Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Simon of Faversham

First published Tue Nov 18, 2003; substantive revision Wed Mar 21, 2007

A thirteenth-century commentator on Aristotle's logical and psychological works. He has been identified as a Thomist, but tends to follow Albert the Great in his views on the soul, and his later work moves toward the Augustinian views of Henry of Ghent on the question of the real distinction between essence and existence.

1. Biography

Simon of Faversham was born around 1260 in Faversham, a seaport town about ten miles west of Canterbury. He received his M.A. at Oxford, but very likely taught at Paris in the 1280's, returning to Oxford in 1289. This would explain the presence of his writings in continental manuscripts, as well as the references to him in some manuscripts as “Simon Anglicus,” a name that makes sense only outside England. Moreover, the colophon to his Questions on the Prior Analytics in Ms V speaks of him as “magistro Symone Anglico Parisius,” and his questions are similar in content and form to Parisian work, especially that of Peter of Auvergne, in the 1270's and early 1280's. Given the dependence of Simon's writing on his teaching, this indicates presence in the same teaching environment as Peter, Simon developing his classes from what he himself heard as a student and assisting his own Master. His return to Oxford in 1289 is supported by the fact that his work seems unaffected by later Parisian developments of Radulphus Brito's day, but more to the point, in 1290 he was ordained a deacon by Archbishop Peckham, and received the rectorship of Preston, a village near Faversham, a sinecure suitable for the support of a scholar. He never became a priest, and seems to have spent most of his scholarly life in the Arts faculty, a somewhat uncommon practice for his day, though it was done more frequently in the next century. Simon took the degree of Doctor of Theology, probably having long ago fulfilled the requirements for it, only when it became evident that he was a candidate for the chancellorship at Oxford, for which the degree was a prerequisite. He became chancellor in January 1304, but served only a short time, dying in 1306 while traveling to the papal curia to contest, with the support of the King, the loss of a rich benefice to a rival, papal candidate.

2. Works

Simon of Faversham's works can be listed as follows:

3. Doctrine

Simon of Faversham's literary production, aside from the opusculum, Sophisma: A Universal is an Intention, consists entirely of commentaries on Aristotle's logical and psychological works, and is clearly a product of his teaching. For the most part he devotes his attention in these commentaries to the exposition of Aristotle, resolving interpretational problems with suitable distinctions. We have a couple of examples of second commentaries on the same material which reveal a mind quite capable of reconsidering its views. Only occasionally does he take on some prominent issue of his time, as one might out of boredom in teaching an elementary class on a classical figure, or out of the conviction that one has something to say here and no more suitable arena in which to say it.

Simon has often been identified as a follower of Thomas Aquinas (for instance, by Gilson and Mazarella), and he certainly knows Thomas, but it is probably wrong to identify him as a strict Thomist. In his commentaries on Aristotle's De anima, discussed by Wolf, Simon follows Thomas and Albert the Great closely in their attack on Averroism. But he differs from Thomas and sides with Albert in taking the soul to be in itself a complete substance, which comes to inform the body, but not itself a corporeal form, even in part. He also takes the powers of the soul to be its parts, whereas Thomas saw them as accidents of the whole man, or, in the case of the intellect, of the soul. Again unlike Thomas, Simon identifies the soul with the intellect, taking the intellect to subsist of itself, though it is also the form of a particular human being which itself subsists through it.

The acid test for a Thomist may be his adherence to the real distinction between essence and existence, and Simon does follow Aquinas on the real distinction in Question 20 of his Categories commentary, written early in his career. But in his second commentary on the Posterior Analytics, Question 49, written much later, he explicitly criticizes Thomas's views, and himself follows the views of Henry of Ghent, though he does not identify their author. With this change of heart he follows Henry in adopting the phrase esse in effectu for existence from Avicenna (On First Philosophy V 1).

