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Set Theory

First published Thu Jul 11, 2002

Set Theory is the mathematical science of the infinite. It studies properties of sets, abstract objects that pervade the whole of modern mathematics. The language of set theory, in its simplicity, is sufficiently universal to formalize all mathematical concepts and thus set theory, along with Predicate Calculus, constitutes the true Foundations of Mathematics. As a mathematical theory, Set Theory possesses a rich internal structure, and its methods serve as a powerful tool for applications in many other fields of Mathematics. Set Theory, with its emphasis on consistency and independence proofs, provides a gauge for measuring the consistency strength of various mathematical statements. There are four main directions of current research in set theory, all intertwined and all aiming at the ultimate goal of the theory: to describe the structure of the mathematical universe. They are: inner models, independence proofs, large cardinals, and descriptive set theory. See the relevant sections in what follows.

1. The Essence of Set Theory

The objects of study of Set Theory are sets. As sets are fundamental objects that can be used to define all other concepts in mathematics, they are not defined in terms of more fundamental concepts. Rather, sets are introduced either informally, and are understood as something self-evident, or, as is now standard in modern mathematics, axiomatically, and their properties are postulated by the appropriate formal axioms.

The language of set theory is based on a single fundamental relation, called membership. We say that A is a member of B (in symbols AB), or that the set B contains A as its element. The understanding is that a set is determined by its elements; in other words, two sets are deemed equal if they have exactly the same elements. In practice, one considers sets of numbers, sets of points, sets of functions, sets of some other sets and so on. In theory, it is not necessary to distinguish between objects that are members and objects that contain members -- the only objects one needs for the theory are sets. See the supplement

Basic Set Theory

for further discussion.

Using the membership relation one can derive other concepts usually associated with sets, such as unions and intersections of sets. For example, a set C is the union of two sets A and B if its members are exactly those objects that are either members of A or members of B. The set C is uniquely determined, because we have specified what its elements are. There are more complicated operations on sets that can be defined in the language of set theory (i.e. using only the relation ∈), and we shall not concern ourselves with those. Let us mention another operation: the (unordered) pair {A,B} has as its elements exactly the sets Aand B. (If it happens that A=B, then the “pair” has exactly one member, and is called a singleton {A}.) By combining the operations of union and pairing, one can produce from any finite list of sets the set that contains these sets as members: {A,B,C,D,...,K,L,M}. We also mention the empty set, the set that has no elements. (The empty set is uniquely determined by this property, as it is the only set that has no elements - this is a consequence of the understanding that sets are determined by their elements.)

When dealing with sets informally, such operations on sets are self-evident; with the axiomatic approach, it is postulated that such operations can be applied: for instance, one postulates that for any sets A and B, the set {A,B} exists. In order to endow set theory with sufficient expressive power one needs to postulate more general construction principles than those alluded to above. The guiding principle is that any objects that can be singled out by means of the language can be collected into a set. For instance, it is desirable to have the “set of all integers that are divisible by number 3,” the “set of all straight lines in the Euclidean plane that are parallel to a given line”, the “set of all continuous real functions of two real variables” etc. Thus one is tempted to postulate that given any property P, there exists a set whose members are exactly all the sets that have property P. As we shall see below, such an assumption is logically inconsistent, and the accepted construction principles are somewhat weaker than such a postulate.

One of the basic principles of set theory is the existence of an infinite set. The concept can be formulated precisely in the language of set theory, using only the membership relation, and the definition captures the accepted meaning of “infinite”. See the supplement on

Basic Set Theory

for further discussion. Using the basic construction principles, and assuming the existence of infinite sets, one can define numbers, including integers, real numbers and complex numbers, as well as functions, functionals, geometric and topological concepts, and all objects studied in mathematics. In this sense, set theory serves as Foundations of Mathematics. The significance of this is that all questions of provability (or unprovability) of mathematical statements can be in principle reduced to formal questions of formal derivability from the generally accepted axioms of Set Theory.

