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Medieval Theories of Singular Terms

First published Thu Sep 25, 2003; substantive revision Fri Jun 30, 2006

A singular term, such as a proper name or a demonstrative pronoun, is a term that signifies exactly one individual thing. The existence of singular terms raises various questions about how they function within a language. Do proper names have a sense as well as a referent? If they do have a sense, what is it, and how do they acquire it? How is this sense transmitted from one speaker to another? Is a demonstrative pronoun purely referential? If one believes in a language of thought, or mental language, as did many medieval thinkers, what is the mental correlate of a singular term? While medieval thinkers did not produce any treatises devoted to singular terms, their writings do contain answers to these questions, or at least, answers to similar questions that they themselves posed in the context of their own semantic theories. To discover medieval views of singular terms, one must consult a variety of sources from grammar, logic, metaphysics, and even theology. Priscian, the semantically-oriented grammarian who wrote at the beginning of the sixth century A.D., was particularly influential, and his views were repeated by many later grammarians, as well as by logicians and theologians. Porphyry's Isagoge, or introduction to Aristotle's Categories, was another important source, especially as his discussion allowed commentators to relate linguistic problems to metaphysical problems concerning the nature of the individual named by a singular term. Commentaries on Aristotle's Categories discussed singular terms as examples of equivocal terms, those having more than one sense. Later in the Middle Ages and at the beginning of the sixteenth century, singular terms were discussed in treatises devoted to types of terms. Paul of Venice's treatise is worthy of special mention here, despite the difficulty of construing many of his claims. Because the use of singular terms was tied to singular concepts, they were also discussed in commentaries on Aristotle's Physics, De anima, and Metaphysics. The commentaries of John Buridan (d. after 1358) provide the richest and most coherent medieval theory, and one which remained influential into the sixteenth century. During the sixteenth century, singular concepts remained a subject of discussion in commentaries on Aristotle's Physics and De anima, but unfortunately the logicians who came after Domingo de Soto (1494-1560) reverted to a very cursory treatment of singular terms. We have to wait for the nineteenth and twentieth centuries for a rediscovery of some of the problems that had exercised John Buridan in the fourteenth century.

1. Signification and Concepts

In order to understand medieval theories of singular terms, we need to consider medieval semantics, and why the question of singular terms was so closely linked to the issue of singular concepts.

The central semantic notion for medieval authors was that of signification, which must not be identified with the notion of meaning for two reasons. First, the meaning of a term is not an entity to which the term is related in some way, but one can say that an utterance signifies or makes known an entity, whether conceptual or real, universal or particular. Moreover, meaning is not transitive, but signification is. A spoken word was said to be a conventional sign of a concept, which in turn, at least for later authors, was a natural sign of a thing, and so spoken words were said to be at least indirect signs of things. This is not to deny that medieval thinkers had a general notion of meaning. They did talk about sense (sensus), about the thought or content (sententia) of a phrase, and about the force of a word (vis verbi), and they often used the word ‘significatio’ itself along with its cognates quite widely. When they were discussing indexicals, especially personal pronouns and demonstratives, they drew a distinction between a term's general signification or what Kaplan has called ‘character’ and its particular signification, that is, its ‘content’ or contribution to what is actually said on a particular occasion of use.

If we take signification in a narrow sense, as a technical notion, we find that there were two not entirely compatible approaches, each based on a sentence from Aristotle, and each emphasizing the role of concepts, whether the hearer's or the speaker's. According to the first approach, based on De interpretatione 16b19-21, to signify is to generate or establish an understanding. This definition places emphasis not on the speaker, but on the hearer. So long as the hearer can acquire some understanding through hearing, the utterance is significant even if the speaker is incapable of rational, abstract, thought, and even if the speaker has no intention of conveying a message. The second and most influential approach tied the significative power of an utterance to its making known a concept. The crucial text here is De interpretatione 16a3-4, read as saying, “Spoken words are signs of concepts.” This supports the view that it is the speaker's intellectual capacity and intentions that are crucial to significant utterance.

Aristotle, as interpreted by medieval commentators, had gone on to say that concepts were similitudes or signs of things, and this raised the question of what is meant by ‘thing’. In other words, what is it that we understand when an utterance such as ‘man’ or ‘animal’ establishes an understanding? The usual assumption from Boethius at least until the end of the thirteenth century was that the understanding is of some kind of universal, an essence or common nature, and when logicians asked whether spoken words primarily signified concepts or things, the issue was whether concepts or common natures should be taken as the primary significates of an utterance. If the concept was said to be the primary significate, then the common nature was the secondary significate. If the common nature was said to be the primary significate, then individuals having that nature were often said to be the secondary significates. The issue was complicated by various views about the nature of concepts as opposed to intelligible species, and about the status of common natures, and their precise relation to individuals, but fortunately these details do not concern us here. So long as common natures in some sense played a role in the signification of common nouns, there was a strong temptation to speak as if there are individual natures which play a similar role in the signification of singular terms. From Boethius on, there are many references to individual forms, and such terms as Socrateity (Socrateitas) and Platonicity (Platonitas) were frequently used, even by Thomas Aquinas. On the other hand, the Aristotelian insistence, taken up by Aquinas in particular, that the intellect cannot grasp individuals as such made the explanation of how we can understand Socrates more complicated. There did not seem to be a concept of Socrateity that corresponded to the form spoken of. Moreover, the very notion of an individual nature seemed incompatible with Aristotelianism. As a result, some thinkers in the second half of the thirteenth century held that what the grammarian counts as a proper name is not properly a name, since it does not signify a common nature.

