Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Saint Thomas Aquinas

First published Mon Jul 12, 1999; substantive revision Wed Sep 30, 2009

Thomas Aquinas (1225–1274) lived at a critical juncture of western culture when the arrival of the Aristotelian corpus in Latin translation reopened the question of the relation between faith and reason, calling into question the modus vivendi that had obtained for centuries. This crisis flared up just as universities were being founded. Thomas, after early studies at Montecassino, moved on to the University of Naples, where he met members of the new Dominican Order. It was at Naples too that Thomas had his first extended contact with the new learning. When he joined the Dominican Order he went north to study with Albertus Magnus, author of a paraphrase of the Aristotelian corpus. Thomas completed his studies at the University of Paris, which had been formed out of the monastic schools on the Left Bank and the cathedral school at Notre Dame. In two stints as a regent master Thomas defended the mendicant orders and, of greater historical importance, countered both the Averroistic interpretations of Aristotle and the Franciscan tendency to reject Greek philosophy. The result was a new modus vivendi between faith and philosophy which survived until the rise of the new physics. The Catholic Church has over the centuries regularly and consistently reaffirmed the central importance of Thomas's work for understanding its teachings concerning the Christian revelation, and his close textual commentaries on Aristotle represent a cultural resource which is now receiving increased recognition. The following account concentrates on Thomas the philosopher.

1. Life and Works

1.1 Vita Brevis

Thomas was born in 1225 at Roccasecca, a hilltop castle from which the great Benedictine abbey of Montecassino is not quite visible, midway between Rome and Naples. At the age of five, he was entered at Montecassino where his studies began. When the monastery became a battle site—not for the last time—Thomas was transferred by his family to the University of Naples. It was here that he came into contact with the “new” Aristotle and with the Order of Preachers or Dominicans, a recently founded mendicant order. He became a Dominican over the protests of his family and eventually went north to study, perhaps first briefly at Paris, then at Cologne with Albert the Great, whose interest in Aristotle strengthened Thomas's own predilections. Returned to Paris, he completed his studies, became a Master and for three years occupied one of the Dominican chairs in the Faculty of Theology. The next ten years were spent in various places in Italy, with the mobile papal court, at various Dominican houses, and eventually in Rome. From there he was called back to Paris to confront the controversy variously called Latin Averroism and Heterodox Aristotelianism. After this second three year stint, he was assigned to Naples. In 1274, on his way to the Council of Lyon, he fell ill and died on March 7 in the Cistercian abbey at Fossanova, which is perhaps twenty kilometers from Roccasecca.

1.2 Education

Little is known of Thomas's studies at Montecassino, but much is known of the shape that the monastic schools had taken. They were one of the principal conduits of the liberal arts tradition which stretches back to Cassiodorus Senator in the 6th century. The arts of the trivium (grammar, rhetoric, logic) and those of the quadrivium (arithmetic, geometry, music and astronomy) were fragments preserved against the ruinous loss of classical knowledge. They constituted the secular education that complemented sacred doctrine as learned from the Bible. When Thomas transferred to Naples, his education in the arts continued. Here it would have been impressed upon him that the liberal arts were no longer adequate categories of secular learning: the new translations of Aristotle spelled the end of the liberal arts tradition, although the universities effected a transition rather than a breach.

Taking Thomas's alma mater Paris as reference point, the Faculty of Arts provided the point of entry to teen-aged boys. With the attainment of the Master of Arts at about the age of 20, one could go on to study in a higher faculty, law, medicine or theology. The theological program Thomas entered in Paris was a grueling one, with the master's typically attained in the early thirties. Extensive and progressively more intensive study of the scriptures, Old and New Testament, and of the summary of Christian doctrine called the Sentences which was compiled by the twelfth century Bishop of Paris, Peter Lombard. These close textual studies were complemented by public disputations and the even more unruly quodlibetal questions. With the faculty modeled more or less on the guilds, the student served a long apprenticeship, established his competence in stages, and eventually after a public examination was named a master and then gave his inaugural lecture.

1.3 Writings

Thomas's writings by and large show their provenance in his teaching duties. His commentary on the Sentences put the seal on his student days and many of his very early commentaries on Scripture have come down to us. But from the very beginning Thomas produces writings which would not have emerged from the usual tasks of the theological master. On Being and Essence and The Principles of Nature date from his first stay at Paris, and unlike his commentaries on Boethius' On the Trinity and De hebdomadibus, are quite obviously philosophical works. Some of his disputed questions date from his first stint as regius master at Paris. When he returned to Italy his productivity increased. He finished the Summa contra gentiles, wrote various disputed questions and began the Summa theologiae. In 1268, at Rome, he began the work of commenting on Aristotle with On the Soul, and during the next five or six years commented on eleven more (not all of these are complete). During this time he was caught up in magisterial duties of unusual scope and was writing such polemical works as On the Eternity of the World and On There Being Only One Intellect.

At Naples, he was given the task of elevating the status of the Dominican House of Studies. His writing continued until he had a mystical experience which made him think of all he had done as “mere straw.” At the time of his death in 1274 he was under a cloud in Paris and in 1277, 219 propositions were condemned by a commission appointed by the Bishop of Paris, among them tenets of Thomas. This was soon lifted, he was canonized and eventually was given the title of Common Doctor of the Church. But the subtle and delicate assimilation of Aristotle that characterized his work in both philosophy and theology did not survive his death, outside the Dominican Order, and has experienced ups and downs ever since.

2. Philosophy and Theology

Many contemporary philosophers are unsure how to read Thomas. He was in his primary and official profession a theologian. Nonetheless, we find among his writings works anyone would recognize as philosophical and the dozen commentaries on Aristotle increasingly enjoy the respect and interest of Aristotelian scholars. Even within theological works as such there are extended discussions that are easily read as possessing a philosophical character. So his best known work, the Summa theologiae, is often cited by philosophers when Thomas's position on this or that issue is sought. How can a theological work provide grist for philosophical mills? How did Thomas distinguish between philosophy and theology?

Sometimes Thomas puts the difference this way: “… the believer and the philosopher consider creatures differently. The philosopher considers what belongs to their proper natures, while the believer considers only what is true of creatures insofar as they are related to God, for example, that they are created by God and are subject to him, and the like.” (Summa contra gentiles, bk II, chap. 4) Since the philosopher too, according to Thomas, considers things as they relate to God, this statement does not put the difference in a formal light.

The first and major formal difference between philosophy and theology is found in their principles, that is, starting points. The presuppositions of the philosopher, that to which his discussions and arguments are ultimately driven back, are in the public domain. They are things that everyone can know upon reflection; they are where disagreement between us must come to an end. These principles are not themselves the products of proof—which does not of course mean that they are immune to rational analysis and inquiry—and thus they are said to be known by themselves (per se, as opposed to per alia). This is proportionately true of each of the sciences, where the most common principles just alluded to are in the background and the proper principles or starting points of the particular science function regionally as the common principles do across the whole terrain of thought and being.

By contrast, the discourse of the theologian is ultimately driven back to starting points or principles that are held to be true on the basis of faith, that is, the truths that are authoritatively conveyed by Revelation as revealed by God. Some believers reflect on these truths and see other truths implied by them, spell out their interrelations and defend them against the accusation of being nonsense. Theological discourse looks like any other discourse and is, needless to say, governed by the common principles of thought and being, but it is characterized formally by the fact that its arguments and analyses are taken to be truth-bearing only for one who accepts Scriptural revelation as true.

This provides a formal test for deciding whether a piece of discourse is philosophical or theological. If it relies only on truths anyone can be expected upon reflection to know about the world, and if it offers to lead to new truths on the basis of such truths, and only on that basis, then it is philosophical discourse. On the other hand, discourse whose cogency—not formal, but substantive—depends upon our accepting as true such claims as that there are three persons in one divine nature, that our salvation was effected by the sacrifice of Jesus, that Jesus is one person but two natures, one human, one divine, and the like, is theological discourse. Any appeal to an authoritative scriptural source as the necessary nexus in an argument is thereby other than philosophical discourse.

More will be said of this contrast later, but this is the essential difference Thomas recognizes between philosophy and theology. I will conclude this paragraph with a passage in which Thomas summarizes his position. He is confronting an objection to there being any need for theological discourse. Whatever can be the object of inquiry will qualify as a being of one sort or another; but the philosophical disciplines seem to cover every kind of being, indeed there is even a part of it which Aristotle calls theology. So what need is there for discourse beyond philosophical discourse?

… it should be noted that different ways of knowing (ratio cognoscibilis) give us different sciences. The astronomer and the natural philosopher both conclude that the earth is round, but the astronomer does this through a mathematical middle that is abstracted from matter, whereas the natural philosopher considers a middle lodged in matter. Thus there is nothing to prevent another science from treating in the light of divine revelation what the philosophical disciplines treat as knowable in the light of human reason. (Summa theologiae, Ia, q. 1, a., ad 2)

For Thomas theological discourse begins with what God has revealed about Himself and His action in creating and redeeming the world, and the world is understood in that light. Philosophical discourse begins with knowledge of the world, and if it speaks of God, what it says is conditioned by what is known of the world. But even given the distinction between the two, Aquinas suggests here that there are in fact elements of what God has revealed that are formally speaking philosophical and subject to philosophical discussion--though revealed they can be known and investigated without the precondition of faith. In other words, even something as a matter of fact revealed is subject to philosophical analysis, if religious faith is not necessary to know it and accept it as true. So it may happen that concerning certain subjects, as for example the nature of God, the nature of the human person, what is necessary for a human being to be good and to fulfill his or her destiny, and so on, there can be both a theological and a philosophical discussion of those subjects, providing for a fruitful engagement between the theological and the philosophical. And for this reason, Thomas' theological works are very often paradigms of that engagement between theological and philosophical reflection, and provide some of his very best philosophical reflection.