While the fact that all of mathematics can be reduced to a formal system of set theory is significant, it would hardly be a justification for the study of set theory. It is the internal structure of the theory that makes it worthwhile, and it turns out that this internal structure is enormously complex and interesting. Moreover, the study of this structure leads to significant questions about the nature of the mathematical universe.

The fundamental concept in the theory of infinite sets is the cardinality of a set. Two sets A and B have the same cardinality if there exists a mapping from the set A onto the set B which is one-to-one, that is, it assigns each element of A exactly one element of B. It is clear that when two sets are finite, then they have the same cardinality if and only if they have the same number of elements. One can extend the concept of the “number of elements” to arbitrary, even infinite, sets. It is not apparent at first that there might be infinite sets of different cardinalities, but once this becomes clear, it follows quickly that the structure so described is rich indeed.

2. Origins of Set Theory

The birth of Set Theory dates to 1873 when Georg Cantor proved the uncountability of the real line. (One could even argue that the exact birthdate is December 7, 1873, the date of Cantor's letter to Dedekind informing him of his discovery.) Until then, no one envisioned the possibility that infinities come in different sizes, and moreover, mathematicians had no use for “actual infinity.” The arguments using infinity, including the Differential Calculus of Newton and Leibniz, do not require the use of infinite sets, and infinity appears only as “a manner of speaking”, to paraphrase Friedrich Gauss. The fact that the set of all positive integers has a proper subset, like the set of squares {1, 4, 9, 16, 25,...} of the same cardinality (using modern terminology) was considered somewhat paradoxical (this had been discussed at length by Galileo among others). Such apparent paradoxes prevented Bernhard Bolzano in 1840s from developing set theory, even though some of his ideas are precursors of Cantor's work. (It should be mentioned that Bolzano, an accomplished mathematician himself, coined the word Menge (= set) that Cantor used for objects of his theory.)

Motivation for Cantor's discovery of Set Theory came from his work on Fourier series (which led him to introduce ordinal numbers) and on trancendental numbers. Real numbers that are solutions of polynomial equations with integer coefficients are called algebraic, and the search was on for numbers that are not algebraic. A handful of these, called transcendental numbers, was discovered around that time, and a question arose how rare such numbers are. What Cantor did was to settle this question in an unexpected way, showing in one fell swoop that transcendental numbers are plentiful indeed. His famous proof went as follows: Let us call an infinite set A countable, if its elements can be enumerated; in other words, arranged in a sequence indexed by positive integers: a(1), a(2), a(3), … , a(n), … . Cantor observed that many infinite sets of numbers are countable: the set of all integers, the set of all rational numbers, and also the set of all algebraic numbers. Then he gave his ingeneous diagonal argument that proves, by contradiction, that the set of all real numbers is not countable. A consequence of this is that there exists a multitude of transcendental numbers, even though the proof, by contradiction, does not produce a single specific example. See the supplement on

Basic Set Theory

for further discussion.

Cantor's discovery of uncountable sets led him to the subsequent development of ordinal and cardinal numbers, with their underlying order and arithmetic, as well as to a plethora of fundamental questions that begged to be answered (such as the Continuum Hypothesis). After Cantor, mathematics has never been the same.

3. The Continuum Hypothesis

As the Continuum Hypothesis has been the most famous problem in Set Theory, let me explain what it says. The smallest infinite cardinal is the cardinality of a countable set. The set of all integers is countable, and so is the set of all rational numbers. On the other hand, the set of all real numbers is uncountable, and its cardinal is greater than the least infinite cardinal. A natural question arises: is this cardinal (the continuum) the very next cardinal. In other words, is it the case that there are no cardinals between the countable and the continuum? As Cantor was unable to find any set of real numbers whose cardinal lies strictly between the countable and the continuum, he conjectured that the continuum is the next cardinal: the Continuum Hypothesis. Cantor himself spent most of the rest of his life trying to prove the Continuum Hypothesis and many other mathematicians have tried too. One of these was David Hilbert, the leading mathematician of the last decades of the 19th century. At the World Congress of Mathematicians in Paris in 1900 Hilbert presented a list of major unsolved problems of the time, and the Continuum Hypothesis was the very first problem on Hilbert's list.