The terms of the debate were to change completely in the fourteenth century, first with the insistence of John Duns Scotus, like others before him, that individuals can be grasped by the intellect, but more especially with the rise of nominalism, according to which all that exists are individual things, and that only concepts can be common or universal. The question whether words primarily signify concepts or things was now construed as the question: does a word signify an individual thing in the world directly, or does it signify first the concept which is a necessary condition for signification? John Buridan and his near contemporary William Ockham differed on this issue. Buridan held that words first signify concepts, because only then can we explain why terms such as ‘being’ and ‘one’ which have the same extension nonetheless differ in signification. Ockham preferred to say that words signify only individual things and are subordinated to concepts without signifying them. Both thinkers are noteworthy for their insistence that the concept itself was a sign which plays a crucial intermediary role in language production and understanding and that concepts are the terms of a fully-fledged mental language. Moreover, the concept as sign was defined as a formal representation of its object. However one construes the notion of representation here (and any crude pictorial theory can be ruled out), it is clear that conceptual representation was taken to involve some level of generality, and so there is an obvious problem where singular concepts are concerned. Yet, given John Buridan's claim that a spoken term cannot be called universal or singular unless it corresponds to a universal or singular concept, we must have singular concepts if we have any genuine singular terms. As we shall see in §9, Buridan introduces an extra condition for the singular concept, while allowing it to have a certain kind of generality.

Concepts were said to signify naturally, and to have the same signification for all thinkers, or at least all thinkers with the same experience, but spoken terms, and the written terms which were subordinated to them, were thought to acquire their signification by some original act of imposition. While most authors were careful not to commit themselves to any account of how this original imposition actually occurs, and while it was recognized that words such as ‘person’ and ‘spirit’ (both important in theological contexts) do acquire new connotations, it was generally supposed that the signification of common nouns within a given conventional language remains stable. Proper names were both easier and more difficult to account for. They were easier because there are easily ascertainable instances of original imposition, particularly through Christian baptism, though Paul of Venice explicitly recognized that non-Christians have equivalent name-giving ceremonies. They were more difficult because it is not entirely plausible to account for the stability of their signification by appeal to standard definitions.

2. Porphyry's Classification of Singular Terms

Discussions of singular terms were frequently related to a passage from Porphyry's Isagoge. In the version used by medieval logicians, Porphyry writes: “Individual is said of one particular alone. Socrates is said to be individual, and this white <thing>, and this approaching <person>, and son of Sophroniscus, if Socrates be his only son. Such things are said to be individuals, since each of them consists of properties whose collection will never be the same in another.”

The last sentence of Porphyry's text ties the ontological notion of an individual to a collection of properties, and as a corollary, it can be taken to tie the notion of an individual term to a descriptive phrase. However, there was fairly general agreement that a collection of properties could not constitute an individual, and there seems to have been no attempt to make the description of these properties into a definition of the individual, or to see them as providing the primary signification of singular terms. In the twelfth century, Abelard pointed out at some length in his Dialectica that Socrates is the name of an individual substance and that the accidents associated with him by some description cannot enter into the imposition of the signification of the name, else the name would be equivocal through time. Socrates was called Socrates before he became a poet (or musician) and after he ceased to be the son of Sophroniscus (presumably by the latter's death). The notion that one could define an individual by giving a list of common properties was also ruled out by Priscian's account of names (see §4), and the resulting distinction between primary and secondary signification.

The main part of Porphyry's text offered medieval logicians the basis for a classification of three types of singular term. First, there is the determinate individual, represented by the proper name ‘Socrates’. Everyone realized that different people could have the same name, but it is important to note that ‘Socrates’ said of two different people was a standard example of an equivocal term, a word with two unrelated significations (see §5). For each individual named ‘Socrates’, there had to be a specific semantic convention associating that individual with that name-type. John Buridan remarked that even if there were a thousand other people called John, all entirely similar to him, the name ‘John’ as bestowed on Buridan would signify only Buridan and no one else.