Simon's objection to Thomas's view is this: if existence differs from essence in creatures, then it is something added, though Thomas, of course, insists that it is not an accident added to the essence, as Avicenna thought. (This common criticism of Avicenna is probably off base, but it was generally accepted as correct at the time, on the authority of Averroës.) But if existence is added to essence, then it is a kind of actuality. Now Thomas says it is primary actuality, but this cannot be, for essence is the primary actuality. The point here is that essence is not pure potentiality, for only prime matter fits that distinction. There is much that is true of the essence of a human being (for instance, that it is rational, not merely potentially rational), and so there is a kind of primary actuality here. But existence cannot be an added secondary actuality, either, as Thomas confesses. So existence is nothing real added at all to essence, which is the same as saying that it is not really different from essence. But it is different in some way from essence, and that means it differs in formula (ratio) from the essence.

What is the formula of existence? Well, one considers a substance as existing when one considers it insofar as it is part of the causal order, and itself caused by something to be part of that order. So existence is the sort of being possessed by something which is the effect of another thing. It is esse in effectu, a being in an effect. Finally, borrowing a notion from Giles of Rome, he argues that existence falls under the category of substance, for there are substantial relations; for instance, the relation between matter and form falls under substance. Esse in effectu, then, is the sort of being a particular substance has, as opposed to inesse, which is the sort of being an accident has. It should be noted that the denial of the real distinction between essence and existence here leaves a crucial ambiguity in place. Is Simon to be assimilated to Avicenna, taking an essence considered absolutely and in itself as an actual reality independently of the reality of particulars bearing that essence? Or is he closer to Averroës, regarding the particular individual as the underlying reality, which, viewed in abstraction from causal connections, is really identical with its own essence? It seems Simon tars Avicenna and Thomas Aquinas with the same brush, arguing that both of them take existence to be some added reality, but taking that point, does Simon think that the essence as such or the particular falling under it which we encounter is the subject of these various formulae, esse essentiae and esse existentiae, under which we view it?

The answer is almost surely that he would reject our demand that he make a choice. Really the essence and the particular are the same thing; they differ only in formula. To say this surely requires one to reject the demand that he decide which formula is the one that gets things the way they really are. This is crucial point for Simon's epistemology, for it is this real identity of essence and particular which allows us to gain scientific knowledge of particulars, since the essence can be equated with a thing's form, and the form comes to be in the soul and an object of its immediate awareness when the soul knows a thing.

The term ‘esse in effectu’ is coordinate with two other terms, ‘esse essentiae,’ and ‘esse universale.’ These three are discussed in Simon's Sophisma, in which he holds that one can speak of the essence as it is part of the natural world and a particular to be found interacting with other particulars in the natural world, or without reference to anything outside itself, or as it is conceived in the intellect, so that it can be asserted of different things. The picture comes from Avicenna, and plays a role in Thomas's thought as well. Like Thomas, Simon insists that the universal concept has a foundation in the essence itself, which is real quite independently of the concept in virtue of being what it is, though it is, in itself, neither universal nor particular, both because it is not in itself brought under the consideration of the intellect, and because it is not in itself multiplied, or for that matter, singular, in the way that individuals entering into natural causal processes are. But the Sophisma never uses the term ‘esse in effectu,’ preferring to speak of being in matter or in particulars, or outside the soul, when it wants to indicate existing particulars. Moreover, it does not discuss the real distinction either, restricting itself to a consideration of universality. Like the Categories commentary, it seems to predate the reconsiderations that produced the criticism of Thomas in Simon's Questions on the Posterior Analytics.

Simon follows Giles of Rome on many matters in his commentary on the Sophistici Elenchi, and also shows familiarity with Giles's Posterior Analytics commentary, following Giles on the nature of logic, though he prefers Aquinas in his most characteristic doctrines, arguing that the real definition of the subject term is the middle term in the highest sort of demonstration (demonstratio potissima) and identifying the fourth mode of per se predication (predicating a thing of its cause) as operative in demonstration along with the first two modes (predicating of the subject something contained in its definition, and predicating of the subject something containing it in its definition). Indeed, he follows Aquinas on these matters even in the second Posterior Analytics commentary, in which he differs with Aquinas's view on the real distinction.

His forays into more serious philosophical issues are limited by Simon's general simplicity of approach, no doubt dictated by his undergraduate students, and the obvious need to move on quickly to other things. The chief value of Simon's work is the window it provides into the world of a pedestrian but intelligent and honest scholar, typical of his time and place.


Documents Bearing on Simon's Life and Works

Simon's Works

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Albert the Great [= Albertus magnus] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Aristotle | Giles of Rome