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Russell's Paradox

First published Fri Dec 8, 1995; substantive revision Wed May 27, 2009

Russell's paradox is the most famous of the logical or set-theoretical paradoxes. The paradox arises within naive set theory by considering the set of all sets that are not members of themselves. Such a set appears to be a member of itself if and only if it is not a member of itself, hence the paradox.

Some sets, such as the set of all teacups, are not members of themselves. Other sets, such as the set of all non-teacups, are members of themselves. Call the set of all sets that are not members of themselves “R.” If R is a member of itself, then by definition it must not be a member of itself. Similarly, if R is not a member of itself, then by definition it must be a member of itself. Discovered by Bertrand Russell in 1901, the paradox has prompted much work in logic, set theory and the philosophy and foundations of mathematics.

History of the paradox

Russell appears to have discovered his paradox in the late spring of 1901,[1] while working on his Principles of Mathematics (1903). Cesare Burali-Forti, an assistant to Giuseppe Peano, had discovered a similar antinomy in 1897 when he noticed that since the set of ordinals is well-ordered, it too must have an ordinal. However, this ordinal must be both an element of the set of all ordinals and yet greater than every such element. Unlike Burali-Forti's paradox, Russell's paradox does not involve either ordinals or cardinals, relying instead only on the primitive notion of set.

Russell wrote to Gottlob Frege with news of his paradox on June 16, 1902. The paradox was of significance to Frege's logical work since, in effect, it showed that the axioms Frege was using to formalize his logic were inconsistent. Specifically, Frege's Rule V, which states that two sets are equal if and only if their corresponding functions coincide in values for all possible arguments, requires that an expression such as f(x) be considered both a function of the argument x and a function of the argument f. In effect, it was this ambiguity that allowed Russell to construct R in such a way that it could both be and not be a member of itself.

Russell's letter arrived just as the second volume of Frege's Grundgesetze der Arithmetik (The Basic Laws of Arithmetic, 1893, 1903) was in press. Immediately appreciating the difficulty the paradox posed, Frege added to the Grundgesetze a hastily composed appendix discussing Russell's discovery. In the appendix Frege observes that the consequences of Russell's paradox are not immediately clear. For example, “Is it always permissible to speak of the extension of a concept, of a class? And if not, how do we recognize the exceptional cases? Can we always infer from the extension of one concept's coinciding with that of a second, that every object which falls under the first concept also falls under the second? These are the questions,” Frege notes, “raised by Mr Russell's communication.”[2] Because of these worries, Frege eventually felt forced to abandon many of his views about logic and mathematics.

Of course, Russell also was concerned about the contradiction. Upon learning that Frege agreed with him about the significance of the result, he immediately began writing an appendix for his own soon-to-be-released Principles of Mathematics. Entitled “Appendix B: The Doctrine of Types,” the appendix represents Russell's first detailed attempt at providing a principled method for avoiding what was soon to become known as “Russell's paradox.”

Significance of the paradox

The significance of Russell's paradox can be seen once it is realized that, using classical logic, all sentences follow from a contradiction. For example, assuming both P and ~P, any arbitrary proposition, Q, can be proved as follows: from P we obtain PQ by the rule of Addition; then from PQ and ~P we obtain Q by the rule of Disjunctive Syllogism. Because of this, and because set theory underlies all branches of mathematics, many people began to worry that, if set theory was inconsistent, no mathematical proof could be trusted completely.

Russell's paradox ultimately stems from the idea that any coherent condition may be used to determine a set. As a result, most attempts at resolving the paradox have concentrated on various ways of restricting the principles governing set existence found within naive set theory, particularly the so-called Comprehension (or Abstraction) axiom. This axiom in effect states that any propositional function, P(x), containing x as a free variable can be used to determine a set. In other words, corresponding to every propositional function, P(x), there will exist a set whose members are exactly those things, x, that have property P.[3] It is now generally, although not universally, agreed that such an axiom must either be abandoned or modified.[4]

Russell's own response to the paradox was his aptly named theory of types. Recognizing that self-reference lies at the heart of the paradox, Russell's basic idea is that we can avoid commitment to R (the set of all sets that are not members of themselves) by arranging all sentences (or, equivalently, all propositional functions) into a hierarchy. The lowest level of this hierarchy will consist of sentences about individuals. The next lowest level will consist of sentences about sets of individuals. The next lowest level will consist of sentences about sets of sets of individuals, and so on. It is then possible to refer to all objects for which a given condition (or predicate) holds only if they are all at the same level or of the same “type.”

