# Supertasks

*First published Tue Jun 29, 1999; substantive revision Wed Nov 11, 2009*

Supertasks have posed problems for philosophy since the time of Zeno of Elea. The term ‘supertask’ is new but it designates an idea already present in the formulation of the old motion paradoxes of Zeno, namely the idea of an infinite number of actions performed in a finite amount of time. The main problem lies in deciding what follows from the performance of a supertask. Some philosophers have claimed that what follows is a contradiction and that supertasks are, therefore, logically impossible. Others have denied this conclusion, and hold that the study of supertasks can help us improve our understanding of the physical world, or even our theories about it.

- 1. What is a Supertask
- 2. On The Conceptual Possibility Of Supertasks
- 3. On The Physical Possibility Of Supertasks
- 4. The Physics of Supertasks
- 4.1 A New Form of Indeterminism: Spontaneous Self-Excitation
- 4.2 A New Form of Indeterminism: Global Interaction
- 4.3 Energy and Momentum Conservation in Supertasks
- 4.4 Actions without Interaction
- 4.5 The Spaceship Paradox
- 4.6 Bifurcated Supertasks
- 4.7 Bifurcated Supertasks and the Solution to the Philosophical Problem of Supertasks

- 5. What Supertasks Entail for the Philosophy of Mathematics
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. What is a Supertask

### 1.1 Definitions

A supertask may be defined as an infinite sequence of actions or
operations carried out in a finite interval of time. The terms
‘action’ and ‘operation’ must not be understood
in their usual sense, which involves a human agent. Human agency may be
involved but it is not necessary. To show this, let us see how actions
can be characterised precisely without any references to man. We will
assume that at each instant of time the state of the world relevant to
a specific action can be described by a set *S* of sentences. Now an
action or operation applied to a state of the world results in a change
in that state, that is, in the set *S* corresponding to it. Consequently,
an arbitrary action a will be defined (Allis and Koetsier 1995) as a
change in the state of the world by which the latter changes from state
*S* before the change to state a(*S*) after it. This means that an action
has a beginning and an end, but does not entail that there is a finite
lapse of time between them. For instance, take the case of a lamp that
is on at *t* = 0 and remains so until *t* = 1, an instant at which it
suddenly goes off. Before *t* =1 the state of the lamp (which is the only
relevant portion of the world here) can be described by the sentence
‘lamp on’, and after *t* =1 by the sentence ‘lamp
off’, without there being a finite lapse of time between the
beginning and the end of the action. Some authors have objected to this
consequence of the definition of action, and they might be right if we
were dealing with the general philosophical problem of change. But we
need not be concerned with those objections at this stage, since in the
greatest majority of the relevant supertasks instantaneous actions
(i.e., actions without any duration) can be replaced by actions lasting
a finite amount of time without affecting the analysis at any
fundamental point.

There is a particular type of supertask called *hypertasks*.
A hypertask is a non-numerable infinite sequence of actions or
operations carried out in a finite interval of time. Therefore, a
supertask which is not a hypertask will be a numerable infinite
sequence of actions or operations carried out in a finite interval of
time. Finally, a task can be defined as a finite sequence of actions or
operations carried out in a finite interval of time.

### 1.2 The Philosophical Problem of Supertasks

To gain a better insight into the fundamental nature of the
philosophical problem posed by supertasks, consider the distinction
between tasks in general (finite sequences of actions of the type
(*a*_{1}, *a*_{2}, *a*_{3}, … ,
*a*_{n})) and one particular type of supertasks, namely those
consisting of an infinite sequence of actions of the type
(*a*_{1}, *a*_{2}, *a*_{3}, … , *a*_{n},
… ) and thus having the same type of order as the natural order
of positive integers: 1, 2, 3, … , *n*, … (it is customary
to denote this type of order with letter ‘*w*’ and
so the related supertasks can be called supertasks of type *w*).

In the case of a task *T* = (*a*_{1}, *a*_{2},
*a*_{3}, … , *a*_{n}) it is natural to say that *T* is
applicable in state *S* if:

a_{1}is applicable toS,

a_{2}is applicable toa_{1}(S),

a_{3}is applicable toa_{2}(a_{1}(S)),

… , and,

a_{n}is applicable toa_{n−1}(a_{n−2}(… (a_{2}(a_{1}(S)))… )).

The successive states of the world relevant to task *T* can be defined by
means of the finite sequence of sets of sentences:

S,a_{1}(S),a_{2}(a_{1}(S)),a_{3}(a_{2}(a_{1}(S))), …,a_{n}(a_{n−1}(a_{n−2}(… (a_{2}(a_{1}(S)))…))),

whose last term will therefore describe the relevant state of the world
after the performance of *T*. Or, equivalently, the state resulting from
applying *T* to *S* will be *T*(*S*) =

a_{n}(a_{n−1}(a_{n−2}(… (a_{2}(a_{1}(S)))… ))).

Now take the case of a supertask *T* = (*a*_{1}, *a*_{2},
*a*_{3}, …, *a*_{n}, …). Let us give the name
*T*_{n} to the task which consists in performing the first *n*
actions of *T*. That is, *T*_{n} = (*a*_{1}, *a*_{2},
*a*_{3}, …, *a*_{n}). Now it is natural to say that
*T* is applicable in state *S* if *T*_{n} is applicable in *S* for each
natural number *n*, and, obviously,

T_{n}(S) =a_{n}(a_{n−1}(a_{n−2}(…(a_{2}(a_{1}(S)))…))).

The successive states of the world relevant to supertask *T* can be
described by means of the infinite sequence of sets of sentences:

S,T_{1}(S),T_{2}(S), …,T_{n}(S), …

A difficulty arises, however, when we want to specify the set of
sentences which describe the relevant state of the world after the
performance of supertask *T*, because the infinite sequence above lacks a
final term. Put equivalently, it is difficult to specify the relevant
state of the world resulting from the application of supertask *T* to *S*
because there seems to be no final state resulting from such an
application. This inherent difficulty is increased by the fact that, by
definition, supertask *T* is performed in a finite time, and so there
must exist one first instant of time *t** at which it can be said that
the performance happened. Now notice that the world must naturally be
in a certain specific state at *t**, which is the state resulting from
the application of *T*, but that, nevertheless, we have serious trouble
to specify this state, as we have just seen.

### 1.3 Supertask: A Fuzzy Concept

Since we have defined supertasks in terms of actions and actions in
terms of changes in the state of the world, there is a basic
indeterminacy regarding what type of processes taking place in time
should be considered supertasks, which is linked to the basic
indeterminacy that there is regarding which type of sets of sentences
are to be allowed in descriptions of the state of the world and which
are not. For this reason, there are some processes that would be
regarded as supertasks by virtually every philosopher and some about
which opinions differ. For an instance of the first sort of process,
take the one known as ‘Thomson's lamp’. Thomson's lamp is
basically a device consisting of a lamp and a switch set on an
electrical circuit. The switch can be in one of just two positions and
the lamp has got to be lit — when the switch is in position
‘on’ — or else dim — when the switch is in
position ‘off’. Assume that initially (at *t* = 12 A.M., say)
the lamp is dim and that it is thenceforth subject to the following
infinite sequence of actions: when half of the time remaining until *t**
= 1 P.M. has gone by, we carry out the action *a*_{1} of turning
the switch into position ‘on’ and, as a result, the lamp is
lit (*a*_{1} is thus performed at *t* = 1/2 P.M.); when half the
time between the performance of *a*_{1} and *t** = 1 P.M. has gone
by, we carry out action *a*_{2} of turning to the switch into
position ‘off’ and, as a result, the lamp is dim
(*a*_{2} is thus performed at *t* = 1/2 + 1/4 P.M.); when half the
time between the performance of *a*_{2} and *t** = 1 P.M. has gone
by, we carry out the action of turning the switch into position
‘on’ and, as a result, the lamp is lit (*a*_{3} is
thus performed at *t* = 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8), and so on. When we get to
instant *t** = 1 P.M. we will have carried out an infinite sequence of
actions, that is, a supertask *T* = (*a*_{1}, *a*_{2},
*a*_{3}, … , *a*_{n}, … ). If, for the sake
of simplicity, we are only concerned about the evolution of the lamp
(not the switch) the state of the world relevant to the description of
our supertask admits of only two descriptions, one through the unitary
set of sentences {lamp lit} and the other through the set {lamp dim}.