The second type of singular term is the vague individual (individuum vagum), represented by the phrases ‘this white <thing>’ and ‘this approaching <person>’. In other contexts, especially commentaries on Aristotle's Categories 2a11-13, the vague individual was represented by such phrases as ‘some man’, but in all the texts we are concerned with, the presence of the demonstrative pronoun is crucial. The word ‘vague’ is used partly because the same phrase will have a different reference when uttered in different contexts, but mainly because the identification of the individual in question is indeterminate, though to a varying extent. ‘This being’ and ‘this body’ are highly indeterminate, ‘this animal’ is less indeterminate, and ‘this man’ is even less indeterminate, but it still lacks the precision of ‘Socrates’. I can recognize someone as a man without being able to distinguish him from other men in any reliable manner. As we shall see below (§9), Buridan took the vague singular to be the most proper type of singular term.

Finally, we have the individual by supposition (ex suppositione) or by circumlocution (circumlocutione), represented by the phrase ‘son of Sophroniscus’ . Some people distinguished two cases here. For John Versor, a fifteenth-century thinker, ‘son of Sophroniscus’ is determinate by virtue of supposition, but ‘man with a fat head, a long nose and so on’ is determinate by virtue of circumlocution. In works which did not comment on Porphyry directly, the third type was often omitted, and there was agreement that although the phrases involved are referring expressions and may in fact refer to just one thing, they are not properly speaking singular terms. Just as some common terms, such as ‘sun’ and ‘moon’, in fact have only one referent, so there are referring phrases which in fact have only one referent, but do not count as singular terms because by the mode of their signification they could supposit for more than one thing.

We should note that in the context of Porphyry's discussion, we are dealing with indefinite descriptions, given that the stipulation that Sophroniscus has only one son is not part of the phrase but merely background information. This fact is enough to ensure that the phrase in fact refers to only one individual, but it does not alter the linguistic generality of the phrase. There was little specific discussion of definite descriptions, but it seems that they would have been treated in the same way. John Buridan has the most direct discussion of the issue. In one place he considers the phrase, ‘first Christian king of France’ (primus rex Francie christianus). This he took to be general, insofar as it is made up of common concepts. In another place he considers the phrase ‘largest and brightest heavenly body’ (planeta maximus et lucidissimus) used to refer to the sun, and he remarks that the very same phrase, without any new imposition, could supposit for a second sun if God were to create another, either similar or greater in size and brightness. He could be interpreted as saying that the very same phrase, without being given any new signification, could refer to different individuals in different possible worlds.

3. Other Types of Singular Term

Porphyry's divisions by no means exhausted the types of term and phrase that could be regarded as singular. For those who accepted simple supposition as supposition for a common nature, “Man is a species” had a singular subject. Later nominalists regarded the same sentence as indefinite, on the grounds that ‘man’ had material supposition and could refer either to itself or to its equiforms. Indeed, any term whatsoever could be taken as having material supposition for itself or its equiforms, or as having personal supposition, and in early sixteenth-century Parisian logic texts it was normal to remark that all singular terms are common, and all common terms are singular when taken in these different ways. Collective terms of one sort and another were included under the heading of singular terms. ‘These’ in “These are running,” ‘all God's apostles’ in “All God's apostles are twelve <in number>,” ‘Rome’, and ‘Salamanca’ are examples. Phrases containing a mixture of singular and common terms, such as ‘the being which is Socrates’, were also counted as singular. Other phrases containing mixtures of singular and common terms together with logical connectives were the subject of many rules and lengthy discussions from the late fourteenth century onward. Thus we discover that ‘Socrates or Plato’ is a common term because it can be verified of more than one thing while ‘Socrates and Plato’ is a collective singular term. On the other hand, if we write ‘Socrates and a donkey’, the phrase is common because it contains a common term as an equally principal part. This feature distinguishes it from aggregates in which the singular term determines the common term, as in ‘the substance John’ and ‘the man Socrates’.

4. Proper Names

The Stoics had made a clear distinction between proper names and common nouns, listing them as different parts of speech, but while this possibility was recognized by Priscian and the influential twelfth century grammarian, Peter Helias, it was not adopted. According to Priscian, the nomen, the noun or name, is the first of the principal parts of speech, and it signifies substance with quality, that is, it signifies a thing of a certain sort, or an individual established in a certain nature. The nomen is divided into the common or appellative name and the proper name. Because the proper name is a subdivision of the name, and hence a fully-fledged part of the language, it is taken to have the same semantic properties as the common name, and it can, indeed must, be taken to have a sense. According to Priscian, the proper name signifies a particular substance and its quality, and it may also include the apprehension of something common. Thus if I say ‘Virgil’, the common notions ‘man’ and ‘poet’ will be understood. Hence there are two kinds of senses attached to proper names, a particular sense which cannot be expressed by common notions, and an associated sense, a description.