This solution to Russell's paradox is motivated in large part by the so-called vicious circle principle, a principle which, in effect, states that no propositional function can be defined prior to specifying the function's scope of application. In other words, before a function can be defined, one must first specify exactly those objects to which the function will apply (the function's domain). For example, before defining the predicate “is a prime number,” one first needs to define the collection of objects that might possibly satisfy the predicate, namely the set, N, of natural numbers.

As Russell explains,

An analysis of the paradoxes to be avoided shows that they all result from a kind of vicious circle. The vicious circles in question arise from supposing that a collection of objects may contain members which can only be defined by means of the collection as a whole. Thus, for example, the collection of propositions will be supposed to contain a proposition stating that “all propositions are either true or false.” It would seem, however, that such a statement could not be legitimate unless “all propositions” referred to some already definite collection, which it cannot do if new propositions are created by statements about “all propositions.” We shall, therefore, have to say that statements about “all propositions” are meaningless.… The principle which enables us to avoid illegitimate totalities may be stated as follows: “Whatever involves all of a collection must not be one of the collection”; or, conversely: “If, provided a certain collection had a total, it would have members only definable in terms of that total, then the said collection has no total.” We shall call this the “vicious-circle principle,” because it enables us to avoid the vicious circles involved in the assumption of illegitimate totalities. (Whitehead and Russell 1910, 37)

From this it follows that no function's scope of application will ever be able to include any object defined in terms of the function itself. As a result, propositional functions (along with their corresponding propositions) will end up being arranged in a hierarchy of exactly the kind Russell proposes.

Although Russell first introduced his theory of types in his 1903 Principles of Mathematics, type theory found its mature expression five years later in his 1908 article, “Mathematical Logic as Based on the Theory of Types,” and in the monumental work he co-authored with Alfred North Whitehead, Principia Mathematica (1910, 1912, 1913). Russell's type theory thus appears in two versions: the “simple theory” of 1903 and the “ramified theory” of 1908. Both versions have been criticized for being too ad hoc to eliminate the paradox successfully. In addition, even if type theory is successful in eliminating Russell's paradox, it is likely to be ineffective at resolving other, unrelated paradoxes.

Other responses to Russell's paradox have included those of David Hilbert and the formalists (whose basic idea was to allow the use of only finite, well-defined and constructible objects, together with rules of inference deemed to be absolutely certain), and of Luitzen Brouwer and the intuitionists (whose basic idea was that one cannot assert the existence of a mathematical object unless one can also indicate how to go about constructing it).

Yet a fourth response was embodied in Ernst Zermelo's 1908 axiomatization of set theory. Zermelo's axioms were designed to resolve Russell's paradox by again restricting the Comprehension axiom in a manner not dissimilar to that proposed by Russell. ZF and ZFC (i.e., ZF supplemented by the Axiom of Choice), the two axiomatizations generally used today, are modifications of Zermelo's theory developed primarily by Abraham Fraenkel.

Together, these four responses to Russell's paradox have helped logicians develop an explicit awareness of the nature of formal systems and of the kinds of metalogical and metamathematical results commonly associated with them today.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Cantor, Georg | Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | logic: paraconsistent | mathematics: inconsistent | Peano, Giuseppe | Principia Mathematica | Russell, Bertrand | type theory | Whitehead, Alfred North


The author would like to thank Chris Menzel for his helpful feedback on an earlier version of this entry. The editors would like to thank Fred Spiessens for noticing a problem in description of the vicious circle principle.