As an instance of the second sort of processes we referred to above,
those about which no consensus has been reached as to whether they are
supertasks, we can take the process which is described in one of the
forms of Zeno's dichotomy paradox. Suppose that initially (at *t* = 12
A.M., say) Achilles is at point *A* (*x* = 0) and moving in a
straight line, with a constant velocity *v* = 1 km/h, towards
point *B* (*x* = 1), which is 1 km. away from *A*. Assume, in
addition, that Achilles does not modify his velocity at any point. In
that case, we can view Achilles's run as the performance of a
supertask, in the following way: when half the time until *t** = 1 P.M.
has gone by, Achilles will have carried out the action *a*_{1} of
going from point *x* = 0 to point *x* = 1/2
(*a*_{1} is thus performed in the interval of time between *t* =12
A.M. and *t* = 1/2 P.M.), when half the time from the end of the
performance of *a*_{1} until *t** = 1 P.M. will have elapsed,
Achilles will have carried out the action *a*_{2} of going from
point *x* = 1/2 to point *x* = 1/2 + 1/4 (*a*_{2}
is thus performed in the interval of time between *t* = 1/2 P.M. and *t* =
1/2 + 1/4 P.M.), when half the time from the end of the performance of
*a*_{2} until *t** = 1 P.M. will have elapsed,
Achilles will have carried out the action *a*_{3} of
going from point *x* = 1/2 + 1/4 to point *x* = 1/2 +
1/4 + 1/8 (*a*_{3} is thus performed in the interval of
time between *t* = 1/2 + 1/4 P.M. and *t* = 1/2 + 1/4 +
1/8 P.M.), and so on. When we get to instant *t** = 1 P.M.,
Achilles will have carried out an infinite sequence of actions, that
is, a supertask *T* =
(*a*_{1}, *a*_{2}, *a*_{3},
… , *a*_{n}, … ), provided we
allow the state of the world relevant for the description
of *T* to be specified, at any arbitrary instant, by a single
sentence: the one which specifies Achilles's position at that
instant. Several philosophers have objected to this conclusion,
arguing that, in contrast to Thomson's lamp, Achilles's run does not
involve an infinity of actions (acts) but of pseudo-acts. In their
view, the analysis presented above for Achilles's run is nothing but
the breakdown of one process into a numerable infinity of
subprocesses, which does not make it into a supertask. In Allis and
Koetsier's words, such philosophers believe that a set of position
sentences is not always to be admitted as a description of the state
of the world relevant to a certain action. In their opinion, a
relevant description of a state of the world should normally include a
different type of sentences (as is the case with Thomson's lamp) or,
in any case, more than simply position sentences.

## 2. On The Conceptual Possibility Of Supertasks

In section 1.2 I have pointed out and illustrated the fundamental philosophical problem posed by supertasks. Obviously, one will only consider it a problem if one deems the concepts employed in its formulation acceptable. In fact, some philosophers reject them, because they regard the very notion of supertask as problematic, as leading to contradictions or at least to insurmountable conceptual difficulties. Among these philosophers the first well-known one is Zeno of Elea.

### 2.1 Zeno's Dichotomy Paradox

Consider the dichotomy paradox in the formulation of it given in
section 1.3. According to Zeno, Achilles would never get to point *B*
(*x* = 1) because he would first have to reach the mid point of
his run (*x* = 1/2), after that he would have to get to the mid
point of the span which he has left (*x* = 1/2 + 1/4), and then
to the mid point of the span which is left (*x* = 1/2 + 1/4 +
1/8), and so on. Whatever the mid point Achilles may reach in his
journey, there will always exist another one (the mid point of the
stretch that is left for him to cover) that he has not reached yet. In
other words, Achilles will never be able to reach point *B* and finish
his run. According to Owen (Owen 1957–58), in this as well as in his
other paradoxes, Zeno was concerned to show that the Universe is a
simple, global entity which is not comprised of different parts. He
tried to demonstrate that if we take to making divisions and
subdivisions we will obtain absurd results (as in the dichotomy case)
and that we must not yield to the temptation of breaking up the world.
Now the notion of supertask entails precisely that, division into
parts, as it involves breaking up a time interval into successive
intervals. Therefore, supertasks are not feasible in the Zenonian world
and, since they lead to absurd results, the notion of supertask itself
is conceptually objectionable.

In stark contrast to Zeno, the dichotomy paradox is standardly
solved by saying that the successive distances covered by Achilles as
he progressively reaches the mid points of the spans he has left to go
through — 1/2, 1/4, 1/8, 1/16, … — form an infinite
series 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + 1/16 + … whose sum is 1. Consequently,
Achilles will indeed reach point *B* (*x* = 1) at *t** = 1 P.M.
(which is to be expected if he travels with velocity *v* = 1
km/h, as has been assumed). Then there is no problem whatsoever in
splitting up his run into smaller sub-runs and, so, no inherent problem
about the notion of supertask. An objection can be made, however, to
this standard solution to the paradox: it tells us where Achilles is at
each instant but it does not explain where Zeno's argument breaks down.
Importantly, there is another objection to the standard solution, which
hinges on the fact that, when it is claimed that the infinite series
1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + 1/16 + … adds up to 1, this is substantiated
by the assertion that the sequence of partial sums 1/2, 1/2 + 1/4, 1/2
+ 1/4 + 1/8, … has limit 1, that is, that the difference between
the successive terms of the sequence and number 1 becomes progressively
smaller than any positive integer, no matter how small. But it might be
countered that this is just a patch up: the infinite series 1/2 + 1/4 +
1/8 + … seems to involve infinite sums and thus the performance
of a supertask, and the proponent of the standard solution is in fact
presupposing that supertasks are feasible just in order to justifiy
that they are. To this the latter might reply that the assertion that
the sum of the series is 1 presupposes no infinite sum, since, by
definition, the sum of a series is the limit to which its partial (and
so finite) sums approach. His opponent can now express his disagreement
with the response that the one who supports the standard solution is
deducing a matter of fact (that Achilles is at *x* = 1 at *t** = 1
P.M.) from a definition pertaining to the arithmetic of infinite
series, and that it is blatantly unacceptable to deduce empirical
propositions from mere definitions.