There are four types of proper name according to Priscian, the Encyclopedist Isidore of Seville, and medieval grammarians, namely praenomen, nomen, cognomen, and agnomen. For Isidore of Seville, the nomen was the name of the gens or clan, a group of people with a common ancestor, but for Priscian, Peter Helias and the modistic grammarians, such as Thomas of Erfurt, the nomen was the most properly proper name, that which signified an individual “in an absolute way under the properties which gave him his individuality” as Thomas put it. The praenomen distinguished between people of the same family. The cognomen was the family name, and the agnomen was a name, such as ‘Africanus’, given in honour of some achievement, especially military. Peter Helias asked whether the four types of name had the same signification, and whether the cognomen was a common noun. In his reply, he made an explicit distinction between a principal signification which is unique and a secondary signification. The cognomen principally signifies an individual quality, but secondarily signifies the common quality of belonging to a certain family group. He added that this distinction applied to all four types of proper name, and so they all have the same principal signification when used of one person. This reinforces the claim that proper names are not equivalent to a set of common characteristics, and cannot be defined.

5. Synonymy, Metaphor, and Equivocation

Proper names were allowed to exhibit the features of common nouns in various respects. For instance, they could be used metaphorically. Aquinas mentions the use of ‘Achilles’ to refer to strong men, and others used ‘Nero’ as an example of cruel men. More importantly, ‘Marcus’ and ‘Tullius’, as two names of the Roman orator Marcus Tullius Cicero, were favourite examples of synonymous terms. As such they featured in discussions of the problem of intentional contexts. The early thirteenth century theologian Praepositinus of Cremona discussed the relation between the speaker's understanding and the signification of a proposition in the situation where a man knows Marcus, but does not know that he is also called Tullius, and hence believes that the sentence “He is Tullius” (said by someone pointing to Marcus Tullius) is false. A century later Walter Burley asked whether one could infer that a person knows that Tullius is running, given that he knows that Marcus is running, and given that Marcus is Tullius.

The most interesting issues arise in the context of equivocal terms. These were divided into two kinds, chance equivocals, and deliberate equivocals. In the first case, the occurrences of the equivocal term were totally unconnected, but in the second case, some intention on the part of the speakers was involved, and the occurrences of the equivocal term could be related in various ways. From classical times onward, proper names such as ‘Ajax’ and ‘Alexander’ provided standard examples of equivocal terms. However, it was obvious that there were reasons for giving one proper name rather than another, and Aquinas, for instance, gave an elaborate list of such reasons. This suggested to at least some authors that proper names need not be regarded as chance equivocals. In his commentary on the Categories, Paul of Venice claimed that some names were purely equivocal, and he instanced ‘Aristotle’ and ‘Plato’. However, if several men were called John because they were born on the Feast of St. John, the name ‘John’ should be regarded as a univocal term. He overlooked the distinction made by his contemporary, John Dorp, between a common reason for giving the same name to two children, and the different singular concepts which that name signified. Dorp argued that a common reason was not enough for univocity. In the sixteenth century, Domingo de Soto used the newly-rediscovered commentary on the Categories by Philoponus (attributed wrongly to Ammonius) to introduce a new type of deliberate equivocal, ‘from hope and memory’. One might call one's son Plato in the hope of his becoming a philosopher, or Nicomachus in memory of one's father or Charles in honour of the Emperor.

While almost everyone except Paul of Venice agreed that proper names must always be equivocal when used of two different people, not everyone wanted to say that they were univocal when used of the same person. Except for Roger Bacon, who thought of proper names as constantly receiving new impositions (see §7), the reason had to do with the definition of a univocal term as involving a concept or a nature predicable, at least in principle, of several individuals. The usual solution was simply to redefine ‘univocal’ so that proper names were included, but the Categories commentaries of Albert of Saxony, Marsilius of Inghen and Paul of Venice contain fairly extensive discussions of the issue. Both Albert and Paul agreed in opposition to Marsilius that a proper name could be equivocal without being called univocal when used of one person.

An issue to do with the grammatical properties of proper names was whether they could be pluralized or quantified. Most people said that no plural could be grammatically correct, and that such phrases as ‘every Socrates’ were ill-formed, but various logicians in late fourteenth-century Oxford pointed out that such locutions as “There are several Roberts” or ‘every William’ had their uses in ordinary speech, even if they were somewhat deviant. The use of demonstratives with proper names could also pose a problem. Domingo de Soto remarked that in the case where there are several people called Peter in the room, and we want to distinguish this Peter from that Peter we may speak of this or that Peter, but in the mind, where there are no equivocal concepts, the singular concept corresponding to a proper name cannot properly be further singularized, any more than it can be universalized.