Despite the effort of a number of mathematicians, the problem remained unsolved until 1963, and it can be argued that in some sense the problem is still unsolved. See Section 7 on Independence Proofs.

4. Axiomatic Set Theory

In the years following Cantor's discoveries, development of Set Theory proceeded with no particular concern about how exactly sets should be defined. Cantor's informal “definition” was sufficient for proofs in the new theory, and the understanding was that the theory can be formalized by rephrasing the informal definition as a system of axioms. In the early 1900s it became clear that one has to state precisely what basic assumptions are made in Set Theory; in other words, the need has arisen to axiomatize Set Theory. This was done by Ernst Zermelo, and the immediate reasons for his axioms were twofold. The first one was the discovery of a paradox in Set Theory. This paradox is referred to as Russell's Paradox. Consider the “set” S of all sets that are not an element of itself. If one accepts the principle that all such sets can be collected into a set, then S should be a set. It is easy to see however that this leads to a contradiction (is the set S an element of itself?)

Russell's Paradox can be avoided by a careful choice of construction principles, so that one has the expressive power needed for usual mathematical arguments while preventing the existence of paradoxical sets. See the supplement on

Zermelo-Fraenkel Set Theory

for further discussion. The price one has to pay for avoiding inconsistency is that some “sets” do not exist. For instance, there exists no “universal” set (the set of all sets), no set of all cardinal numbers, etc.

The other reason for axioms was more subtle. In the course of development of Cantor's theory of cardinal and ordinal numbers a question was raised whether every set can be provided with a certain structure, called well-ordering of the set. Zermelo proved that indeed every set can be well-ordered, but only after he introduced a new axiom that did not seem to follow from the other, more self-evident, principles. His Axiom of Choice has become a standard tool of modern mathematics, but not without numerous objections of some mathematicians and discussions in both mathematical and philosophical literature. The history of the Axiom of Choice bears strong resemblance to that of the other notorious axiom, Euclid's Fifth Postulate.

5. The Axiom of Choice

The Axiom of Choice states that for every set of mutually disjoint nonempty sets there exists a set that has exactly one member common with each of these sets. For instance, let S be a set whose members are mutually disjoint finite sets of real numbers. We can choose in each XS the smallest number, and thus form a set that has exactly one member in common with each XS. What is not self-evident is whether we can make a choice every time, simultaneously for infinitely many sets X, regardless what these abstract sets are. The Axiom of Choice, which postulates the existence of a certain set (the choice set) without giving specific instructions how to construct such a set, is of different nature than the other axioms, which all formulate certain construction principles for sets. It was this nonconstructive nature of the Axiom of Choice that fed the controversy for years to come.

An interesting application of the Axiom of Choice is the Banach-Tarski Paradox that states that the unit ball can be partitioned into a finite number of disjoint sets which then can be rearranged to form two unit balls. This is of course a paradox only when we insist on visualizing abstract sets as something that exists in the physical world. The sets used in the Banach-Tarski Paradox are not physical objects, even though they do exist in the sense that their existence is proved from the axioms of mathematics (including the Axiom of Choice).

The legitimate question is whether the Axiom of Choice is consistent, that is whether it cannot be refuted from the other axioms. (Notice the similarity with the non Euclidean geometry.) This question was answered by Gödel, and eventually the role of the Axiom of Choice has been completely clarified. See Section 7 on Independence Proofs.

6. Inner Models

In the 1930s, Gödel stunned the mathematical world by discovering that mathematics is incomplete. His Incompleteness Theorem states that every axiomatic system that purports to describe mathematics as we know it must be incomplete, in the sense that one can find a true statement expressible in the system that cannot be formally proved from the axioms. In view of this result one must consider the possibility that a mathematical conjecture that resists a proof might be an example of such an unprovable statement, and Gödel immediately embarked on the project of showing that the Continuum Hypothesis might be undecidable in the axiomatic set theory.