### 2.2 The Inverse Form Of The Dichotomy Argument

Before concluding our discussion of the arguments connected with Zeno's
dichotomy paradox which have been put forward against the conceptual
feasibility of supertasks, we should deal with the so-called inverse
dichotomy of Zeno, which can also be formulated as a supertask, but
whose status as a logical possibility seems to some philosophers to be
even more doubtful than that of the direct version expounded in section
2.1. The process involved in the paradox of inverse dichotomy admits of
a supertask kind of description, as follows. Suppose that at *t* = 12
A.M. Achilles is at point *A* (*x* = 0) and wishes to do the
action of reaching point *B* (*x* = 1). In order to do this action
he must first of all go from point *A* to the mid point *b*_{1}
(*x* = 1/2) of the span *A**B* that he wishes to cover. In order to
do this, he must in turn first do the action of going from point *A* to
the mid point *b*_{2} (*x* = 1/4) of the span
Ab_{1} that he wishes to cover, and so on . In order to reach
*B*, Achilles will have to accomplish an infinite sequence of actions,
that is, a supertask *T** = (… , *a*_{n}, … ,
*a*_{3}, *a*_{2}, *a*_{1}), provided we allow the
state of the world relevant to the description of *T** to be specified,
at a given arbitrary instant, by a single sentence, the one specifying
Achilles's position at that instant. Notice in the first place that *T**
has the same type of order as the natural order of negative integers:
… , −*n*, … , −3, −2, −1 (such order type is usually
denoted with the expression ‘*w**’ and the related
supertasks can therefore be called supertasks of type *w**). The
philosophical problem connected with supertasks of type *w*,
already discussed in section 1.2 above, does not arise now because the
set of sentences which describes the relevant state of the world after
the performance of supertask *T** is obviously *a*_{1}(*S*), with *S*
the set of sentences describing the initial relevant state of the
world. But as the successive states of the world after *S* in relation to
*T** can be described by means of the infinite sequence of sets of
sentences … , *a*_{n}(*S*), … , *a*_{3}(*S*),
*a*_{2}(*S*), *a*_{1}(*S*), some philosophers think it puzzling
and unacceptable that the initial set of sentences in that sequence
cannot be specified. This really means that we cannot specify which is
the action in supertask *T** that should be carried out first and that we
consequently ignore how to begin. Isn't that proof enough that
supertasks of type *w** are impossible? Chihara (1965), for
example, says that Zeno's inverse dichotomy is even more problematic
than the direct one, since Achilles is supposed to be capable of doing
something akin to counting the natural numbers in reverse order. In his
opinion, it is just as impossible for Achilles to start his run —
if viewed as a supertask of type *w** — as it is to start
this reverse counting process.

### 2.3 On Thomson's Impossibility Arguments

Thomson (1954–55) was convinced that he could show supertasks to be
logically impossible. To this end, he made up the lamp example analysed
in section 1.3, since known as ‘Thomson's lamp’. Thomson
argued that the analysis of the workings of his lamp leads to
contradiction, and therefore the supertask involved is logically
impossible. But then, to the extent that this supertask is
representative of ‘genuine’ supertasks, all genuine
supertasks are impossible. Thomson's argument is simple. Let us ask
ourselves what the state of the lamp is at *t** = 1 P.M. At that instant
the lamp cannot be lit, the reason being the way we manipulate it: we
never light the lamp without dimming it some time later. Nor can the
lamp be dim, because even if it is dim initially, we light it and
subsequently never dim it without lighting it back again some time
later. Therefore, at *t** = 1 P.M. the lamp can be neither dim nor lit.
However, one of its functioning conditions is that it must be either
dim or lit. Thus, a contradiction arises. Conclusion: Thomson's lamp
or, better, the supertask consisting in its functioning is logically
impossible. Now is Thomson's argument correct? Benacerraf (1962)
detected a serious flaw in it. Let us in principle distinguish between
the series of instants of time in which the actions *a*_{i} of
the supertask are performed (which will be called the *t*-series) and the
instant *t** = 1 P.M., the first instant after the supertask has been
accomplished. Thomson's argument hinges on the way we act on the lamp,
but we only act on it at instants in the *t*-series, and so what can be
deduced logically from this way of acting will apply only to instants
in the *t*-series. As *t** = 1 P.M. does not belong to the *t*-series, it
follows that Thomson's supposed conclusion that the lamp cannot be lit
at *t** is fallacious, and so is his conclusion that it cannot be dim at
*t**. The conditions obtaining in the lamp problem only enable us to
conclude that the lamp will be either dim or else lit but not both at
*t** = 1 P.M., and this follows from the fact that this
exclusive disjunction was presupposed from the start to be true at
each and every instant of time, independently of the way in which we
could act on the lamp in the *t*-series of instants of
time. What cannot be safely inferred is which one of these two
states—dim or lit—the lamp will be in at *t** = 1
P.M. or, alternatively, the state of the lamp at *t** = 1
P.M. is not logically determined by what has happened before that
instant. This consequence tallies with what was observed in section
2.1 about the fallacy committed by adherents to the standard solution
against Zeno: they seek to deduce that at instant *t** = 1
P.M. Achilles will be at point *B* from an analysis of the
sub-runs performed by him before that instant, that is, they assume
that Achilles's state at *t** follows logically from his states
at instants previous to *t**, and in so assuming they make the
same mistake as Thomson.

Thomson (1954–55) put forward one more argument against the logical
possibility of his lamp. Let us assign to the lamp the value 0 when it
is dim and the value 1 when it is lit. Then lighting the lamp means
adding one unity (going from 0 to 1) and dimming it means subtracting
one unity (going from 1 to 0). It thus seems that the final state of
the lamp at *t** = 1 P.M., after an infinite, and alternating, sequence
of lightings (additions of one unity) and dimmings (subtractions of one
unity), should be described by the infinite series 1−1+1−1+1… If
we accept the conventional mathematical definition of the sum of a
series, this series has no sum, because the partial sums 1, 1−1, 1−1+1,
1−1+1−1, … , etc. take on the values 1 and 0 alternatively,
without ever approaching a definite limit that could be taken to be the
proper sum of the series. But in that case it seems that the final
state of the lamp can neither be dim (0) nor lit (1), which contradicts
our assumption that the lamp is at all times either dim or lit.
Benacerraf's (1962) reply was that even though the first, second,
third, … , *n*-th partial sum of the series 1−1+1−1+1… does
yield the state of the lamp after one, two, three, … , *n* actions
*a*_{i} (of lighting or dimming), it does not follow from this
that the final state of the lamp after the infinite sequence of actions
*a*_{i} must of necessity be given by the sum of the series, that
is, by the limit to which its partial sums progressively approach. The
reason is that a property shared by the partial sums of a series does
not have to be shared by the limit to which those partial sums tend.
For instance, the partial sums of the series 0.3 + 0.03 + 0.003 +
0.0003 + … are 0.3, 0.3 + 0.03 = 0.33, 0.3 + 0.03 + 0.003 =
0.333,… , all of them, clearly, numbers less than 1/3; however,
the limit to which those partial sums tend (that is, the sum of the
original series) is 0.3333… , which is precisely the number
1/3.