6. Demonstrative Pronouns

Priscian made a strong connection between the proper name and the pronoun (pronomen), saying that the pronoun is taken in place of a proper name. It also has a kind of primacy over the proper name. As Priscian said, even if we know that Virgil is a man and a poet, we won't be able to identify him (assuming we are in his presence) unless someone says “This is Virgil.” The type of pronoun we are interested in here is what medieval grammarians called the primitive (non-derived) demonstrative pronoun, which includes personal pronouns such as ‘I’ and demonstratives such as ‘this’. Demonstration (construed as ‘pointing to’) can be either direct, when something is before one's eyes, or intellectual, or a mixture of the two. Leaving aside intellectual demonstration, which occurs when an object is incorporeal or absent (see §8), we can note that the use of a demonstrative pronoun in normal circumstances has the implication that the object pointed to must be present to the speaker.

The standard case is represented by ‘this’ or by ‘this man’, and the mental correlate in both cases is a common concept singularized by a demonstrative act. Because ‘this’ is tied to particular demonstrative acts, Buridan, like many other logicians in the fourteenth, fifteenth and early sixteenth centuries, took it that genuine referring uses of the phrase ‘this man’ are equivocal. What I signify when I say ‘this man’ pointing to Socrates is quite different from what you signify when you say ‘this man’ pointing to Plato, and every use of the phrase requires a new imposition. As Soto pointed out, this is quite compatible with the claim that ‘this man’ has an unchanging general sense which is understood by all speakers of Latin. It is also compatible with failures of reference of various sorts, as Buridan and others frequently remarked. I can say ‘this man’ and point to a donkey, or to nothing. Similarly, I can utter ‘this chimera’, a phrase which can never have a referent, given that chimeras are impossible objects.

One might suppose that mere pointing is all that a demonstrative pronoun does, and certainly Priscian had claimed that while the name signifies substance with quality, that is, a referent plus its nature, the pronoun signifies substance without quality, that is, a bare referent (cf. §8). However, medieval grammarians and logicians tended to demand some identification of the object denoted. One context for the demand is found in the discussion of constructions mixing first-person pronouns and first-person verb forms with proper names, which were counted as third-personal. Priscian took such locutions as “Priscian read” (Priscianus lego) to be ill-formed, and preferred the expansion, “I Priscian read” (Ego Priscianus lego). In his discussion of this sentence, Peter Helias placed the emphasis on the presence of ‘I’. He explained that “I” cannot pick out a form, so ‘Priscian’ has to be supplied in order for there to be a perfect subject. Nearly two and a half centuries later John Dorp appealed to the same grammatical doctrine in order to explain that the sense of the spoken phrase “I run” is either “I John run” or “I, a man, run.” The mental correlate of a personal pronoun must involve an identifying concept, whether singular or universal.

For Dorp and other later logicians ordinary demonstrative pronouns such as ‘this’ similarly require the presence of an identifying concept. This raised the issue of what in the mind corresponds to the pronoun itself, an issue which relates to the more general issue of the mental correlate of syncategorematic terms, that is, terms which perform some logical function, as opposed to categorematic terms, or terms such as nouns and adjectives, which fall under Aristotle's categories. Some people apparently held that there are no pronouns in the mind. Hence one can argue that a demonstrative pronoun is a disguised categorematic term, and that the mental correlate of “This man runs” is “The man Socrates runs.” On the more common view, pronouns are subordinated to special demonstrative or relative acts in the mind. If the pronoun is joined to a noun in the spoken phrase, then it represents a purely syncategorematic act in the mind. If it appears alone in the spoken phrase, there are two possibilities, as John Dorp argued. It can be taken to be subordinated to a mental phrase containing both a syncategorematic act and a name, and this case would be legitimate. Alternatively, it could be taken as purely syncategorematic, and this use would be illegitimate, because there would be no sign of the thing pointed to, and a purely syncategorematic term cannot be the subject of a proposition. You cannot successfully think “This is running” without identifying the ‘this’ in some way. However, it seems that the identification need not involve a sortal concept. A singular concept is enough.

7. Singular Terms in Logic

The use of singular terms in inferences raised various issues. So far as syllogistic was concerned, some logicians, such as Lambert of Auxerre (or Lagny) gave a standard account of the Aristotelian syllogism which is centered on the universal and particular quantification of general terms at the same time as they gave examples with singular terms, such as “Every man is an animal, Socrates is a man, therefore Socrates is an animal.” More detailed presentations of syllogistic included an account of the expository syllogism, which is in the third figure and has a singular middle term, and of other syllogisms with singular terms. Such syllogisms were said to be governed by the two principles “When two things are the same as a third, they are the same as each other” and “When one of two things is the same as a third and one is not, then the two things are not the same as each other.” The existence of syllogisms with singular terms could be thought to cast doubt on such general syllogistic principles as “One premise must always be universal” and “Nothing follows from two particular premises.” Lambert dealt with the former problem by appealing to the formulation “Everything that is Socrates runs, Socrates is a man, therefore a man runs.” Buridan preferred to reject the first principle, and John Dorp explained that the second principle did not apply unless one specified that ‘particular’ was used in the narrow sense of ‘neither universal nor singular’. In the seventeenth century, some logicians were to treat singular propositions as equivalent to universal propositions, but, as Dorp's remarks suggest, medieval logicians preferred to class singular propositions with particular propositions.