3. Christian Philosophy

It will be observed that the formal distinction between philosophical and theological discourse leaves untouched what has often been the mark of one who is at once a believer and a philosopher. It is not simply that he might on one occasion produce an argument that is philosophical and at another time one that is theological; his religious beliefs are clearly not put in escrow but are very much in evidence when he functions as a philosopher. Many of the questions that can be raised philosophically are such that the believer already has answers to them -- from his religious faith. How then can he be thought to be ready to follow the argument whither it listeth, as an objector might put it? Furthermore, the inquiries in which the believer who philosophizes engages will often indicate his religious interests.

When such observations turn into objections, perhaps into the accusation that a believer cannot be a proper philosopher, there is often an unexamined notion of what a proper philosopher looks like. The proper philosopher may be thought to be someone—perhaps merely some mind—without antecedents or history who first comes to consciousness posing a philosophical question the answer to which is pursued without prejudice. But of course no human being and thus no philosopher is pure reason, mind alone, without previous history as he embarks on the task of philosophizing. One has necessarily knocked about in the world for a long time before he signs up for Philosophy 101. He has at hand or rattling around in his mind all kinds of ready responses to situations and questions. He very likely engaged in some kind of inquiry about whether or not to begin the formal study of philosophy in the first place. This may be acknowledged, but with the proviso that step one in the pursuit of philosophy is to rid the mind of all such antecedents. They must be put in the dock, put in brackets, placed in doubt, regarded with suspicion. Only after appropriate epistemological cleansing is the mind equipped to make its first warranted knowledge claim. Knowledge thus becomes a deliverance of philosophy, a product of philosophizing. Outside of philosophy there is no knowledge.

The preceding paragraph has been meant to capture the salient note of much modern philosophy since Descartes. Philosophy is first of all a search for defensible knowledge claims, and for the method according to which it will be found. As opposed to what?

As opposed to the view of philosophy described in paragraph 2, Thomas understands philosophizing to depend upon antecedent knowledge, to proceed from it, and to be unintelligible unless, in its sophisticated modes, it can be traced back to the common truths known to all. But this tracing back will pass through very different terrains, depending on the upbringing, culture and other vagaries and accidents of a given person's experience. The pre-philosophical—I refer to the formal study of philosophy—outlook of the believer will be characterizable in a given way, a way suggested above. It is more difficult to characterize the pre-philosophical attitudes and beliefs out of which the non-believer philosophizes. Let us imagine that he holds in a more or less unexamined way that all events, including thinking, are physical events. If he should, as a philosopher, take up the question of the immortality of the soul, he is going to regard with suspicion those classical proofs which rely on an analysis of thinking as a non-physical process. The Christian, on the other hand, will be well-disposed towards efforts to prove the immortality of the human soul and will accordingly approach descriptions of thinking as non-physical sympathetically. He is unlikely to view with equanimity any claim that for human beings death is the utter end.

The importance of this is that a believer runs the risk of accepting bad proofs of the immateriality of thinking and thus of the human soul. On the other hand, a committed materialist may be too quick to accept a bad proof that thinking is just a material process. Such antecedent stances are often the reason why philosophical agreement is so hard to reach. Does it make it impossible? Do such considerations destroy any hope of philosophical objectivity on either side? Surely not, in principle. Believers and non-believers should be able to agree on what counts as a good proof in a given area even if they expect different results from such a proof. Thinking either is or is not merely a physical process and antecedent expectations do not settle the question, however they influence the pursuit of that objective resolution. But the important point is that antecedent dispositions and expectations are the common condition of philosophers, believers and unbelievers alike. Of course, believers hold that they have an advantage here, since the antecedents that influence them are revealed truths, not just hearsay, received opinion, the zeitgeist or prejudice.

4. Thomas and Aristotle

Given the distinction between philosophy and theology, one can then distinguish between philosophical and theological sources and influences in Aquinas' work. And as a philosopher, Thomas is emphatically Aristotelian. His interest in and perceptive understanding of the Stagyrite is present from his earliest years and certainly did not await the period toward the end of his life when he wrote his close textual commentaries on Aristotle. When Thomas referred to Aristotle as the Philosopher, he was not merely adopting a façon de parler of the time. He adopted Aristotle's analysis of physical objects, his view of place, time and motion, his proof of the prime mover, his cosmology. He made his own Aristotle's account of sense perception and intellectual knowledge. His moral philosophy is closely based on what he learned from Aristotle and in his commentary on the Metaphysics he provides a cogent and coherent account of what is going on in those difficult pages. But to acknowledge the primary role of Aristotle in Thomas's philosophy is not to deny other philosophical influences. Augustine is a massively important presence. Boethius, Pseudo-Dionysius and Proclus were conduits through which he learned Neo-platonism. There is nothing more obviously Aristotelian about Thomas than his assumption that there is something to be learned from any author, if only mistakes to be avoided. But he adopted many features from non-Aristotelian sources.

This has led some to suggest that what is called Thomistic philosophy is an eclectic hodgepodge, not a set of coherent disciplines. Others, struck by the prominence in Thomas of such Platonic notions as participation, have argued that his thought is fundamentally Platonic, not Aristotelian. Still others argue that that there is a radically original Thomistic philosophy which cannot be characterized by anything it shares with earlier thinkers, particularly Aristotle.

The recognition that Thomas is fundamentally an Aristotelian is not equivalent to the claim that Aristotle is the only influence on him. It is the claim that whatever Thomas takes on from other sources is held to be compatible with what he already holds in common with Aristotle. And, of course, to draw attention to the sources of Thomas's philosophy is not to say that everything he holds philosophically can be parsed back into historical antecedents, or that he never disagrees with his sources, Aristotle in particular.

5. The Order of Philosophical Inquiry

Thomas takes “philosophy” to be an umbrella term which covers an ordered set of sciences. Philosophical thinking is characterized by its argumentative structure and a science is taken to be principally the discovery of the properties of kinds of things. But thinking is sometimes theoretical and sometimes practical. The practical use of the mind has as its object the guidance of some activity other than thinking—choosing in the case of moral action, some product in the case of art. The theoretical use of the mind has truth as its object: it seeks not to change the world but to understand it. Like Aristotle, Thomas holds that there is a plurality of both theoretical and practical sciences. Ethics, economics and politics are the practical sciences, while physics, mathematics and metaphysics are the theoretical sciences.

That is one way to lay out the various philosophical disciplines. But there is another that has to do with the appropriate order in which they should be studied. That order of learning is as follows: logic, mathematics, natural philosophy, moral philosophy, metaphysics. The primacy of logic stems from the fact that we have to know what knowledge is so we will recognize that we have met its demands in a particular case. The study of mathematics comes early because little experience of the world is required to master it. But when we turn to knowledge of the physical world, there is an ever increasing dependence upon a wide and deep experience of things. Moral philosophy requires not only experience, but good upbringing and the ordering of the passions. Metaphysics or wisdom, is the culminating and defining goal of philosophical inquiry: it is such knowledge as we can achieve of the divine, the first cause of all else.

Thomas commented on two logical works of Aristotle: On Interpretation (incomplete) and Posterior Analytics. On mathematics, there are only glancing allusions in Thomas's writings. Thomas describes logic as dealing with “second intentions,” that is, with formal relations which attach to concepts expressive of the natures of existent things, first intentions. This means that logic rides piggy-back on direct knowledge of the world and thus incorporates the view that what is primary in our knowledge is the things of which we first form concepts. Mathematical entities are idealizations made by way of abstraction from our knowledge of sensible things. It is knowledge of sensible things which is primary and thus prior to the “order of learning” the philosophical sciences.

This epistemological primacy of knowledge of what we grasp by our senses is the basis for the primacy of the sensible in our language. Language is expressive of knowledge and thus what is first and most easily knowable by us will be what our language first expresses. That is the rule. It is interesting to see its application in the development of the philosophy of nature.

6. Composition of Physical Objects

The concern of natural science is of course natural things, physical objects, which may be described as “what come to be as the result of a change and undergo change.” The first task of natural philosophy, accordingly, is to define and analyze physical objects.

The first thing to notice about this is the assumption that we begin our study of the natural world, not with the presumed ultimate alphabet with which macrocosmic things are spelled, but with a vague and comprehensive concept which encompasses whatever has come to be as the result of a change and undergoes change. The reader of Aquinas becomes familiar with this assumption. Thomas learned it from the beginning of Aristotle's Physics.

The natural way of doing this is to start from the things which are more knowable and clear to us and to proceed towards those which are clearer and more knowable by nature; for the same things are not knowable relatively to us and knowable without qualification. So we must follow this method and advance from what is more obscure by nature, but clearer to us, towards what is more clear and more knowable by nature.

Now what is to us plain and clear at first is rather confused masses, the elements and principles of which become known to us later by analysis. Thus we must advance from universals to particulars; for it is a whole that is more knowable to sense-perception, and a universal is a kind of whole, comprehending many things within it, like parts. Much the same thing happens in the relation of the name to the formula. A name, e.g. ‘Circle’, means vaguely a sort of whole: its definition analyses this into particulars. Similarly a child begins by calling all men father, and all women mother, but later on distinguishes each of them. (Physics, 1, 1.)