### 2.4 On Black's Impossibility Argument

Another one of the classical arguments against the logical possibility
of supertasks comes from Black (1950–51) and is constructed around the
functioning of an infinity machine of his own invention. An infinity
machine is a machine that can carry out an infinite number of actions
in a finite time. Black's aim is to show that an infinity machine is a
logical impossibility. Consider the case of one such machine whose sole
task is to carry a ball from point *A* (*x* = 0) to point *B*
(*x* = 1) and viceversa. Assume, in addition, that initially (at
*t* = 12 A.M., say) the ball is at *A* and that the machine carries out the
following infinite sequence of operations: when half the time until *t**
= 1 P.M. has gone by, it does the action *a*_{1} of taking the
ball from position *A* to position *B* (*a*_{1} is thus carried out
at *t* = 1/2 P.M.); when half the time between the performance of
*a*_{1} and *t** = 1 P.M. has gone by, it does the action
*a*_{2} of taking the ball from position *B* to position A
(*a*_{2} is thus carried out at *t* = 1/2 + 1/4 P.M.); when half
the time between the performance of *a*_{2} and *t** = 1 P.M. has
gone by, the machine does the action *a*_{3} of taking the ball
from position *A* to position *B* (*a*_{3} is thus performed in *t* =
1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 P.M.), and so on. When we get to instant *t** = 1 P.M.
the machine will have carried out an infinite sequence of actions, that
is, a supertask *T* = (*a*_{1}, *a*_{2}, *a*_{3},
… , *a*_{n}, … ). The parallelism with Thomson's
lamp is clear when it is realised that the ball in position A
corresponds to the dim lamp and the ball in position *B* corresponds to
the lit lamp. Nevertheless, Black believes that by assuming that at
each instant the ball is either in *A* or else in *B* (and note that
assuming this means that the machine transports the ball from *A* to *B*
and viceversa instantaneously, but we need not be worried by this,
since all that we are concerned with now is logical or conceptual
possibility, not physical possibility), he can deduce, by a totally
different route from Thomson's based on the symmetrical functioning of
his machine, a contradiction regarding its state at *t** = 1 P.M..
However, Benacerraf's criticisms also applies to Black's argument. In
effect, the latter hinges on how the machine works, and as this has
only been specified for instants of time previous to *t** = 1 P.M., it
follows that what can be logically inferred from the functioning of the
machine is only applicable to those instants previous to *t** = 1 P.M..
Black seeks to deduce a contradiction at *t** = 1 P.M. but he fails at
the same point as Thomson: whatever happens to the ball at *t** = 1 P.M.
cannot be a logical consequence of what has happened to it before. Of
course, one can always specify the functioning of the machine for
instants *t* greater than or equal to 1 P.M. by saying that at all those
instants the machine will not perform any actions at all, but that is
not going to help Black. His argument is fallacious because he seeks to
reach a logical conclusion regarding instant *t** = 1 P.M. from
information relative to times previous to that instant.. In the
standard argument against Zeno's dichotomy one could similarly specify
Achilles's position at *t** = 1 P.M. saying, for instance, that he is at
*B* (*x* = 1), but there is no way that this is going to get us a
valid argument out of a fallacious one, which seeks to deduce logically
where Achilles will be at *t** = 1 P.M. from information previous to that
instant of time.

### 2.5 Benacerraf's Critique and the Dichotomy Arguments

The cases dealt with above are examples of how Benacerraf's strategy can be used against supposed demonstrations of the logical impossibility of supertasks. We have seen that the strategy is based on the idea that

(I) the state of a system at an instantt* is not a logical consequence of which states he has been in beforet* (where by ‘state’ I mean ‘relevant state of the world’, see section 1.1)

and occasionally on the idea that

(II) the properties shared by the partial sums of a series do not have to be shared by the limit to which those partial sums tend.

Since the partial sums of a series make up a succession (of partial sums), (II) may be rewritten as follows:

(III) the properties shared by the terms of a succession do not have to be shared by the limit to which that succession tends.

If we keep (I), (II) and (III) well in mind, it is easy not to yield to
the perplexing implications of certain supertasks dealt with in the
literature. And if we do not yield to the perplexing results, we will
also not fall into the trap of considering supertasks conceptually
impossible. (III), for instance, may be used to show that it is not
impossible for Achilles to perform the supertasks of the inverse and
the direct dichotomy of Zeno. Take the case of the direct dichotomy:
the limit of the corresponding succession of instants of time
*t*_{1}, *t*_{2}, *t*_{3},
… at which each one of Achilles's successive sub-runs is
finished can be the instant at which Achilles's supertask has been
accomplished, even if such a supertask is not achieved at any one of
the instants in the infinite
succession *t*_{1}, *t*_{2}, *t*_{3},
… (all of this in perfect agreement with (III)).

### 2.6 Conclusion

As a corollary it may be said that supertasks do not seem to be
intrinsically impossible. The contradictions that they supposedly give
rise to may be avoided if one rejects certain unwarranted assumptions
that are usually made. The main such assumption, responsible for the
apparent conceptual impossibility of supertasks, is that properties
which are preserved after a finite number of actions or operations will
likewise be preserved after an infinite number of them. But that is not
true in general. For example, we saw in section 1.2 above that the
relevant state of the world after the performance of a task *T* =
(*a*_{1}, *a*_{2}, … , *a*_{n}) on the
relevant state *S* was logically determined by *T* and by *S* (and was
*a*_{n}(*a*_{n−1}(*a*_{n−2}(…
(*a*_{2}(*a*_{1}(*S*)))…)))), but we have now learned
that after the performance of a supertask *T* = (*a*_{1},
*a*_{2}, *a*_{3}, …, *a*_{n}, …) it is
not (that is the core of Benacerraf's critique). The same sort of
uncritical assumptions seem to be in the origin of infinity paradoxes
in general, in which certain properties are extrapolated from the
finite to the infinite that are only valid for the finite, as when it
is assumed that there must be more numbers greater than zero than
numbers greater than 1000 because all numbers greater than 1000 are
also greater than zero but not viceversa (Galileo's paradox). In
conclusion, if some supertasks are paradoxical, it is not because of
any inherent inconsistency of the notion of supertask. This opinion is
adhered to by authors such as Earman and Norton (1996).

## 3. On The Physical Possibility Of Supertasks

We have gone through several arguments for the conceptual impossibility of supertasks and counterarguments to these. Those who hold that supertasks are conceptually possible may however not agree as to whether they are also physically possible. In general, when this issue is discussed in the literature, by physical possibility is meant possibility in relation with certain broad physical principles, laws or ‘circumstances’ which seems to operate in the real world, at least as far as we know. But it is a well-known fact that authors do not always agree about which those principles, laws or circumstances are.

### 3.1 Kinematical Impossibility

In our model of Thomson's lamp we are assuming that at each moment the
switch can be in just one of two set positions (‘off’,
‘on’). If there is a fixed distance *d* between them, then
clearly, since the switch swings an infinite number of times from the
one to the other from *t* = 12 A.M. until *t** = 1 P.M., it will have
covered an infinite distance in one hour. For this to happen it is thus
necessary for the speed with which the switch moves to increase
unboundedly during this time span. Grünbaum has taken this
requirement to be physically impossible to fulfil. Grünbaum (1970)
believes that there is a sort of physical impossibility of a purely
kinematical nature (kinematical impossibility) and describes it in more
precise terms by saying that a supertask is kinematically impossible
if:

a) At least one of the moving bodies travels at an unboundedly increasing speed,b) For some instant of time

t*, the position of at least one of the moving bodies does not approach any defined limit as we get arbitrarily closer in time tot*.

It is clear then that the Thomson's lamp supertask, in the version
presented so far, is kinematically (and eo ipso physically)
impossible, since not only does the moving switch have to travel at a
speed that increases unboundedly but also—because it oscillates
between two set positions which are a constant distance *d*
apart—its position does not approach any definite limit as we
get closer to instant *t** = 1 P.M., at which the supertask is
accomplished. Nevertheless, Grünbaum has also shown models of
Thomson's lamp which are kinematically possible. Take a look at
Figure 1, in which the switch (in position ‘on’ there) is
simply a segment *A**B* of the circuit connecting
generator *G* with lamp *L*. The circuit
segment *A**B* can shift any distance upwards so as to
open the circuit in order for *L* to be dimmed. Imagine we push
the switch successively upwards and downwards in the way illustrated
in Figure 2, so that it always has the same velocity *v* =
1.