Another place in which singular terms were used was suppositional descent, as when one infers from “Every man is running” that Socrates is running or Plato is running or Cicero is running, or that this man is running, and that man is running. In the earlier Middle Ages, logicians did not seem to worry about the use of proper names as opposed to demonstrative phrases, but there was some discussion of possible problems in the later period. One problem had to do with the fact that there are different types of singular name. Men are called Socrates, Plato and Cicero, but donkeys are called Brownie (Brunellus), Tawny (Favellus) and Little Grey (Grisellus), so what happens if someone produces the inference, “Every man is running, therefore Brownie is running and Tawny is running”? After all, this inference has exactly the same logical form as “Every man is running, therefore Socrates is running and Plato is running.” Moreover, even if one has the correct type of proper name, its bearer may die, rendering the conclusion false while the premise remains true. If one adopts the preferred solution of replacing proper names by demonstrative phrases, a similar problem arises. If ‘this’ does not succeed in pointing to a living man, then “Every man is running, therefore this man is running” may have a true premise and a false conclusion. The problem was dealt with by the provision of extra premises which ensured that the very same things referred to by a true premise are the things referred to by the demonstrative phrases in the conclusion.

The problem of reference to dead men was also discussed by logicians. There were three issues. First, there was the problem of words used of a living man and of a corpse. Following Aristotle (Meteorology 389b31), and also Augustine's On Dialectic, logicians were content to accept that if I point to a corpse and say “This is a man” or “This is Peter,” then ‘man’ and ‘Peter’ are being used equivocally, in some different or extended sense. Second, there was the problem of establishing a referent for such claims as “Adam was in Paradise” or “Adam is dead.” Here supposition theory came into play, for it allowed reference to past objects as well as present objects, future objects, and possible objects. Third, there was the problem which was the focus of special attention in the second half of the thirteenth century, namely whether the proposition “Caesar is a man” can be true when Caesar is dead. This question had to do in large part with the interpretation of ‘is’, but what concerns us here is the related issue of whether proper names lost their signification when their bearer died. If they do, it seems that any discussion of the past will be senseless. The answers given show the particular importance of the place of the mind in signification. For instance, Boethius of Dacia wrote “after Socrates's destruction ‘Socrates’ signifies such a being as Socrates once was…when the real thing has been destroyed, conceiving of that thing is possible for the intellect as it was earlier; for it is possible to think the thing after its destruction. Therefore, it is also possible to signify the thing by means of an utterance as it was earlier.” An opposing view was presented by Roger Bacon, who held that proper names were radically equivocal because they were subject to constant reimposition. The person who cries out “John is dead,” intending to refer either to a thing of the past or to a corpse, has given a new imposition to the word ‘John’, even if his grief prevents him from realizing this.

One issue that did not arise is that of fictional names. Medieval logicians were concerned with problems of reference to dead persons, or to fictional entities such as chimeras or the phoenix, but I have yet to come across any discussion of fictional singular terms such as Frodo Baggins or Harry Potter. Buridan remarked that one might acquire fictitious singular concepts in dreams, but he did not speak of naming their non-existent objects.

8. Singular Terms in Theology

Problems of naming often arose in theological contexts, and Aquinas's own list of reasons for giving proper names is part of his discussion of whether Christ was appropriately named ‘Jesus’. The word ‘God’ was the focus of particular attention. Praepositinus of Cremona said that properly speaking it was neither a proper name nor a common term, while other early theologians apparently suggested that it was a proper name, because it referred to a reality that could only be singular. The majority view was expressed by Aquinas, who argued that the word ‘God’ was much like the word ‘sun’. We know that this word has only one referent, and in the case of God, we know that the word can have only one referent; nonetheless, ‘God’ is a common term. In many later logicians ‘God’ appears along with ‘sun’ and ‘moon’ as an example of words that are not singular terms, despite the fact that they supposit for only one thing.

The Trinity caused particular problems for logicians because of the unique relation between the three persons and the one divine essence which is, as Ockham put it in his Summa logicae, “one and simple and one in number and singular to the highest degree, and yet is several things.” Such inferences as “This divine essence is the Father, this divine essence is the Son, therefore the Father is the Son” seem to have true premises which assert an identity between singular things, yet the conclusion is unacceptable. Various solutions were found, including an exploration of different senses of identity and of different types of predication. In his Perutilis logica Albert of Saxony suggested that in expository syllogisms the middle term should always be qualified by the phrase, “Everything which is,” which makes the premises false in the divine case. In the Summa logicae, Ockham preferred to say that a singular proposition of the sort required for expository syllogisms could not have a subject which supposited for a reality that was both one and many, as occurs in the Trinitarian example.