Thomas calls the movement from the more to the less general in a science the “order of determination” or specification of the subject matter. The first purchase on natural things is via “physical object” or “natural thing.” The “order of demonstration” involves finding the properties of things as known through this general concept. Then, specifying the subject further, one seeks properties of things known through the less common concepts. For example, in plane geometry, one would begin with plane figure and discover what belongs to it as such. Then one would turn to, say, triangle and seek its properties, after which one would go on to scalene and isosceles. So one will, having determined what is true of things insofar as they are physical objects, go on to seek the properties of things which are physical objects of this kind or that, for example, living and non-living bodies.

Thomas emphasizes those passages in the Aristotelian natural writings which speak of the order of determination, that is, of what considerations come first and are presupposed to those that come later. In several places, Thomas takes great pains to array the Aristotelian natural writings according to this Aristotelian principle, most notably perhaps at the outset of his commentary on Sense and sensibilia. The Physics is the first step in the study of the natural world and exhibits the rule that what is first and most easily known by us are generalities. The language used to express knowledge of such generalities will have, as we shall emphasize, a long career in subsequent inquiries, both in natural philosophy and beyond. What is sometimes thought of as a technical vocabulary, perhaps even as Aristotelian jargon, is seen by Thomas Aquinas as exemplifying the rule that we name things as we know them and that we come to know more difficult things after the easier things and extend the language used to speak of the easier, adjusting it to an ever expanding set of referents.

6.1 Matter and Form

Although natural things are first thought of and analyzed in the most general of terms, there are not of course any general physical objects, only particular ones. Thus, in seeking to discern what is true of anything that has come to be as a result of a change and is subject to change until it ceases to be, Aristotle had to begin with a particular example of change, one so obvious that we would not be distracted by any difficulties in accepting it as such. “A man becomes musical.” Someone acquires a skill he did not previously have. Thomas pores over the analysis Aristotle provides of this instance of change and its product.

The change may be expressed in three ways:

  1. A man becomes musical.
  2. What is not-musical becomes musical.
  3. A not-musical man becomes musical.

These are three different expressions of the same change and they all exhibit the form A becomes B. But change can also be expressed as From A, B comes to be. Could 1, 2 and 3 be restated in that second form? To say “From the not-musical the musical comes to be” and “From a not-musical man the musical comes to be” seem acceptable alternatives, but “From a man musical comes to be” would give us pause. Why? Unlike “A becomes B” the form “From A, B comes to be” suggests that in order for B to emerge, A must cease to be. This grounds the distinction between the grammatical subject of the sentence expressing a change and the subject of the change. The definition of the subject of the change is “that to which the change is attributed and which survives the change.” The grammatical subjects of 2 and 3 do not express the subject of the change, only in 1 is the grammatical subject expressive of the subject of the change.

This makes clear that the different expressions of the change involve two things other than the subject of the change: the characteristics of the subject before (not-musical) and after (musical) the change. These elements of the change get the names that stick from another example, whittling wood. The term for wood in Greek is hyle and the term for shape, the external contours of a thing, is morphe. In English, form, a synonym of shape, is used to express the characteristic that the subject acquires as the result of the change, e.g. musical. The characterization of the subject prior to the change as not having the form is called privation. Using this language as canonical, Aristotle speaks of the subject of the change as its hyle or matter, the character it gains as its morphe or form, and its prior lack of the form as its privation. Any change will involve these three elements: matter, form and privation. The product of a change involves two things: matter and form.

Change takes place in the categories of quality, quantity and place, but in all cases the terminology of matter, form and privation comes to be used. So the terms applied in these different categories will be used analogously. The terms bind together similar but different kinds of change—a subject changing temperature is like a subject changing place or size.

6.2 Substantial Change

The analysis of change and the product of change begins with surface changes. Some enduring thing changes place or quality or quantity. But enduring things like men and trees and horses and the like have also come into being and are destined some day to cease to be. Such things are called substances. It is a given that there are substances and that they come to be and pass away. The question is: Can the analysis of surface change be adjusted and applied to substantial change? What would its subject be? The subject of substantial change is known on an analogy with the subject of incidental or surface change. That is, if substances come to be as the result of a change, and if our analysis of change can apply, there must be a subject of the change. The subject of a surface or incidental change is a substance. The subject of a substantial change cannot be a substance; if it were, the result would be a modification of that substance, that is, an incidental change. But we are trying to understand how a substance itself comes into being as the result of a change. There must be a matter or subject but it cannot be matter in the sense of a substance. In order to signal this, we can call the matter prime matter, first matter. But it is important to recognize that this prime matter is not a substance, and does not exist apart from any particular substance. It is always the matter of some substance that exists.

When the discussion moves on from what may be said of all physical objects as such to an inquiry into living physical things, the analyses build upon those already completed. Thus, “soul” will be defined as the substantial form of living bodies. The peculiar activities of living things will be grouped under headings like nutrition and growth, sense perception and knowing and willing. Since a living thing sometimes manifests an instance of such activities and sometimes does not, they relate to it in the manner of the incidental forms of any physical object. But they are not incidental in the way that we might think of the shade of color of one's skin at any particular time, or the particular height or weight of an individual, since as activities the ability or power to engage in them proceeds from what the substance in question is. Aquinas at times will call them necessary accidents, thus using accident in a sense different from more recent philosophy. While the abilities need not be exercised at any particular time, or may be impeded from exercise by some condition, the substance nonetheless possesses them as long as it exists.

The form such a subject takes on as the result of the change cannot be an incidental form like size or location or temperature. Substances do not become or cease to be substances as a result of changes in these incidental features. As the analysis of incidental change makes clear, the substance previously existed without the form it acquires in the change and it could lose it and still be itself. In a substantial change, the substance itself simply comes to be, or ceases to be. The form in a substantial change must be that which makes the substance to be what it is. Call it substantial form.

The thing to notice about this analysis is that substantial change is spoken of on an analogy with incidental change. The analysis of incidental change is presupposed and regulative. Moreover, the language used to speak of the elements of incidental change are extended to substantial change and altered in meaning so as to avoid equivocation. The philosophical vocabulary arises out of analysis of what is most obvious to us and is then progressively extended to more and more things insofar as the later is made known by appeal to the prior. Thus we can see that matter and form apply in an analogous way to the various kinds of incidental change and then to substantial change. The analysis of form and matter provides a rule for knowing and naming that will characterize Thomas's use of Latin in philosophy and in theology as well.

7. Perception and Thought

Focusing specifically upon perception—that is, seeing, feeling, hearing, and the like—how can we best analyze it? In continuity with what has gone before, the questions are put in this form: How best to analyze coming to see, coming to feel, coming to hear, and the like. Seeing these on the analogy of change as already analyzed, we look for a subject, a privation and a form. The sensing subject is, say, the animal, but the proximate subjects to which they are attributed are the powers of sight, touch, hearing, and the like. An instance of seeing is describable as the power's moving from not seeing to seeing. Since the object of seeing is color, the change from not seeing to seeing issues in the power having the form of color.

Consider an ordinary physical change, a substance acquiring a color. Coming to see a color is not the same kind of physical change as a substance acquiring a color. To be sure, while there are physical changes involved in sensation—the organs are altered in the way physical bodies are—that is not the change involved in perception as such. Consider again, in feeling a body my hand's own temperature is altered by the contact. But feeling cannot be just that, since any two physical bodies that come into contact would undergo a similar alteration of temperature. But not all physical bodies feel the temperature. Feeling the temperature, becoming aware of it, is another sort of change, however much it involves a contemporaneous change in the organs of sense similar to ordinary physical change. Having the color or temperature in this further sense is thus made known and named by reference to physical change. The fundamental difference between the two ways of acquiring a form is this: in a physical change of color, the change produces a new numerical instance of the color. In grasping or sensing a color, a numerically new instance of color does not result.

We have here the basis for talk of immateriality in perception. If the acquiring of a form by matter in physical change results in a new instance of the form and this is not the case with perception, we can make the point that acquiring the form in sensation is not identical to the acquiring of the form by matter in the primary sense. Thus, we both want to speak of the subject of sensation on an analogy with physical change and to distinguish the former from the latter. This is done by speaking of the immaterial reception of a form. Nonetheless, the sense power is implemented in a physical organ, and thus matter for the change of form in sensation in an analogous sense. Because in sensation the sense organ is physically altered and the matter of sensation in this analogous sense, we can say that actual sensation is in some respects physical, and in another not.

But it is important to pay attention again to the order of learning and naming, and what we are justified in saying at this point about the use of the words involved in describing this change. Specifically, the use of ‘immaterial’ is introduced simply to mark the inadequacy of any analysis of sensation confined solely to the physical terms that are fully adequate for analyzing ordinary physical change that does not involve sensation. ‘Immaterial’ means ‘not-material’. But the mere applicability of such a negative term (what Aristotle calls a “negative infinite” term) does not justify us in thinking we have discovered a new property that would be referred to by the term ‘immateriality’—it does not pick out and name a particular kind of property—any more than the mere applicability of ‘not-human’ justifies us in thinking we have discovered a new particular kind of substance.

