionistic | mathematics, philosophy of | mathematics, philosophy of: intuitionism | mathematics: constructive | paradoxes: and contemporary logic | proof theory | set theory | set theory: alternative axiomatic theories | set theory: early development | set theory: non-wellfounded | type theory: constructive


I thank Andrea Cantini, Michael Rathjen and Peter Schuster for valuable comments on an earlier version of this entry. My thanks also to the referee for helpful suggestions and to the editors for their useful comments and their kind assistance with the html files.