The Roman Catholic doctrine of transsubstantiation led to a discussion of demonstrative phrases. When during the Eucharist the priest takes the bread and utters the words “This is my body,” the substance is said to change from bread into the body of Christ. What then is the referent of the word ‘this’? It cannot be the bread, for that would falsify the sentence, but it cannot be the body of Christ, for the change of substance only occurs when the utterance is complete. In their solutions, theologians discussed a wide range of topics, including the relation between the use and mention of a proposition, the relation of a proposition to the stretch of time during which it is uttered, and the difference between factual and performative utterances, but what concerns us here is their treatment of the word ‘this’. Priscian's reference to intellectual demonstration was found useful, and the thought that a demonstrative could refer either to something absent or to something spiritual was supplemented by a further kind of intellectual demonstration in which the thing actually pointed to is not numerically identical to the thing signified and to which the predicate applies. “This herb grows in my garden,” said while in someone else's garden, was the standard example here. Aquinas seized on Priscian's further claim that demonstratives signify substance without quality, and argued that ‘this’ refers to something indeterminate which is first qualified by the properties of bread and then by the properties of Christ's body.

9. Buridan's Theory of Singular Terms

John Buridan was the medieval author who produced the fullest and most coherent account of singular terms. In his commentary on Aristotle's De anima, Buridan claims that the vague individual is the most proper singular term. While it is true that the phrase ‘this man’ can lack reference through improper use, if it is used properly it must point to one united existent present object, the very situation in which we form genuinely singular concepts. Demonstrative phrases are so clearly tied to the here-and-now that no problem of identity through time can arise. On the other hand, this allows for only a very time-bound usage. In his consideration of whether the singular term ‘Socrates’ could be defined by the phrase ‘this man’, Buridan remarked that if Socrates leaves the room, he is still Socrates, but he is no longer the referent of ‘this man’.

Buridan's view of vague individuals was related to his discussion of Aristotle's claim (Physics 1 184a22-24) that we must proceed from universals to particulars. On the one hand, he insisted that cognition can only begin when a singular thing is present to the senses; on the other hand, he argued that our cognition must move from the more general to the less general, because it requires more skill to grasp the less general. Adults, he remarked, distinguish easily between dogs and cats, but small children do not. Instead of supposing that the only appropriate singular is Socrates, Buridan argued that for each level of generality, there is an appropriate vague singular. First we cognize this body, then we cognize this animal, and then we cognize this man. This account of the standard progression allows recognition both of the primacy of singulars, and of the move from more to less general. It depends on Buridan's epistemological claim that general notions are always involved in apprehension, and that what makes an apprehension singular is the ‘confusion’ or fusing together of circumstances, so that being a man is not abstracted from being here and now in such and such a way. Singularity is not tied to the absence of generality, but to the presence of ‘confusion’ or the lack of discrimination. In other words, a concept can be semantically simple or singular while being metaphysically rich. It has a complex content without being compositional, and without the elements having been distinguished from one another.

John Dorp recognized that Buridan's account depends on the claim that we can grasp generality directly, and that what makes a concept singular is not the absence of generality but the fact that the general has not yet been separated from the set of particular circumstances. Dorp rejected this account, and argued that we have no such singular term as a vague individual in our language. To cognize a thing as singular must involve cognition of particular circumstances, and the general concept ‘man’ cannot be part of the singular cognition. If we want to introduce vague singulars into our language, we will have to invent some special term, such as ‘a’, to signify Socrates together with a connotation of all the individual circumstances, and ‘a’ will then count as a vague singular. Dorp's view was not adopted any more than was Buridan's own. For most later logicians, the vague singular was (contrary to Dorp) one type of singular term, but (contrary to Buridan) less properly singular than the proper name, on the grounds that it did indeed involve some generality.

Buridan's treatment of proper names depends on his insistence that a singular term must be subordinated to a singular concept, and that the formation of a singular concept depends on the actual presence of the singular thing. No one can hand on a singular concept to another by definition or explanation. In his Questiones in Metaphysicam, Buridan considered the names ‘Antichrist’ and ‘Aristotle’. He argued that ‘Antichrist’, the favorite example of a name referring to a person who does not yet exist, is not a singular term, since it is formed from ‘anti’ and ‘Christ’, and could apply to many individuals. He then turned to his own favourite example, ‘Aristotle’. If I am in the presence of Aristotle, and I dub him ‘Aristotle’, then the name is a genuinely singular term. But if Aristotle is a figure in the distant past, then my concept of Aristotle must be a descriptive one, containing such general elements as ‘man’, ‘great philosopher’, ‘born in and so on. Given that there was indeed such a man, having just those characteristics, then my concept supposits for Aristotle, and so stability of reference is guaranteed, but since the concept is not and cannot be a singular concept, it seems that ‘Aristotle’ cannot be a proper singular term when uttered by me, but only an individual by circumlocution.