Now, in his interpretation of Aristotle's De anima Thomas defends a view that was as contested in his own time as it is almost an orphan in our own. Among the tenets of so-called Latin Averroism was the view, first held by Averroes, that the move from perceptive acts to intellection is not one from a lower to a higher set of capacities or faculties of the human soul. Aristotle contrasts intellection with perception and argues that the former does not employ a sense organ because it displays none of the characteristics of perception which does employ an organ. Thus insofar as sensation can be said to be in some respects material and in others immaterial, intellection is said to be completely immaterial. But on the Latin-Averroistic view, Aristotle is not thus referring to another capacity of the human soul, the intellect, but, rather, referring to a separate entity thanks to whose action human beings engage in what we call thinking. But the cause of this, the agent intellect, is not a faculty of the soul. (Aristotle distinguished two intellects, a passive and an active.) The proof for immortality which results from a wholly immaterial activity is therefore a statement about the incorruptibility of this separate entity, not a basis for arguing that each human soul is immortal because it has the capacity to perform immaterial activities. The Latin-Averroists consequently denied that Aristotle taught personal immortality.

Given this consequence, Thomas's adoption of the opposite interpretation—viz. that the agent intellect is, like the passive intellect, a faculty of the human soul—may seem merely an interested desire to enlist Aristotle's support for a position in harmony with Christian belief. Thomas is frequently said to have baptized Aristotle, which seems to mean that he fitted him to the Procrustean bed of Christian doctrine. Of course, the full Christian view is not simply that the soul survives death but that it will be reunited with body, and Thomas nowhere suggests that there is any intimation of this in Aristotle. Oddly enough, it is often friends of St. Thomas who suggest that he used Aristotle and was not chiefly concerned with what Aristotle might actually have intended.

But this is an extraordinary approach to reading Thomas. It would be less of an accusation to say that he got a passage wrong than that he pretended it meant something he knew it did not. However, the important point, all these centuries later, is whether Thomas's reading is or is not supported by the text. When he commented on the De anima, he seems not to be concerned with the flare up in Paris over Latin Averroism. This is the basis for dating the commentary in 1268, before Thomas returned to Paris. The commentary, accordingly, cannot be read as though it were prompted by the controversy. Of course, some might still say that Thomas had long term interests in taming Aristotle to behave in a Christian way. On the contrary, as it happens, during the second Parisian period, in the thick of the Latin-Averroist controversy, Thomas wrote an opusculum dedicated to the question: what did Aristotle actually teach? The work is called in the Latin, De unitate intellectus contra averroistas, On there being only one intellect contra the Averroists. This little work is absolutely essential for assessing the nature of Thomas's Aristotelianism. He provides us with an extended textual analysis to show that the rival interpretation cannot be sustained by the text and that the only coherent reading of the De anima must view the agent and passive intellects as faculties of the human soul. His interpretation may be right or wrong, but the matter must be decided on the basis of textual interpretation, not vague remarks about Thomas's intentions.

8. Body and Soul

Philosophers nowadays will want to know how this account of substance places Aquinas on the question of the relation of body and soul with respect to Dualism and Physicalism. Not easily. Aquinas maintains that the soul is capable of existing apart from the living body after the death of the body. This might suggest that he is a kind of Substance Dualist, the soul being one substance and the body another, with the soul “interacting” as it were with the other substance, the body. However this picture fails to recognize the Aristotelian terms of the account that Aquinas provides of soul and body.

The soul is indeed capable of existence apart from the body death. This capacity is because the actualities of understanding and willing are not the actualities of any bodily organ, but of the human animal as such distinguished by the rational form. However, Aquinas merely concludes from this that the soul is a subsistent after the death of the body. A subsistent is something capable of existing on its own, not in another. But that capacity to exist own its own is not distinctive of a substance. A chair subsists. But on Aquinas' account, it is not a substance. A hand that has been detached from a living body is also a subsistent. (Summa Theologiae Ia75.2 ad1) It is not properly speaking a human hand any longer, because it cannot do the sorts of things that human hands do. Whatever it is, it can exist apart from the substance of which it was formerly a part.

A substance, on the other hand, is something that is both subsistent and complete in a nature—a nature being an intrinsic principle of movement and change in the subject. A detached human hand, while subsistent, is not a substance because it is not complete in a nature. A human hand is defined functionally as part of a human substance. A detached human hand is the remains of a human hand properly speaking, and is only called human analogously. So it is subsistent but not a substance. Similarly, a human soul is a constitutive element of the nature of a human substance. It is the formal principle of a human substance. It is what is specified when we say what the substances is. But it is incomplete. What it is for it to be is to be the formal part of some substance. In that sense it is a principle of a substance, ‘principle’ being a technical term that refers back to the first entry in Aristotle's philosophical lexicon in the Metaphysics, and Aquinas commentary on it, as well as Aquinas On the Principles of Nature. As the principle of a nature, its nature is to be the formal element of a complete substance. Consequently, it is not a substance in its own right, even if it is capable of subsisting apart from the living body. It is because it is naturally incomplete as subsisting apart from the body that Aquinas sees this state as unnatural for it, and an intimation of, but not an argument for, the resurrection of the body.

However, that a principle of a substance should be capable of subsistence while not itself being a substance is no surprise for Aquinas in this account of substance. The body that remains after death is itself subsistent at least for a time. But it is not a substance. It is the material remains of a substance. And so the soul can be called ‘substance’ by analogy, insofar as it is the formal principle of a substance. In English it might be better to call it “substantial” rather than “substance.” And in that regard, it cannot be considered as forming the basis for a kind of substance dualism in Aquinas.

All of this comes out clearly in Aquinas' understanding of the mode of human activity as acting knowingly and willingly. Such acting knowingly and willing is expressed as the rational activity of an animal, that is, as animal activity distinguished formally as rational. Rationality is the distinctive form that intelligence takes in human beings as animals. Rationality involves the back and forth of argument moving from one thing known to another, and advancing in knowledge by such movement. This movement in understanding is necessary for human beings because as animals they only ever have a partial grasp of the natures of things, insofar as their knowledge depends upon always incomplete and partial sensible experience of the world. But it is sense experience, as well as the self movement that springs from it, that places human beings within the genus animal. So human understanding and willing is intrinsically bound up with the activity of an animal, sensation; as a result, rational is the form that it takes in that animal.

One might be tempted then to think that the intellectual principle of the human being is something distinct from the substantial form of the animal, since, as we have seen, thought or intellect does not employ a bodily organ. Aquinas raises this very question in the Summa Theologiae (Ia.76.1), namely, whether the intellectual principle is identical with the substantial form or soul of the human animal. He argues that it is identical. This is an important result, for it establishes that the intellectual principle of human life does not interact with the animal body, as if an efficient cause making the body act in certain ways. On the contrary, the intellectual principle is the substantial form of the activities of the animal body. Elsewhere, echoing Aristotle, Aquinas will say that the soul is not other than the body, but simply one with it as its form, one as act to potency are one. So according to Aquinas, while it is true that the activities of intellect and will are not the actualities of any physical organs, they are nonetheless the activities of the living human animal. It is Socrates the animal who knows and wills, not his mind interacting with his body.

This point comes out clearly in Aquinas' nearly unique position in the so called Plurality of Forms argument that animated the 13th century. (See Summa Theologiae Ia.76.3–4) The so called Pluralists maintained some element of multiplicity in the formal aspects of the human animal, at the very least a form of corporeity for the body and a rational form in addition to it, with a kind of fissure between the rational life of the human animal, and the bodily features of the animal as such. Aquinas says that the Pluralists' position would be correct if the soul were related to the body as the Platonists held, namely, as something other than the body moving it like an efficient cause. But Aquinas has already rejected this position on the soul. So he rejects any such plurality, reaffirming that the intellectual principle of human life just is the substantial form of the body with no intermediaries between soul and body. So again, it follows from his position that rationality is the form that intelligence takes in the life of an animal, and, consequently, that while both angels and God are intelligent beings they are not rational beings. Thus reason is not an activity distinct from animal activity, and related to it as a kind of efficient cause interacting with the body. Rational is the proper formal description of the human animal activity. Reason does not cause eating as something separate from it, and as an efficient cause; on the contrary, human eating is not adequately described formally unless it is described as rational eating. To fail to eat rationally is not a failure in its cause, but in the eating itself. And the human animal is not adequately described except as a rational animal, rational providing not another substance or expression of a fissure between soul or mind and body, but the fully adequate description of the human substance. Reason does not distinguish us from animals; it distinguishes us as animals.

One consequence of this insistence on Aquinas' part is that it is inadequate and inaccurate to speak of activities we share in common with other kinds of creatures. We've already seen that applying ‘intellect’ to human beings and to angels is by analogy. And to be sure, there are descriptions that apply equally to what we do and what other animals do, for example the description “eating” or the description “reproducing.” But these are generic descriptions that do not adequately capture the human act as opposed to the act of a horse or dog, until they are specified formally as rational. So the goods that are the objects of human powers are not specified adequately by such generic descriptions as pursuing eating, reproducing, friendship, etc., as if human beings and other animals pursue the same goods, only humans bring reason to bear upon those same goods.

All of this might lead one to think then that, not being a dualist, Aquinas must be a physicalist, there being only two broad possible positions. Now, the difficulties of providing an adequate account of just what Physicalism is are well known. But suppose we take a minimal characterization of Physicalism as involving the claim that there is some privileged physical science or set of physical sciences, using the term ‘physical’ merely nominally and sociologically as we use it of certain sciences today, that ideally will provide a fully adequate account of all that exists and the fundamental characteristics of reality. Then Aquinas cannot be understood to be a physicalist, since the result of his analysis of perception and thought was to say that these activities are “immaterial,” which was to say, not adequately captured by the kinds of physical descriptions that do adequately account for much of the being and change we observe in the world. There are actually many variations on Dualism and Physicalism in play in recent philosophy. However, the difficulty of placing Aquinas in the broad outlines of that setting ought now to be clear.