Figure 1

Figure 2

The procedure is the following. Initially (*t* = 0) the switch
is in position *A*′*B*′ (lamp dim) a height
of 0.2 above the circuit and moving downwards (at *v* =
1). At *t* = 0.2 it will be in position *A**B*
(lamp lit) and will begin moving upwards (*v* = 1).
At *t* = 0.2 + 0.01 it will be in
position *A*″*B*″ (lamp dim) and will begin
moving downwards (*v* = 1). At *t* = 0.2 + 0.01 + 0.01 =
0.2 + 0.02 it will be in position *A**B* (lamp lit) and
will begin moving upwards (*v* = 1). At *t* = 0.2 + 0.02
+ 0.001 it will be in
position *A*′′′*B*′′′
(lamp dim), and so on. Obviously, between *t* = 0
and *t** = 0.2 + 0.02 + 0.002 + … = 0.2222… =
2/9, the lamp is in the states ‘dim’ and ‘lit’
an infinite number of times, and so a supertask is accomplished. But
this supertask is not kinematically impossible, because it has been so
designed that the switch always moves with velocity *v* = 1
— and, therefore, condition (a) for kinematical impossibility is
not fulfilled — and that, additionally, as we get closer to the
limit time *t** = 2/9 (the only one which could cause us any
trouble) the switch approaches more and more a well-defined limit
position, position *A**B* (lamp lit)—and, therefore,
condition (b) for kinematical impossibility is not fulfilled
either. Once the kinematical possibility has been established, what is
the state of the lamp at *t** = 2/9? What has been said so far
does not enable us to give a determinate answer to this question (just
as the obvious kinematical possibility of Achilles's supertask in the
dichotomy paradox does not suffice to determine where Achilles will be
at *t** = 1 P.M.), but there exists a ‘natural’
result. It seems intuitively acceptable that the position the switch
will occupy at *t** = 2/9 will be
position *A**B*, and so the lamp will be lit at that
instant. There is no mysterious asymmetry about this result. Figure 3
shows a model of Thomson's lamp with a switch that works according to
exactly the same principles as before, but which will yield the
‘natural’ result that the lamp will in the end be dim
at *t** = 2/9. In effect, the switch will now finally end up in
the ‘natural’ position *A**B* at *t**
= 2/9 and will thereby bring about an electrical short-circuit that
will make all the current in the generator pass through the cable on
which the switch is set, leaving nothing for the more resistant path
where the lamp is.

Figure 3

There are some who believe that the very fact that there exist Thomson's lamps yielding an intuitive result of ‘lamp lit’ when the supertask is accomplished but also other lamps whose intuitive result is ‘lamp dim’ brings up back to the contradiction which Thomson thought to have found originally. But we have nothing of that sort. What we do have is different physical models with different end-results. This does not contradict but rather corroborates the results obtained by Benacerraf: the final state is not logically determined by the previous sequence of states and operations. This logical indeterminacy can indeed become physical determinacy, at least sometimes, depending on what model of Thomson's lamp is employed.

A conspicuous instance of a supertask which is kinematically
impossible is the one performed by Black's infinity machine, whose task
it is to transport a ball from position *A* (*x* = 0) to position
*B* (*x* = 1) and from *B* to *A* an infinite number of times in one
hour. As with the switch in our first model of Thomson's lamp, it is
obvious that the speed of the ball increases unboundedly (and so
condition a) for impossibility is met), while at the same time, as we
approach *t** = 1 P.M., its position does not tend to any defined limit,
due to the fact that it must oscillate continuously between two set
positions *A* and *B* one unity distance apart from each other (and so also
condition b) for impossibility is met).

### 3.2 The Principle Of Continuity and the Solution to the Philosophical Problem of Supertasks

Up to this point we have seen examples of supertasks which are
conceptually possible and, among these, we have discovered some which
are also physically possible. For the latter to happen we had to make
sure that at least some requirements were complied with which,
plausibly, characterise the processes that can actually take place in
our world. But some definitive statement remains to be made about the
philosophical problem posed by supertasks: what the state of the world
is after they have been accomplished. The principles of physical
nature which have so far been appealed to do not enable us to
pronounce on this matter. The question thus arises whether some new
principle of a physical nature can be discovered which holds in the
real world and is instrumental in answering the question what the
state of the world will be after a supertask. That discovery would
allow us to resolve a radical indeterminacy which still
persists—the reader will remember that even in the case of
Achilles's dichotomy supertask we were quite unable to prove that it
would conclude with Achilles in point *B* (*x* = 1). In
Section 2.1 we saw that such proof cannot be obtained by recourse to
the mathematical theory of infinite series exclusively; why should it
be assumed that this abstract theory is literally applicable to the
physical universe? After all, amounts of money are added up applying
ordinary arithmetic but, as Black reminded us, velocities cannot be
added up according to ordinary arithmetic.

Since Benacerraf's critique, we know that there is no logical
connection between the position of Achilles at *t** = 1 P.M. and his
positions at instants previous to *t** = 1 P.M. Sainsbury (1988) has
tried to bridge the gap opened by Benacerraf. He claims that this can
be achieved by drawing a distinction between abstract space of a
mathematical kind and physical space. No distinction between
mathematical and physical space has to be made, however, to attain that
goal; one need only appeal to a single principle of physical nature,
which is, moreover, simple and general, namely, that the trajectories
of material bodies are continuous lines. To put it more graphically,
what this means is that we can draw those trajectories without lifting
our pen off the paper. More precisely, that the trajectory of a
material body is a continuous line means that, whatever the instant *t*,
the limit to which the position occupied by the body tends as time
approaches *t* coincides precisely with the position of the body at *t*.
Moreover, the principle of continuity is highly plausible as a physical
hypothesis: the trajectories of all physical bodies in the real world
are in fact continuous. What matters is that we realise that, aided by
this principle, we can now finally demonstrate that after the
accomplishment of the dichotomy supertask, that is, at *t** = 1 P.M.,
Achilles will be in point *B* (*x* = 1). We know, in fact, that as
the time Achilles has spent running gets closer and closer to *t** = 1
P.M., his position will approach point *x* = 1 more and more,
or, equivalently, we know that the limit to which the position occupied
by Achilles tends as time get progressively closer to *t** = 1 P.M. is
point *B* (*x* = 1). As Achilles's trajectory must be continuous,
by the definition of continuity (applied to instant *t* = *t** = 1 P.M.) we
obtain that the limit to which the position occupied by Achilles tends
as time approaches *t** = 1 P.M. coincides with Achilles's position at *t**
= 1 P.M. Since we also know that this limit is point *B* (*x* =
1), it finally follows that Achilles's position at *t** = 1 P.M. is point
*B* (*x* = 1). Now is when we can spot the flaw in the standard
argument against Zeno mentioned in section 2.1, which was grounded on
the observation that the sequence of distances covered by Achilles
(1/2, 1/2 + 1/4, 1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8, … ) has 1 as its limit. This
alone does not suffice to conclude that Achilles will reach point
*x* = 1, unless it is assumed that if the distances run by
Achilles have 1 as their limit, then Achilles will as a matter of fact
reach *x* = 1, but assuming this entails using the principle of
continuity. This principle affords us a rigorous demonstration of what,
in any event, was already plausible and intuitively
‘natural’: that after having performed the infinite
sequence of actions (*a*_{1}, *a*_{2}, *a*_{3},
… , *a*_{n}, … ) Achilles will have reached point *B*
(*x* = 1). In addition, now it is easy to show how, with a
switch like the one in Figure 2, Thomson's lamp in Figure 1 will reach
*t** = 2/9 with its switch in position *A**B* and will therefore be lit. We
have in fact already pointed out (3.1) that in this case, as we get
closer to the limit time *t** = 2/9, the switch indefinitely approaches a
well-defined limit position—position *A**B*. Due to the fact that the
principle of continuity applies to the switch, because it is a physical
body, this well-defined limit position must coincide precisely with the
position of the switch at *t** = 2/9. Therefore, at *t** = 2/9 the latter
will be in positon *A**B* and, consequently, the lamp will be lit. By the
same token, it can also be shown that the lamp in Figure 3 will be dim
at time *t** = 2/9.