Buridan adds a very important clause to his discussion at this point. He remarks that I can treat ‘Aristotle’ as a singular term because I believe that the name was imposed or given its signification by a person who did have the appropriate singular concept. This move allows him to avoid the awkward consequence that whether ‘Aristotle’ is a proper name or not depends entirely on the experience of the speakers, and not at all on the linguistic practices of the community. If I have never known Aristotle, but am speaking with someone who did know him, we can both be taken to be using a proper name when we utter the word ‘Aristotle’. Buridan's remarks can be expanded in at least two closely related ways. On the one hand, given his references to an original baptism or name-giving ceremony, we can regard Buridan as offering an early hint of the historical chain theory of proper names. On the other hand, given his apparent recognition that the speaker's intention to refer to the person who was baptized is related to a body of information which, accurate or not, is causally connected with the man baptized ‘Aristotle’, perhaps Buridan is nearer to the richer causal account given by Gareth Evans. Buridan's hints were picked up, though not developed, by later authors. For instance, Dorp remarked that we treat such names as ‘Aristotle’ as singular because they were singular for the original impositor.

The importance of some sort of causal link between the original producer of the name and the individual named and its relation to the representative nature of even singular concepts was brought out by Buridan and Dorp in their discussion of two cases. In the first case, Plato and Socrates are exactly similar and, without my knowing it, one replaces the other in my field of sight. Buridan and Dorp argue that while my first-formed singular concept is equally similar to the second person to appear, it is not a concept of him, because it is caused by a different individual. The criterion for distinction is not the fit between concept and object but the causal relation. The second case was discussed by Dorp alone. If identical twins are born, and are both called ‘Socrates’, it may seem that ‘Socrates’ will function as a common name in this case, because the concepts will be exactly alike, but here too the causal relation becomes all-important. There are two singular terms, each with its own signification.

10. Proper Names and Identity through Time

Further issues to do with proper names arose from Buridan's discussion of identity through time in the last redaction of his commentary on Aristotle's Physics where he posed the question “Is Socrates the same today that he was yesterday?” In his answer, Buridan makes a careful distinction between three kinds of numerical identity through time. In the strictest sense, being totally the same in number, no change of any kind is allowed, and so there are very few real individuals, perhaps only God. In the less strict sense, being partially the same in number, the continuity of one part is sufficient. Socrates is the same Socrates despite bodily changes, because he has the same soul, but the human body will not retain its identity through time, and neither will a horse. In the least strict sense of identity, being the same according to the continuity of diverse parts succeeding one another, we find that animals, bodies, and rivers can be regarded as minimally the same through time. The Seine is the same river now as it was ten years ago because of the continuous succession of water-parts. This allows us to use the word ‘Seine’ as if it were a singular term in accordance with the customary modes of speech. It is important to note that we are allowed to retain singular concepts through memory, so I can keep the same concept through time provided I have had the requisite original experience of the individual in question.

One consequence of Buridan's account is that the names ‘Socrates’ and ‘Aristotle’ on the one hand and ‘Seine’ and ‘Brownie’ (the donkey) on the other have a different status. The former are more properly singular terms than the latter even for those who are acquainted with all of these individuals through time. Domingo de Soto was strongly opposed to this consequence. He appealed to Aristotle's doctrines in order to argue that the continuity of soul is not the only condition for identity of the second type, and that horses, trees and even rivers could enjoy a strong enough identity, by virtue of the continuity of their forms and functions, to give a basis for the application of one singular concept through time.

Another consequence of Buridan's account is found in some early sixteenth-century logicians whose reflection on the problem of identity through time led them to adopt an even more restrictive account of proper names than Buridan himself had countenanced, and one which has much in common with Roger Bacon's theory (see §7). These logicians argued that a sequence of different concepts of Socrates will be formed through time, even by one acquainted with him, and hence that the name ‘Socrates’ is no more a proper singular term than is the name ‘Seine’. It is radically equivocal, since at every moment it is subordinated to a different concept. Nor is this incompatible with the intentions of the person who originally gave Socrates his name. Strictly speaking, only the baby was called Socrates, but the name was imposed equivalently or as a consequence to signify every successor to the boy by means of different concepts.

Once more, Domingo de Soto was strongly opposed. He said that to regard the name ‘Socrates’ as an equivocal term which refers to a succession of individuals is a denial of common speech and of the common sense of the wise men who originally gave terms their signification. Identity of the second type is sufficiently strong to be the basis for one singular concept to be predicated non-ambiguously through time.


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Note: not all primary sources mentioned are included below. For further bibliographical references, especially to manuscripts and early printed books, consult the books and articles by Ashworth.

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analogy: medieval theories of | Buridan, John [Jean] | terms, properties of: medieval theories of | Thomas of Erfurt