9. Beyond Physics

When Aristotle rejected the Platonic Ideas or Forms, accepting some of the arguments against them that Plato himself had devised in the Parmenides, he did not thereby reject the notion that the telos of philosophical enquiry is a wisdom which turns on what man can know of God. The magnificent panorama provided at the beginning of the Metaphysics as gloss on the claim that all men naturally desire to know rises to and culminates in the conception of wisdom as knowledge of all things in their ultimate or first causes.

For much of the twentieth century, Aristotelian studies have been conducted under the influence of Werner Jaeger's evolutionary hypothesis. On this view, Aristotle began as an ardent Platonist for whom the really real lay beyond sensible reality. With maturity, however, came the sober Macedonian empiricism which trained its attention on the things of this world and eschewed all efforts to transcend it. As for the Metaphysics, Jaeger saw it as an amalgam of both theories. The passage just alluded to at the beginning of the work is ascribed to the Platonic phase. Other passages have a far more modest understanding of the range and point of a science over and above natural philosophy and mathematics. Platonice loquendo, there are entities which exist separately from sensible things and they constitute the object of the higher science. The more sober view finds a role for a science beyond natural philosophy and mathematics, but it will deal with things those particular sciences leave unattended, e.g. defense of the first principle of reasoning. But these tasks do not call for, and do not imply, a range of beings over and above sensible things.

Jaeger found both these conceptions of metaphysics juxtaposed in a crucial passage of Book Six.

One might indeed raise the question whether first philosophy is universal, or deals with one genus, i.e. some one kind of being; for not even the mathematical sciences are all alike in this respect,—geometry and astronomy deal with a certain particular kind of thing, while universal mathematics applies alike to all. We answer that if there is no substance other than those which are formed by nature, natural science will be the first science; but if there is an immovable substance, the science of this must be prior and must be first philosophy, and universal in this way, because it is first. And it will belong to this to consider being qua being—both what it is and the attributes which belong to it qua being. (1025a24–33)

Jaeger invites us to see here a monument to a lost hope and an abiding reluctance to bid it a definitive farewell. Aristotle mentions the possibility of an immovable substance, something existing apart from the natural realm. Without such a separate substance, natural philosophy will be first philosophy. If there is such a substance, it will be a kind of being different from material being. The science that studies it will bear on a certain kind of being, immovable substance, immaterial being, not on being as being. It will be a special, not a universal, science. Jaeger sees Aristotle seeking to glue on to the special science the tasks that belong to a universal science, to make a theology into an ontology.

Jaeger's hypothesis dominated interpretations of the Metaphysics until very recently. Giovanni Reale's book had to await English translation before it could have any impact in English circles of interpretation. By that time, people were turning from Jaeger and toward Aristotle neat, but this was only to weary of Jaeger, not to disprove him. Thomas's reading of the Metaphysics makes clear how mistaken Jaeger's claims are.

But let us first lay out Thomas's view of metaphysics. His question is Aristotle's: is there any science beyond natural science and mathematics? If to be and to be material are identical, then the science of being as being will be identical with the science of material being. That is what Aristotle rejects in the passage just quoted. It is in the course of doing natural philosophy that one gains certain knowledge that not everything that is is material. At the end of the Physics, Aristotle argues from the nature of moved movers that they require a first unmoved mover. If successful, this proof establishes that there is a first mover of all moved movers which is not itself material. Furthermore, the discussion of intellect in On the Soul III to which we alluded in the preceding paragraph, points beyond the material world. If the activity of intellect provides a basis for saying that, while the human soul is the substantial form of the body, it can exist apart from the body, that is, survive death, it is an immaterial existent. The Prime Mover and the immortal souls of human beings entail that to be and to be material are not identical. Since these are acquisitions at the limit of natural philosophy, they represent possible objects of inquiry in their own right. This is pre-eminently the case with the Prime Mover. It seems inevitable that there should be a discipline whose principal aim is to know more about the divine. How can it be described?

By common consent, Thomas's early discussion of the way theoretical sciences are distinguished from one another in the course of his exposition of the tractate of Boethius On the Trinity is masterful. The text speaks of three kinds of theoretical science, physics, mathematics and theology, and Thomas invokes the methodology of the Posterior Analytics. A scientia is constituted by a demonstrative syllogism. From a formal point of view, a conclusion follows necessarily from the premises in a well-formed syllogism. Still the conclusion may state a merely contingent truth. What is needed in a demonstrative syllogism is not just the necessity of the consequence but a necessary consequent, and this requires that the premises express necessary truths. That which is necessary cannot be otherwise than as it is; it cannot change. Science thus requires that it bear on immobile things. There is another requirement of the object of speculative or theoretical knowledge which stems from intellection. The activity of the mind, as has been mentioned, is not a material event; it is immaterial. Since it is the mind that knows, science is a mode of its knowing, and will share its nature. Thomas thus states two essential characteristics of the object of speculation, the speculabile: it must be removed both from matter and from motion. If that is the case then insofar as there are formally different ways in which speculabilia can be removed from matter and motion, there will be formally different speculative sciences.

By this analysis, Thomas has provided the necessary background for understanding the text of Boethius but also more importantly that of Aristotle as it is developed in the chapter from which Werner Jaeger quoted in order to display the failure of the Aristotelian project. “Now we must not fail to notice the nature of the essence and of its formula, for, without this, inquiry is but idle. Of things defined, i.e. of essences, some are like snub, and some like concave. And these differ because snub is bound up with matter (for what is snub is a concave nose), while concavity is independent of perceptible matter.” (1025a28–32) The objects of natural philosophy are defined like ‘snub’ and the objects of mathematics like ‘concave’. This makes it clear that the way in which natural things are separated from sensible matter is the way in which the definition common to many things abstracts from the singular characteristics of each. But it is the matter as singular that is the principle of change in things, so the common definition has the requisite necessity for science. This or that man comes to be, but what-it-is-to-be-a-man does not come to be or pass away.

Mathematical things, on the analogy of ‘concave’, do not have sensible matter in their definitions. Lines, points, numbers, triangles—these do not have sensible qualities whether stated universally or singularly. The fact that we define mathematicals without sensible matter does not commit us to the view that mathematicals actually exist apart from sensible matter.

In the commentary on Boethius to which reference has been made, Thomas has early on recalled another fundamental aspect of Aristotle's thought. The objects of thought are either simple or complex, where complex means that one thing is affirmed or denied of another. Knowledge of simples is expressed in a definition, that of the complex in a proposition. Thinking of human nature without thinking of singular characters of this man or that is a matter of definition, not of assertion, as if one were denying that human nature is found in singular matter. So too defining mathematicals without sensible matter is not tantamount to the judgment that mathematicals exist apart from sensible matter. These are both instances of abstraction, where abstraction means to think apart what does not exist apart. Thus it is that the question of metaphysics turns on what Thomas calls separatio. To separate differs from abstraction in this that separation is expressed in a negative judgment, an asserted proposition: this is not that, that this exists apart from that. The relevant separation for metaphysics is the negative judgment that to be and to be material are not the same. That is, there are things which exist apart from matter and motion—not just are defined without, but exist without matter and motion.

What then is the subject of metaphysics? “Subject” here means the subject of the conclusion of the demonstrative syllogism. The discussion of definition in effect bore on the middle terms of demonstrative syllogisms. The suggestion is that formally different modes of defining, with respect to removal from matter and motion, ground the formal difference between types of theoretical science. The subject of a demonstration in natural philosophy is defined without singular but with common or universal sensible matter; the subject of a mathematical demonstration is defined without any sensible matter. How can the subject of metaphysics be expressed? The possibility of the science depends on our knowing that some things exist apart from matter and motion. Mathematics does not presuppose the separate existence of its objects; metaphysics does. Why not then say that metaphysics deals with things separated from matter and motion, that is with a particular kind of being? But that is the not the subject ever assigned to this effort by Aristotle. The methodological reasons can be found in chapter 17 of Book Seven of the Metaphysics: the subject of a science must always be a complex entity. That is why the subject of this discipline is being as being.

Why should we say that, in our desire to learn more about separate substances, we should take as our subject all the things that are? The short answer is this: in order to be a theology, metaphysics must first be an ontology. Separate substance, divine being, is not directly accessible for our inspection or study. We come upon our first secure knowledge of God in the proof of the Prime Mover. Tantalizingly, once seen as a necessary requirement for there being any moved movers, the Prime Mover does not become a thematic object of inquiry in natural philosophy. One obvious reason for this is that such an entity is not an instance of the things which fall under the scope of the science. Knowledge of it comes about obliquely and indirectly. The same restriction is operative when the philosopher turns his culminating attention to the deity. How can he know more about the first cause of things? If the Prime Mover is known through moved movers as his effects, any further knowledge of him must be through his effects. It is by describing the effect as widely as possible that one seeks to come to a knowledge of the first cause unrestricted by the characteristics of mobile things. That characterization is being as being. The subject of metaphysics is being in all its amplitude in order to acquire a knowledge of the cause of being that will be correspondingly unbounded.

10. Philosophical and Scriptural Theology

Earlier we indicated the difference between philosophy and theology in the writings of St. Thomas. That distinction takes theology to mean discourse that takes its rise from the revealed truths of the Bible. But there is also a theology which constitutes the defining telos of philosophical inquiry. In the following passage, Thomas contrasts the two theologies in a way which throws light on what was said in the preceding paragraph.