### 3.3 The Postulate of Permanence

In Section 3.2, the principle of continuity helped us find the final
state resulting from the accomplishment of a supertask in cases in
which there exists a ‘natural’ limit for the state of the
physical system involved as time progressively approaches the instant
at which the supertask is achieved. Now it is considerably more
problematic to apply this principle to supertasks for which there is no
‘natural’ limit. For an example, let us consider Black's
infinity machine, introduced in Section 2.4, and let us ask ourselves
where the ball will be at instant *t** = 1 P.M. at which the supertask is
achieved. We can set up a reductio ad absurdum type of argument, as
follows. Assume that at *t** = 1 P.M. the ball were to occupy position *P*,
that it was in point *P*. According to the principle of continuity, it
follows that the limit to which the position occupied by the ball tends
as time approaches *t** = 1 P.M. is precisely position *P*. We know,
though, that Black's infinity machine makes the ball oscillate more and
more quickly between the fixed points *A* (*x* = 0) and *B*
(*x* = 1) as we get closer to *t** = 1 P.M., so the position of
the ball does not approach any definite limit as we get closer to *t** =
1 P.M. This conclusion patently contradicts what follows from the
principle of continuity. Therefore, the assumption that, after Black's
supertask is achieved (*t** = 1 P.M.), the ball is at point *P* leads to
contradiction with the principle of continuity. Thus, the ball cannot
be at point *P* at *t** = 1 P.M., and as the point can be any, given that
it has been chosen arbitrarily, the ball cannot be at any single one of
the points, which means that at *t** = 1 P.M. the ball has ceased to
exist. This funny conclusion is consistent with the principle of
continuity, as we have just seen, but it enters into contradiction with
what could be termed the ‘postulate of permanence’: no
material body (and by that we mean a given quantity of matter) can go
out of existence all of a sudden, without leaving any traces. The
postulate of permanence seems to characterise our world at least as
evidently as the principle of continuity. Notice in particular that
certain physical bodies (particles) may dematerialise, but that is not
inconsistent with the postulate of permanence since such a
dematerialisation leaves an energy trace (which is not true of Black's
ball). Consequently, we can see that the case Black's infinity machine
is one in which the principles of continuity and permanence turn out to
be mutually inconsistent. As long as we do not give up any of them, we
are forced to accept that such an infinity machine is physically
impossible.

### 3.4 On Burke's Impossibility Argument

Burke (2000b) proposed a new argument for the physical impossibility of supertasks based on the idea that their execution would entail the possibility of violating Newton's first law: a body cannot alter its state of motion without some external force acting on it. He imagines a passive Achilles being moved successively by an infinite numerable set of machines *M*_{n}. My presentation differs in secondary details from Burke's to concentrate on the essential issues. For each positive integer *n*, *M*_{n} will only act on Achilles in an interval of time of the magnitude 1/*n* − 1/(*n*+1), and will proceed as follows: if at some moment Achilles is at point *x*_{n} = 1/*n*^{2} then it will take him to the point *x*_{n+1} = 1/(*n*+1)^{2} in a time 1/*n* − 1/(*n*+1) and (vice versa) if at any time Achilles is at *x*_{n+1} = 1/(*n*+1)^{2} it will take him and transfer him to *x*_{n} = 1/*n*^{2} in a time 1/*n* − 1/(*n*+1). Now suppose that Achilles places himself at *x*_{1} = 1 in *t* = 1. Presumably the machines *M*_{n} will act successively on him, collectively performing a supertask that will bring the warrior in *t* = 2 to rest at *x* = 0 (as, under the principle of continuity, Achilles' path must be continuous). Is this true? Burke appeals to the temporal symmetry of the physical laws involved to argue that, if this is the case, then the machines *M*_{n} must also be capable of taking Achilles to *x*_{1} = 1 in *t* = 1 if he is initially at rest at *x* = 0 in *t* = 0 (executing the reverse process to the previous one). But, says Burke, if Achilles is at rest at *x* = 0 in *t* = 0, the machines *M*_{n} will be incapable of taking him to *x*_{1} = 1 in *t* = 1 for the simple reason that each machine operates at a finite distance to the right of *x* = 0. So, none of them is capable of setting him in motion, which means that Achilles remains at *x* = 0 even after *t* = 0 (Newton's first law). This means that the reverse process is not physically possible and, for reasons of temporal symmetry, the direct one is not possible either. And as the direct process is a standard supertask, its physical impossibility justifies the physical impossibility of supertasks in general.

The argument is original and refuting it involves an idea important in
the context of other problems associated with supertasks, as we shall
see later on. The key lies in recognizing that the fact that
no *M*_{n} can take Achilles away
from *x* = 0 is not enough to conclude that, in the absence of
any other possible influence, Achilles cannot leave *x* = 0. We
might consider the set of *M*_{n} as a new
machine, ‘super *M*’, which obviously can exert a
non-null force on Achilles at points arbitrarily close to *x* =
0 (unlike any individual machine). The *M*_{n}
are individually incapable of setting somebody (Achilles) to their
left in motion, but it does not follow that they are also incapable of
doing so collectively. Burke's argument fails here. Furthermore (as
Pérez Laraudogoitia argues in (2006a) and is immediately
verifiable) we can design machines *M**_{n}
capable of guaranteeing that, by handling Achilles exactly as
the *M*_{n} would, an Achilles at rest
at *x* = 0 in *t* = 0 would be taken by them
to *x*_{1} = 1 in *t* = 1. It is enough to
program each *M**_{n} thus: whatever the point
at which Achilles is at in the
instant *t*_{n+1} = 1/(*n*+1), it shall
take him to *x*_{n} = 1/*n*^{2}
in the instant *t*_{n} = 1/*n*.

## 4. The Physics of Supertasks

As we do not know exactly what laws of nature there are, it goes without saying that the question whether a particular supertask is physically possible (that is, compatible with those laws) cannot be given a definitive answer in general. What we have done in 3 above is rather to set out necessary conditions for physical possibility which are plausible (such as the principle of continuity) and sufficient conditions for physical impossibility which are likewise plausible (such as Grünbaum's criterion of kinematical impossibility). In this section we shall look into a problem related to the one just dealt with, but one to which a definitive answer can be given: the problem of deciding whether a certain supertask is possible within the framework of a given physical theory, that is, whether it is compatible with the principles of that theory. These are two distinct problems. At this stage our object are theories whereas in 3 above we were concerned with the real world. What we are after is supertasks formulated within the defined framework of a given physical theory which can tell us something exciting and/or new about that theory. We will discover that this search will lead us right into the heart of basic theoretical problems.

### 4.1 A New Form of Indeterminism: Spontaneous Self-Excitation

Classical dynamics is a theory that studies the motion of physical
bodies which interact among themselves in various ways. The vast
majority of interesting examples of supertasks within this theory have
been elaborated under the assumption that the particles involved only
interact with one another by means of elastic collisions, that is,
collisions in which no energy is dissipated. We shall see here that
supertasks of type *w** give rise to a new form of
indeterministic behaviour of dynamical systems. The most simple type of
case (Pérez Laraudogoitia 1996) is illustrated by the particle
system represented in Figure 4 at three distinct moments. It consists
of an infinite set of identical point particles *P*_{1},
*P*_{2}, *P*_{3}, … , *P*_{n}, …
arranged in a straight line. Take the situation depicted in Figure 4A
first. In it *P*_{1} is at one unity distance from the coordinate
origin *O*, *P*_{2} at a distance 1/2 of *O*, *P*_{3} at a
distance 1/3 of *O* and so on. In addition, let it be that all the
particles are at rest, except for *P*_{1}, which is approaching *O*
with velocity *v* = 1. Suppose that all this takes place at *t* =
0. Now we will employ