Several years after proving the Incompleteness Theorem, Gödel proved another groundbreaking result: he showed that both the Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis are consistent with the axioms of set theory, that is that neither can be refuted by using those axioms. This he achieved by discovering a model of set theory in which both the Axiom of Choice and the Continuum Hypothesis are true.

Gödel's model L of “constructible sets” has since served as a blueprint for building so-called inner models. These models form a hierarchy, corresponding to the hierarchy of large cardinals (see Section 8), and provide a glimpse into the as yet hidden structure of the mathematical universe. The advances in Inner Model Theory that have been made in the recent past owe much to the work of Ronald Jensen who introduced the study of the fine structure of constructible sets.

7. Independence Proofs

In 1963, Paul Cohen proved independence of the Axiom of Choice and of the Continuum Hypothesis. This he did by applying the method of forcing that he invented and constructing first a model of set theory (with the axiom of choice) in which the Continuum Hypothesis fails, and then a model of set theory in which the Axiom of Choice fails. Together with Gödel's models, these models show that the Axiom of Choice can neither be proved nor refuted from the other axioms, and that the Continuum Hypothesis can neither be proved nor refuted from the axioms of set theory (including the Axiom of Choice).

Cohen's method proved extremely fruitful and led first to the solution of a number of outstanding problems (Suslin's Problem, the Lebesgue measurability Problem, Borel's Conjecture, Kaplansky's Conjecture, Whitehead's Problem and so on) and soon has become one of the cornerstones of modern set theory. The technique of forcing has to date been applied by hundreds of authors of numerous articles and has enormously advanced our knowledge of Foundations of Mathematics. Along with the theory of large cardinals it is used to gauge the consistency strength of mathematical statements.

8. Large Cardinals

In 1930, while working on the Measure Problem, Stanislaw Ulam discovered an important phenomenon: Assuming that a certain mathematical statement about “small sets” (such as sets of real numbers) is true, one can prove the existence of sets of enormous size (inaccessible). This phenomenon has become more apparent after Dana Scott's celebrated result (1961) that measurable cardinals do not exist in L. Suddenly, large cardinals such as inaccessible, measurable, supercompact etc. have become the main focus of attention of set theorists. What emerged is a hierarchy of properties of infinite sets, the Large Cardinal Theory, that appears to be the basis for the structure of the set theoretical universe. Large cardinal axioms (also referred to as axioms of strong infinity) form a hierarchy whereby a stronger axiom not only implies a weaker axiom but also proves its consistency. To date there are scores of examples of mathematical statements whose consistency strength can be precisely calculated in terms of the hierarchy of large cardinals. (For instance, a negative solution of the Singular Cardinal Problem corresponds to a large cardinal axiom between measurabily and supercompactness.)

Since the pioneering work of Ronald Jensen, Large Cardinal Theory has been closely tied with Inner Model Theory. It turns out that for each large cardinal axiom at lower levels of the hierarchy one can find an appropriate inner model. These inner models shed additional light on the structure of the universe by employing methods of Descriptive Set Theory.

9. Descriptive Set Theory

Descriptive Set Theory traces its origins to the theory of integration by Henri Lebesgue at the beginning of 20th century. Investigations into Borel sets of real numbers led to the theory of projective sets, and more generally, the theory of definable sets of real numbers. Following Gödel's work, it became apparent that many natural questions in Descriptive Set Theory are undecidable in axiomatic set theory. This was further confirmed by a proliferation of independence results following Cohen's invention of the forcing method.

Modern Descriptive Set Theory revolves mostly around the powerful method using infinite games. The branch of Descriptive Set Theory known as Determinateness, developed by D. A. Martin, Robert Solovay and others, brought together methods of, among others, Recursion Theory and Large Cardinal Theory and has been very successful in describing the structure of definable sets. More importantly, Descriptive Set Theory provides strong evidence for the large cardinal axioms.


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Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | logic: classical | proof theory | Russell's paradox