Thus it is that divine science or theology is of two kinds, one in which divine things are considered not as the subject of the science but as principles of the subject and this is the theology that the philosophers pursue, also called metaphysics. The other considers divine things in themselves as the subject of the science, and this is the theology which is treated in Sacred Scripture. They are both concerned with things which exist separately from matter and motion, but differently, insofar as they are two ways in which something can exist separately from matter and motion: first, such that it is of the definition of the things said to be separate, that they can never exist in matter in motion, as God and the angels are said to be separate from matter and motion; second, such that it is not part of their definition that they exist in matter and motion, because they can exist apart from matter and motion, although sometimes they are found in matter and motion, for example, substance, potency and act are separate from matter and motion because they do not require matter in order to exist as mathematicals do, although they can be understood without sensible matter. Philosophical theology treats of things separate in the second way as its subjects and of things separate in the first way as the principles of its subject. But the theology of Sacred Scripture treats of things separate in the first way as its subjects, although in it some things which exist in matter and motion are considered insofar as they are needed to make the divine manifest. (Exposition of Boethius' On the Trinity, q. 5, a. 4)

Philosophical theology is not some science distinct from metaphysics; it is simply the name that can be given to metaphysics because it appeals to God as the cause of its subject. This may make it seem that knowledge of God is merely a bonus, a tangential consideration; on the contrary, it is the chief aim of the science. But the divine can only be known indirectly, through its effects. For this reason, metaphysics can be viewed as an extended effort to examine substance in order to come to knowledge of the first cause. And given the principle that we name things as we know them (ST Ia.13.1), this can be regarded as a prolonged effort to develop the language with which we speak of God.

10.1 God

Aquinas says that the truth of the proposition God exists is knowable in itself, because the predicate is included in the essence of the subject. But it is not knowable to us, because the essence of God is unknowable to us. He also says that the essence of God is His existence, that he is ipsum esse subsistens, and yet that we cannot know His essence. How is any of this coherent? Mustn't one know what one is talking about to deny anything of it, in particular to deny that it is knowable to us? How can he simultaneously assert what the essence of God is and deny that we know it?

In order to understand why his claims about the existence and essence of God are not incoherent, we need to place them within the context of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. According to Aristotle, one mode of per se predication is that in which the predicate of the proposition is included within the definition of the subject. So if one knew the essential definition of the subject, one would immediately know that a particular proposition is per se true simply by knowing that its predicate is included within that essential definition. This account provides the basis for the notion of “knowable in itself” as a kind of conditional: if one knows the essential definition of some subject, then any proposition in which the predicate is included in the essential definition of the subject is knowable in itself. For instance, Aquinas thinks that that anyone who knows the language will know the truth of a proposition like a whole consists of the sum of its parts. Because the terms are related in this fashion and so fundamental in the language, no special knowledge is necessary to grasp its truth. Such a proposition is thus knowable in itself and to us.

However, clearly this conditional account leaves open the possibility of subjects in which the essential definition is either unknown or even unknowable. For instance, if we suppose that H2O is the essential definition of water, we have to recognize that there will be many who will not know it. It will not be immediately “known to us,” but require learning. No doubt we can still refer to water in statements about it because the term ‘water’ has a nominal definition, clear-potable-odorless etc., used by the community to refer to what is in fact H2O. So that water is H2O will be knowable in itself, even if unknowable to us, until we engage in Chemistry. Consider the mind. Clearly we use the term 'mind' meaningfully in any number of sentences. But perhaps, as Colin McGinn has argued, the actual nature of mind is incomprehensible to limited minds such as ours. In that case it might be knowable in itself, and yet strictly unknowable to us. Thus the distinction between what is knowable in itself and what is knowable to us is not incoherent. It is based upon the difference between the nominal definition of the meaning of a term used in language, and the real or essential definition of a subject referred to by that term, as well as the ease with which an essential definition may be known.

What of the claims that the essence of God is not just unknown to us, but unknowable to us, that the essence of God is His existence, and that He is ipsum esse subsistens? Don't these remain jointly inconsistent and thus incoherent, even if the underlying distinction is not. No. In claiming that the essence of God is not knowable to us, Aquinas is talking about its accessibility to philosophical inquiry. The human mind of itself is proportioned to knowing material things. It can only know immaterial things insofar as causal arguments can be made to posit the existence of such things as necessary to the explanation of material things--causes that are only appealed to when one has excluded the possibility of a material explanation of the phenomenon. But we've already seen that to claim that something is immaterial is not to know any property of it, much less its essence. Still, it remains available to Aquinas to claim that while the knowledge of the essence of God is unknowable to philosophy, it is known to us by Revelation. Indeed, he appeals to God's revelation to Moses on Sinai to establish the claim that God's essence is ipsum esse subsistens. And Christians believe that God further discloses His essence as consisting of three divine persons who are one being. Here, in knowing the essence of God we have an example of something that is known only through Revelation. It is not something that can be known by both Revelation and Philosophy. So the essence of God is knowable in itself, and also to the learned. But the learned are not the philosophers. Rather they are all those who know it by faith in God's revelation.

So, can the existence of God be philosophically demonstrated? If God's essence is His existence, and His essence remains in principle philosophically unknowable to us, how could it be demonstrated? In fact, Aquinas claims that it can be demonstrated that there is a god, and that there is only one god. That God's essence remains in principle philosophically unknowable to us is the basis for Aquinas' denial that the existence of God can be demonstrated a priori. And any reliance upon knowledge of the essence that is only known to us by faith would by that fact cease to be properly philosophical. However, we have seen that Aquinas relies upon the distinction between nominal definitions of terms and essential definitions of the subjects referred to by those terms. To demonstrate the existence of a god one may use nominal definitions that appeal to a god as the cause of various phenomena. This is to argue a posteriori. The appeal to these nominal definitions forms the basis for Aquinas' Five Ways (Summa Theologiae, Ia.2.3) all of which end with some claim about how the term ‘god’ is used.

Again, some will claim that Aquinas isn't really interested in proving the existence of God in these Five Ways. After all, he already knows the existence of God by faith, and he is writing a theological work for beginners. What need is there of proving the existence of something he already knows exists? The Ways are very sketchy, and don't even necessarily conclude to a single being, much less God or the Christian God. In addition, Aquinas claims that God's essence is his existence and that we cannot know His essence, so we cannot know His existence. Aquinas must really intend the Five Ways as less than proofs; they are more like incomplete propaedeutic considerations for thinking adequately about God in Sacred Theology. In effect, Aquinas doesn't think philosophy can in fact demonstrate the existence of God.

But as elsewhere these claims are ambiguous and suffer at the hands of Aquinas' own texts. In the first place, the objection that he already knows by faith that God exists has some merit in it, if we understand it as directed at a reading of Aquinas that would have him attempting a foundational enterprise of grounding religious faith in what is rationally demonstrable by philosophy. But that reading is anachronistic, and does not attend to the context of Summa Theologiae. There is no reason to think that Aquinas thinks the proofs are necessary for the rationality of religious faith. They are part of the enterprise of showing that Sacra Doctrina meets the condition of a science as described by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics, an issue that is different from the question of the broad rationality of religious faith.

In addition, the objections end up denying what Aquinas writes immediately before the Five Ways—that the existence of a god is “demonstrable.” (Summa Theologiae, Ia.2.2) And his introduction of the Five Ways begins by saying that the existence of a god can be “proved” in Five Ways. To counter the objection that he must mean something informal here by [special character:ldquo]demonstrate” and “prove”, one need only recognize the explicit use of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics to sort through the question. He cites Aristotle's distinction between demonstrating the existence of some subject, and going on to demonstrate properties of that subject by appeal to the essence of the subject as cause of those properties. The first kind of demonstration is called demonstration quia, the second demonstration propter quid. In order to have any science at all, the subject matter must exist. So demonstration quia must precede demonstration propter quid. If you want to have a science of unicorns, you have to show me that there is at least one unicorn to be studied. There is no science of what does not exist. So there are two demonstrative stages in any science, the demonstration of the existence of the subject (quia), and the demonstration of the properties of the subject through its essence (propter quid). Aquinas' denial that the essence of God can be known philosophically is a denial that one can have propter quid scientific understanding of God through philosophy. It is not a denial that there can be demonstration quia of the existence of a god. There is no reason to deny that Aquinas thinks the Five Ways are proofs or demonstrations in the most robust sense, namely that which he appeals to as set out by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics.

Notice however the back and forth between the use of ‘God’ as a proper name and the use of ‘god’ as a common noun. One source of the ambiguity in the objections come about because it is claimed that Aquinas does not think one can demonstrate the existence of God. But in terms of the Posterior Analytics one cannot demonstrate the existence of anything under a proper name. One can point at Socrates, and say “see, Socrates is alive.” One cannot do that with God. In addition, one cannot give a formal argument for Socrates existence using ‘Socrates’. One can only demonstrate in the relevant sense using common nouns, since such nouns are the only ones that have definitions, either nominal or essential. So strictly speaking it is true that Aquinas doesn't think one can demonstrate the existence of God in the Five Ways. But he doesn't claim that one can. He recognizes the difference between ‘God’ used as a proper noun, and ‘god’ used as a common noun. (Summa Theologiae Ia.13.9) The ambiguity is pronounced in Latin which lacks the indefinite article ‘a’, where in English we can disambiguate between ‘God’ and ‘a god’. The situation is exacerbated by translations that simply translate ‘deus’ in the Ways as ‘God’ in English. In the Five Ways, he does not use ‘god’as a proper name, but as a common noun having five different nominal definitions. So each of the ways concludes that there is “a god.” So it is also true that the Five Ways do not as such prove that there is only one god. But it is for that reason that Aquinas himself thinks one must actually argue additionally that a god must be utterly unique, and thus that there can be only one, which he does several questions after the Five Ways(Summa Theologiae Ia.11). Of course, once the utter uniqueness of a god has been shown, one can begin to use “God” as a proper name to refer to that utterly unique being.