Figure 4

the well-known dynamic theorem by which if two identical particles
undergo an elastic collision then they will exchange their velocities
after colliding. If our particles *P*_{1}, *P*_{2},
*P*_{3}, … collide elastically, it is easy to predict what
will happen after *t* = 0 with the help of this theorem. In the event
that *P*_{1} were on its own, it would reach *O* at *t* = 1, but in
fact it will collide with *P*_{2} and lie at rest there, while
*P*_{2} will acquire velocity *v* = 1. If *P*_{1}
and *P*_{2} were on their own, then it would be *P*_{2}
that would reach *O* at *t* = 1, but *P*_{2} will in fact collide
with *P*_{3}, and lie at rest there, while *P*_{3} will
acquire velocity *v* = 1. Again, it can be said that if
*P*_{1}, *P*_{2} and *P*_{3} were on their own, then
it is *P*_{3} that would reach *O* at *t* = 1, but in actual fact it
will collide with *P*_{4} and lie at rest there, while
*P*_{4} will acquire velocity *v* = 1, and so on. From the
foregoing it follows that no particle will get to *O* at *t* = 1, because
it will be impeded by a collision with another particle. Therefore, at
*t* = 1 all the particles will already lie at rest, which yields the
configuration in Figure 4B. Since *P*_{1} stopped when it
collided with *P*_{2}, it will occupy the position *P*_{2}
had initially (at *t* = 0). Similarly, *P*_{2} stopped after
colliding with *P*_{3} and so it will occupy the position
*P*_{3} had initially (at *t* = 0), … , etc. If we view each
collision as an action (which is plausible, since it involves a sudden
change of velocities), it turns out that between *t* = 0 and *t* = 1 our
evolving particle system has performed a supertask of type *w*.
The second dynamic theorem we will make use of says that if a dynamic
process is possible, then the process resulting from inverting the
direction in which all the bodies involved in it move is also possible.
Applying this to our case, if the process leading from the system in
the situation depicted in Figure 4A to the situation depicted in Figure
4B is possible (and we have just seen it is), then the process obtained
by simply inverting the direction in which the particles involved move
will also be possible. This new possible process does not bring the
system from configuration 4B back to configuration 4A but rather
changes it into configuration 4C (as the direction in which
*P*_{1} moves must be inverted). As the direct process lasts one
time unity (from *t* = 0 to *t* = 1), so will the inverse process, and as
in the direct process the system performs a supertask of type
*w*, in the inverse process it will perform one of type
*w**. What is interesting about this new supertask of type
*w**? What's interesting is that it takes the system from a
situation (4B) in which all its component particles are at rest to
another situation (4C) in which not all of them are. This means that
the system has self-excited, because no external influence has been
exerted on it, and, what is more, it has done so spontaneously and
unpredictably, because the supertask can set off at any instant and
there is no way of predicting when it will happen. We have found a
supertask of type *w** to be the source of a new form of
dynamical indeterminism. The reason we speak of indeterminism is
because there is no initial movement to the performance of the
supertask. The system self-excites in such a way that each particle is
set off by a collision with another one, and it is the ordinal type
*w** of the sequence of collisions accomplished in a finite time
that guarantees movement, without the need for a ‘prime
mover’. Now movement without a ‘prime mover’ is
precisely what characterises the dynamical indeterminism linked to
supertasks of type *w**.

The previous model of supertask in the form of spontaneous self-excitation is valid in relativistic classical dynamics as well as non-relativistic classical dynamics and can also be extended—though not in a completely obvious way, see Pérez Laraudogoitia (2001)—to the Newtonian theory of universal gravitation. The core idea behind indeterministic behaviour in all these cases is that the configuration of a physical system consisting of a denumerable infinite number of parts can be such that the solutions to the dynamic equations—in principle, one for each one of the parts—turn out to be coupled. A particular case of this situation (but probably the most important case, as it is the one that can be generalised more straightforwardly) is that in which the connection between solutions stems from the fact that the dynamic equations themselves are coupled as a result of the configuration of the system. Norton (1999) has availed himself of precisely this possibility, thus introducing a model of spontaneous self-excitation in quantum mechanics. Even though the indeterminism vanishes in this case when the normalizability of the state vector is imposed, this does not make his proposal any less interesting: after all, the free particle solutions to Schrodinger's equation are not normalizable either.

For reference purposes, we shall call the type of spontaneous
self-excitation we have considered until now a type I self-excitation,
which is characterized by the fact that the internal energy of an
isolated system of particles changes (increases) suddenly and
unpredictably. But the physics of supertasks allows, in the specific
case of non-relativistic classical dynamics, a qualitatively different
variety of self-excitation that we shall call a type II
self-excitation: this is the self-excitation of a void (Pérez
Laraudogoitia, 1998). To see how it works, we should remember once
again the configuration of Figure 4B, which we modify trivially in two
steps: a) by ensuring all the
particles *P*_{i} are at rest
in *x*_{i} = (1/(*i*+1)) − 1 =
− *i*/(*i*+1), which means taking them *en bloc*
one unit to the left and b) by simultaneously placing a numerable
infinity of particles *P**_{i} (identical
to *P*_{i}) at rest
at *x**_{i} = *i*/(*i*+1). The
resulting configuration is symmetrical with respect to the origin of
coordinates *O*, with the asterisk particles to the right and
the non-asterisk ones to the left. We already know that both the set
of particles to the left of the origin and the set of particles to the
right may spontaneously and unpredictably self-excite provoking the
successive movement of the particles at any velocity (for the sake of
brevity we shall then say they self-excite at the particular velocity
in question). Suppose now that: 1) in *t* = 1 the particles on
the left self-excite at velocity *v* = 2 (the excitation will
extinguish in *t* = 1+1), 2) in *t* = 1+1 the particles
to the right self-excite at velocity *v* = 4 (the excitation
will extinguish in *t* = 1+1+(1/2)), 3) in *t* =
1+1+(1/2)) the particles on the left self-excite at
velocity *v* = 8 (the excitation will extinguish in *t*
= 1+1+(1/2)+(1/4)), 4) in *t* = 1+1+(1/2)+(1/4) the particles
on the right self-excite at at velocity *v* = 16 (the
excitation will extinguish in *t* = 1+1+(1/2)+(1/4)+(1/8)), and
so on successively. In *t* = 1+1+1 = 3 a numerable infinity of
self-excitations of type I will have occurred. During this (finite)
time, any one particle will have oscillated an infinite number of
times between its initial position and the position of the particle to
its right that was initially closest to it. As there is a finite
distance between these two positions that will have been covered an
infinite number of times in a finite time, the particle in question
essentially evolves like Black's particle analyzed in section 2.4. It
will therefore disappear in *t* = 3. In other words,
in *t* = 3 the infinity of
particles *P*_{i}, *P**_{i}
will have disappeared leaving a void. By now performing the temporal
reversion of this whole process of disappearance, what occurs is in
fact a complex process of self-excitation of the void by means of
which, spontaneously and unpredictably, there emerges a numerable
infinity of identical particles. This is an example of type II
self-excitation. The disappearance in *t* = 3 of the infinity
of
particles *P*_{i}, *P**_{i}
certainly violates the Postulate of Permanence introduced in section
3.3 (and also the necessary conditions for kinematic possibility of
Grünbaum, as seen in section 3.1) but what is important here is
that it does not violate any of the postulates of classical
mechanics. In particular, the standard formulation of the principle of
conservation of mass: ‘Particle World lines do not have
beginning or end points and mass is constant along a World line’
(Earman 1986) is not contradicted, because none of the World lines of
particles *P*_{i}, *P**_{i}
genuinely has an end point.