It is the utter uniqueness and singularity of a god that undermines the objection that whatever the philosophical arguments terminate in, it is not the god of Judaism, Christianity, and Islam, who is only known by faith. That is simply to deny Aquinas claim that the god Jews, Christians, and Muslims believe in can be known, but only partially by philosophical analysis. If the demonstrations work, as Aquinas thinks they do, what other god would the Jew, Christians, and Muslims believe in?

Finally, the sketchy character of the Ways reflects the fact that they are directed at beginning students. However the audience of beginners that Aquinas has in mind are not beginners in Philosophy. They are beginners in Sacra Doctrina. As we have seen, in the medieval educational setting such beginners would be thoroughly steeped in the philosophical disciplines before ever being allowed to study Sacra Doctrina. So Aquinas could expect his readers to know the much more extensive and complete arguments he was gesturing at with the Five Ways, arguments to be found in detail in other figures like Aristotle, Avicenna, and so on, as well as in other works of his own, the Summa Contra Gentiles for example. In short, even if the Five Ways are judged to be unsound demonstrations, a judgment that requires close analysis and examination of the filled out arguments, there is no reason to suggest that Thomas took them any less seriously as demonstrations or proofs in the fullest sense.

Now, even though there can be no demonstration propter quid of God's properties, this does not mean that philosophical theology is left with a bare knowledge of the existence of God, and nothing more. The second stage of science will go on, but it will go on in a mode deeply indebted to Pseudo-Dionysias and Neoplatonism with the approach often called the “via negativa.” Instead of arguing positively from the essence of God to His properties, one will argue from God's effects, particularly the perfections of creatures that do not of necessity involve material embodiment, to the affirmation that God possesses these perfections. However, recognizing that the way in which God possesses these perfections must be different from the way in which creatures possess them, one must deny that God has them in the creaturely mode. Instead He must possess them in a “super eminent” fashion that we cannot comprehend. So, while on the basis of effect to cause arguments we can say that God is just, wise, good, perfect, and so on, we do not know what it is for God to be just, wise, good, and perfect. We end up denying of God the creaturely mode of these perfections. In this way God is approached negatively by denying things of Him rather than by directly knowing what God is. This account relies heavily upon the use of analogous names in talking about God and creatures.

10.2 Analogous Names

Aristotle spoke of “things said in many ways”, a notable instance of which is “being.” One of the difficulties with assigning being, or being as being as the subject of a science is that a subject must be univocally common to the things that fall under it. But ‘being’ is not univocal, as it has a plurality of meanings. Aristotle solved this problem with his account of “things said in many ways,” by observing that while they have many meanings, these form an ordered set with one of the meanings as primary and regulative. Substance is being in the primary sense, which is why the science of being as being is effectively a science of substance. Thomas's term for such names is analogy: ‘being’ is an analogous term and its primary analogate is substance.

In the crucial middle books of the Metaphysics—Seven and Eight—we have an analysis of substance which takes off from material substance, which is a compound of matter and form, and arrives at a notion of substance as form alone. This definition does not fit material substance, of course, but it is devised in order to be able to apply the term substance to the immaterial things whose existence has been established in natural philosophy. This extension of names whose natural habitat is sensible things to God is another instance of analogous naming for Aquinas. Names common to God and creatures bring out another feature of our knowing. If we ask what the primary analogate of names common to God and creatures is, the answer is: the meaning of the term as it applies to creatures. The word must be refined before it can be applied to God and this means the formation of an extended meaning which leans on the primary meaning for its intelligibility.

Consider the example of ‘wise.’ Both men and God are said to be wise. What can we mean when we say that God is wise? Not the same thing as when we say that Socrates is wise. Socrates became wise and wisdom is a trait which with age and forgetfulness he could lose. Thus to be Socrates and to be wise are not the same thing. But in the case of God, ‘wise’ does not signify some incidental property He might or might not have. This is captured by noting that while we say God is wise, we also say he is wisdom. This suffices to indicate the way in which the meaning of the term as applied to God involves negating features of its meaning as it applies to men.

If God is thus named secondarily by the common name, so that the creature is primarily named by it, nonetheless God's wisdom is the cause and source of human wisdom. Ontologically, God is primary and the creature secondary. Names analogously common to God and creature thus underscore the way in which what comes to be known first for us is not first in reality, and what is first in reality is not first in our knowledge.

10.3 Essence and Existence

It is evident that material substances exist contingently. They come into being and they pass out of being. While they exist, their existing is not what they are. Thomas accepts from Boethius that it is self-evident that what a thing is and its existing differ (diversum est esse et id quod est). Material things depend upon causes to exist, both to become and to be. There is no need to dwell on this except insofar as it provides a springboard to speak of immaterial substance. Only in God is it the case that what he is and his existing are identical: God is existence. The phrase Thomas uses to express this is ipsum esse subsistens. Of course this is paradoxical. Existence is the actuality of a substance, not itself something subsistent. This is true with material substances. But when we ask what we mean by saying that God exists, we have to negate aspects of material existence in order to avoid speaking of Him as if he were a contingent being.

The problem that Thomas now faces is how to speak of the immaterial substances which are less than God although superior to material substances, that is, angels. For a material thing to exist is for its form actually to inhere in its matter. But what is it for a pure form to exist? Since immaterial substances less than God are dependent on the divine causality in order to exist, existing cannot be what they are, of their essence. In short, in angels too there is a distinction of essence and existence. Thomas notes that a created separate substance is what it is and not another thing: that is, it has the perfection it has, but not unlimited perfection. It is a being of a kind, not being as such. Gabriel is perfect as to his nature, but he lacks the perfection of being Raphael or Michael. Form thus operates as a restriction on existence as such. In God alone is there unrestricted existence; he is existence, ipsum esse subsistens. And here we have an argument for the fact that God's essence is his existence. And yet it remains true that while we know the fact, we do not know the why of the fact because the knowledge of God's essence remains unknown to us.

11. Moral Doctrine

When Aristotle sought to isolate the human good, he employed the so-called function argument. If one knows what a carpenter is or does he has the criteria for recognizing a good carpenter. So too with bank-tellers, golfers, brain surgeons and locksmiths. If then man as such has a function, we will have a basis for deciding whether someone is a good human being. But what could this function be? Just as we do not appraise carpenters on the basis of their golf game or golfers on the basis of their being able to pick locks, we will not want to appraise the human agent on an incidental basis. So too we do not appraise the carpenter in terms of his weight, the condition of his lungs or his taste buds. No more would we appraise a human being on the basis of activities similar to those engaged in by non-human animals. The activity that sets the human agent apart from all others is rational activity. The human agent acts knowingly and willingly. If this is the human function, the human being who performs it well will be a good person and be happy.

Now Aquinas distinguishes in the Summa Theologiae between the imperfect happiness of this life and the perfect happiness of the next life in beatitude or union with God. And on the basis of this distinction some will argue that Aquinas ultimately finds Aristotle's function argument unsatisfying, insofar as the result of the function argument is supposed to be the claim that happiness consists in a complete life lived in accord with reason and virtue. And here again it will be claimed that Aquinas in some sense rejects the fundamentals of the Aristotelian account. Insofar as he describes the life in accord with reason and virtue in this life as imperfect, he must be suggesting that is is in some sense faulty, not true or real happiness. Real happiness is something other.

But such an interpretation fails on a number of counts. In the first place it misunderstands Aquinas' use of ‘imperfect’ which does not mean “faulty” or “false”. It can mean “not as great” by comparison, as in the claim that human beings are imperfect with regard to the angels. This claim is not meant to suggest that human beings are faulty or false angels; it simply means that their perfection is not as great in the scale of being as that of the angels. It can also mean incomplete in the constitution of some overall good. So the pursuit of some limited good, say education, is imperfect because not the complete human good, even though it is partially constitutive of the human good. But it is certainly not a faulty or false human good.

In the second place, such a claim about Aquinas has to confront his own understanding of Aristotle. Aquinas claims that Aristotle understood that a complete life in accord with reason and virtue in this life is incomplete or imperfect happiness. (See his commentary on the Nichomachean Ethics, Book 1, lect. 16, #200–202). Indeed, Aristotle himself says that perfect happiness is to be associated with the divine. (Nichomachean Ethics, 1099b9–13) Thus Aquinas does not claim for himself the distinction between imperfect and perfect happiness, but attributes it to Aristotle. And so his use of it in the Summa Theologiae cannot be taken to be a rejection of the analysis Aristotle provides of the formal characteristics of happiness.

Obviously, one may fault Aquinas for his understanding of Aristotle. But the claim that he misinterprets Aristotle is no argument that he rejects Aristotle. In fact, his interpretation of Aristotle on imperfect and perfect happiness embodies the thesis he expresses in the Summa Theologiae that we saw above. The philosophers are capable of grasping some of the things that are constitutive of or necessary for perfect happiness in beatitude. Revelation concerning even those matters they can grasp is necessary, because what they have grasped takes a long time, is very difficult, and may be filled with errors. God in his mercy makes these things known in revelation in order that perfect happiness may be attained. And yet, Aquinas never abandons the fundamental affirmation of the human capacity to understand apart from revelation the nature of happiness in formal terms and what constitutes its imperfect status in this life, even as its perfect embodiment in the next remains unattainable to philosophy without the resources of faith.

Many have come to this point, pulse quickened by the possibilities of the function-argument, only to be gripped with doubt at this final application of it. Rational activity seems too unmanageable a description to permit a function-analysis of it. Of course Aristotle agrees, having made the point himself. Rational activity is said in many ways or, as Thomas would put it, it is an analogous term. It covers an ordered set of instances. There is the activity of reason as such, there is the activity of reason in its directive or practical capacity, and there are bodily movements and the like which are rational insofar as rational provides the adequate formal description of them. If the virtue of a function is to perform it well, the analogy of “rational activity” makes clear that there is a plurality of virtues. Moral virtues are habits of appetite brought about by the direction of reason. Temperance is to seek pleasure rationally, courage is to react to the threat of harm rationally. The virtues of practical intellect are art and prudence; the virtues of theoretical intellect are insight, science and wisdom.

All this and much more enters into Thomas's moral teaching. Thomas will distinguish acts of a man from human acts, the former being activities truly found in human agents but also found in other non-human agents too. For example, the act of a man might be as important as the beating of his heart or or as trivial as the nervous tapping of his fingers. The human act is one which proceeds from reason and will. Since the human act by definition is the pursuit of a known good, the question arises as to the relationship between the objects of the myriad acts that humans perform. Is there some over-all good sought by human agents? Is there an ultimate end of human action?

In commenting on chapter two of Book One of the Nicomachean Ethics where Aristotle argues for there being an ultimate end, Thomas points out that the argument is actually a series of reductiones ad absurdum. That is, the denial of an ultimate end of human action reduces to the claim that there is no end to human seeking at all, that it is pointless. This analysis has not gotten the attention it deserves: the implication is that it is self-evident that there is an ultimate end which is why denials of it must flounder in incoherence. The argument for an ultimate end that Thomas puts forth in the Summa theologiae is somewhat different. Any action aims at some good. A particular good by definition shares in and is not identical with goodness itself. What binds together all the acts that humans perform is the overarching goodness they seek in this, that and the other thing. That over arching goodness, what Thomas calls the ratio bonitatis, is the ultimate end. It follows that anything a human agent does is done for the sake of the ultimate end.

This dissatisfies because we feel we are owed a richer account of goodness. After all, human agents differ insofar as they have different notions of what goodness is. Fame, wealth, pleasure, power, and so on seem to function as the dominant purpose of different persons. Thomas could scarcely overlook this, let alone deny it. Can his earlier position on the unity of the ultimate end still stand? The fact that there are false or inadequate identifications of goodness does not mean that there is not a true and adequate account of what is perfecting or fulfilling of human agents. Everyone acts on the supposition that what he does will contribute to his overall good; one's overall good is the ultimate reason for doing anything. But not everything one does under this aegis actually contributes to one's overall good. Thus in one sense there is one and the same ultimate end for every human agent—the integral human good—and there are correct and mistaken notions of what actually constitutes this integral good.

This may seem like an empty claim, but it provides a basis on which to proceed. If indeed every human agent acts for the sake of his overall good, the discussion can turn to whether or not what he here and now pursues, or his general theory of what constitutes the overall good, can withstand scrutiny. It is not necessary to persuade anyone that he ought to pursue the ultimate end in the sense of his overall good. What else would he pursue? But if one is persuaded that what he pursues does not contribute to his overall good, he already has reasons for changing his ways.

11.1 Natural Law

Thomas's reading of Aristotle's argument for the ultimate end as a reductio and his own claim that in one sense of it everyone pursues the ultimate end since one chooses whatever he chooses sub ratione boni and as conducive to or a constituent of his fulfillment and perfection, tell us something important about Thomas's mode of procedure. We said earlier that philosophy begins from pre-philosophical principles already had by everyone. In the moral order, it is essential that one uncover the starting point, the latent presupposition of any action, clarify it and proceed from there. This procedure is equally manifest in Thomas's treatment of what he calls natural law.

What is natural law? One description of it is: the peculiarly human participation in the eternal law, in providence. All creatures are ordered to an end, have natures whose fulfillment is what it is because of those natures. It is not peculiar to man that he is fashioned so as to find his good in the fulfillment of his nature. That is true of anything. But other things are ordered to ends of which they themselves are not conscious. It is peculiar to man that he becomes aware of the good and freely directs himself to it. Of course man is not free to choose the good—any choice is a choice of the good. As to what is really as opposed to only apparently his good, he is not free to make that what it is. He is free to direct himself or not to his true end, however.

A second description of natural law is: the first principles or starting points of practical reasoning. To indicate what he means by this, Thomas invokes the analogy of the starting points of reasoning as such. We have already mentioned the distinction between knowledge of the simple and knowledge of the complex. The former is a concept and is expressed in a definition or description. The latter is an affirmation or negation of one thing of another. There is something which is first in each of these orders. That is, Thomas holds that there is a conception which is prior to and presupposed by all other conceptions and a judgment that is prior to and presupposed by all other judgments. Since knowledge is expressed by language, this seems to come down to the assertion that there is a first word that everyone utters and a first statement that would appear in everyone's baby book on the appropriate page. But surely that is false. So what does Thomas mean?

He says that our first conception is of being, of that which is, and our first judgment is that you cannot affirm and deny the same thing in the same sense simultaneously. Since few if any humans first utter ‘being’ or its equivalent and no one fashions as his first enunciation the principle of contradiction, facts as known to Thomas as ourselves, his meaning must be more subtle. It is this. Whatever concept one first forms and expresses verbally—Mama, hot, whatever‘being’ is a specification or an instance of that which is. Aristotle has observed that children at first call all men father and all women mother. The terms then function as generic for any male or female. Even more basically, each presupposes that what is generically grasped is an instance of being. Being is prior not because it is grasped absolutely, without reference to this being or that. It is some particular being that is first of all grasped and however it is named it will mean minimally something that is.

So too with regard to the first judgment. Children express their recognition of this principle when they disagree over the location of some quite specific thing, say a baseball mitt. One accuses the other of taking it. You did. I didn't. You did. I didn't. A fundamental disagreement. But what they are agreed on is that if it were true that one did it could not simultaneously and in the same sense be true that he did not. The principle is latent in, implicit in, any concrete judgment just as being is involved in any other conception.

It is on an analogy with these starting points of thinking as such that Thomas develops what he means by natural law. In the practical order there is a first concept analogous to being in the theoretical order and it is the good. The good means what is sought as fulfilling of the seeker. The first practical judgment is: the good should be done and pursued and evil avoided. Any other practical judgment is a specification of this one and thus includes it. Natural Law consists of this first judgment and other most general ones that are beyond contest. These will be fashioned with reference to constituents of our complete good—existence, food, drink, sex and family, society, desire to know. We have natural inclinations to such goods. Natural law precepts concerning them refer the objects of natural inclinations to our overall or integral good, which they specify.

Most moral judgments are true, if true, only by and large. They express means to achieve our overall good. But because there is not a necessary connection between the means and end, they can hold only for the most part. Thus there are innumerable ways in which men lead their lives in keeping with the ultimate end. Not all means are necessarily related to the end. Moral philosophy reposes on natural law precepts as common presuppositions, but its advice will be true only in the main.

It might be noted that when Thomas, following Aristotle, says that man is by nature a social or political animal, he does not mean that each of us has a tendency to enter into social contracts or the like. The natural in this sense is what is not chosen, but given, and what is given about human life is that we are in the first place born into the community of the family, are dependent on it for years in order to survive, and that we flourish as human beings within various larger social and political communities. The moral consists in behaving well in these given settings.

12. Thomism

Thomas's teaching came under attack, largely by Franciscans, immediately after his death. Dominicans responded. This had the effect of making Dominicans Thomists and Franciscans non–Thomists—Bonaventurians, Scotists, Ockhamists. The Jesuits were founded after the Reformation and they tended to be Thomists, often with a Suarezian twist.

When in 1879 Leo XIII issued the encyclical Aeterni Patris calling for the revival of the study of Thomas Aquinas, he was not directing his readers to one school as opposed to others. Thomas was put forward as the paladin of philosophy in its true sense, as over and against the vagaries of modern thought since Descartes. The response to Leo's call was global and sustained. New journals and learned societies were founded, curricula were reshaped to benefit from the thought of Thomas and this not simply in seminaries and pontifical universities but throughout the world in colleges and universities. Such giants as Jacques Maritain and Etienne Gilson may be taken to symbolize the best of this Thomistic revival.

Vatican II, the ecumenical council that met from 1962–1965 drew this stage of the Thomistic Revival to a close. It was widely held that the Council had dethroned Thomas in favor of unnamed contemporary philosophers. (When they were named, quarrels began.) In the post-conciliar period, Catholics have adopted many contemporary philosophical trends with mixed results, as the speed with which such trends come and go has appeared to accelerate, without obvious lasting results. Now with the vogue of the notion that modernity has failed and the Enlightenment Project come a cropper, many, Catholics and non-Catholics alike, are turning to Thomas as a spur or foil for their thinking. In 1998 John Paul II issued an encyclical called Fides et Ratio. In its reaffirmation of the importance of Aquinas, it may be regarded as the charter of the Thomism of the third millennium.


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