Until now we have only seen examples of self-excitations in systems of
infinite mass, but this is not an essential condition. Taking
advantage of the structural similarity between the equations of the
dynamics of translation and the dynamics of rotation, Pérez
Laraudogoitia (2007a) proposed an analogous model to the one in Figure
4, but in the dynamics of rotation, in which, instead of infinite
particles of equal mass placed in a line, infinite rectangular-shaped
thin rigid rods of equal momentum of inertia are included in one
another. Despite having a finite mass, this system may self-excite as
simply as the one in Figure 4B, although its spatial extension must be
infinite to maintain the condition of equal momentums of
inertia. Atkinson (2007) proved that the spatially limited system of
particles in Figure 4B can also spontaneously self-excite in classical
mechanics when the mass of *P*_{n}
is *m*_{n} = (2/(*n*+1)) −
(2/(*n*+2)), which obviously corresponds to a total mass of
unit value. Finally, Pérez Laraudogoitia (2007b) showed that,
for this same system but in the relativistic case, the spontaneous
self-excitation is possible
providing *q*_{n+1} =
(*k**q*_{n}+*k*)/(1+*k*+*k*^{2}−*k**q*_{n})
(where *q*_{n}
= *m*_{n+1}/*m*_{n},
with 0 < k < 1), and which also corresponds to a case of total
finite mass if q_{1} < k.

### 4.2 A New Form of Indeterminism: Global Interaction

A simple modification of the initial conditions illustrated in Figure 4A leads to a qualitatively different type of supertask that is interesting in itself. Now suppose that all the particles *P*_{1},
*P*_{2}, *P*_{3}, … are at rest
at the beginning, while a new particle *P*_{0}
(identical to them) approaches the origin *O* at unit velocity
but from the left of *O*. Alper & Bridger (1998) were the first
to consider this situation, arguing that it is incompatible with
Newtonian mechanics. Their argument went like
this: *P*_{0} cannot
hit *P*_{i} because in order to do
so *P*_{0} must have passed
through *P*_{i+1}, the particle lying
immediately to the left
of *P*_{i}. Therefore *P*_{0}
cannot hit any particle. On the other hand, if *P*_{0}
does not hit any particle, then its motion is undisturbed, and it
arrives at, for example, position *x* = 1/2 at a certain
instant of time. But there is a particle,
namely *P*_{2}, at *x* =
1/2. *P*_{0} must hit *P*_{2},
contradicting the conclusion that *P*_{0} hits none of
the particles. As Pérez Laraudogoitia (2005) underscored, this
argument is fallacious. To see why, consider the innocent example of
the collision between two identical solid spheres (of, let us say,
unit ratio), *X* and *Y*. Let us suppose that *Y*
is mentally divided into an infinite number of concentric
spheres *Y*_{i} in the following
way: *Y*_{1} is a solid sphere of radius 1/2
and *Y*_{i} (*i* > 1) is a hollow
sphere of interal radius (*i*−1)/*i* and external
radius *i*/(*i*+1). Clearly, although *X*
collides with *Y* it does not collide with any of
the *Y*_{i} (*Y*_{i}
is pushed at most by *Y*_{i+1}
and *Y*_{i−1}) and this despite the fact
that *Y* is the set of *Y*_{i}s. This
may seem enigmatic at first sight, largely because we tend to pass
inadvertently from

(A) If *X* collides with *Y* then at least one division into parts of *Y* exists such that *X* collides with one of the parts

which is true, to

(B) If *X* collides with *Y* then for all divisions into parts of *Y*, *X* collides with one of the parts

which is false. In the process, one goes fallaciously from an
existential to a universal statement, and after wrongly settling on
(B), one finds it impossible for *X* to collide with *Y*
given the division of *Y* into *Y*_{i}
parts, none of which collides with *X*. One then commits a
fallacy of composition by assuming here that the whole must have the
properties of its parts: if none of
the *Y*_{i} parts collides with *X*
then *Y* cannot collide with *X*. Of course *Y*
collides with *X*, and as *Y* is the set
of *Y*_{i}s it turns out
that *X* collides with the set
of *Y*_{i}s, but does not collide with
any *Y*_{i} separately. One can say
that *X* collides collectively, but not distributively, with
the set of *Y*_{i}s and, in more physical
terms, that *X* interacts (collides) globally with
the *Y*_{i}s. We thus recover the idea of
collective action seen in the analysis of Burke's argument concerning
impossibility in 3.4. The fact that
the *Y*_{i}s were obtained by a process of
mental division of *Y* is irrelevant. One may convert them, if
one so desires, into ‘physical’ parts by supposing
that *Y*_{i} is made from matter with
density *i*/(*i*+1). The conclusion, then, is that a
physical system *S*_{1} can collide (globally) with
another system *S*_{2} without colliding with any of
the physical parts of which *S*_{2} is made. Now the
error in Alper and Bridger's argument becomes clear: the
particle *P*_{0} collides (globally) with the set of
the *P*_{i} (*i* > 0) without doing
so with any separately, which means that their statement
‘if *P*_{0} does not hit any particle, then its
motion is undisturbed’ is not justified. This of course means
that the conclusion (based on the foregoing statement) that their
system is incompatible with Newtonian mechanics is not justified
either.

Indeed, the global collision of *P*_{0} with the set of
the *P*_{i} leads to a new form of
indeterminism. If, as in a typical elastic collision, we impose the
classical laws of the conservation of energy and linear momentum, then
one possible evolution from the instant of the global collision is one
in which *P*_{0} excites the infinite system of
the *P*_{i} (*i* > 0) at unit
velocity (remember the terminology of section 4.1) before coming to
rest and *P*_{1} finally moving away from
origin *O* at that unit velocity. But there is also the
possibility of *P*_{0} rebounding backwards after its
global collision to provoke the excitation of the system of
the *P*_{i} at not one but two different
velocities. For instance, readers may verify that the laws of
conservation referred to are observed in Newtonian mechanics if, in
the final state, *P*_{0} moves away from the
origin *O* to the left at velocity 1/4 whereas
finally *P*_{1} moves away to the right at velocity
(5+5^{1/2})/8 and *P*_{2} at velocity
(5−5^{1/2})/8 while the
other *P*_{i} come to rest. It is not
difficult to verify that the global collision
of *P*_{0} could also excite the system of
the *P*_{i} with any number greater than 2 of
different velocities. Having seen in section 4.1 that the
self-excitation of a dynamical system entailed a new source of
indeterminism, we now verify that global interaction provides another,
different source, although linked to the previous one by the fact that
it causes excitations that, in absence of external influences, could
be spontaneous.

Peijnenburg & Atkinson (2008 and forthcoming) also analyzed the problem
proposed by Alper & Bridger (1998), proposing a different solution,
although still closely linked to the previous one. They reject the
latter's path to contradiction at the same point at which Pérez
Laraudogoitia (2005) does, namely: ‘if *P*_{0}
does not hit any particle, then its motion is undisturbed’ is
not justified. But their rejection has another formulation. They
propose distinguishing between ‘collision’ as ‘
making contact’ (when two bodies *X* and *Y*
collide, then *X* and *Y* come in contact with one
another, in the sense that at least one point of *X* occupies
the same location in space as does one point of *Y*) and
‘collision’ as ‘zero distance’. Although
both notions coincide in topologically closed bodies, this is not the
case when topologically open bodies are involved, like the set of
particles *P*_{i} (*i* > 0). In the
instant *P*_{0} arrives at the origin *O* it
does not collide with the other particles in the first sense of
‘making contact’. But under the definition of ‘
collision’ as ‘zero distance
’, *P*_{0} does indeed collide with the set of
stationary balls at the origin *O*. Although
Peijnenburg & Atkinson's treatment might seem equivalent to Pérez
Laraudogoitia's, it is in fact less general, as there are cases of
global interaction that it can't account for. Simplifying the model
proposed in Pérez Laraudogoitia (2006b), let us assume that
for *t* < 0 we have, in the plane z = 0, a rigid disc D of
radius r = 2 at rest and centred on the origin, and above it, in the
plane z = 1, we have in t = 0 a denumerable infinite set of rigid
rings *R*_{i} of equal mass, null thickness,
radii *r*_{i} = *i*/(*i*+1) and
velocities *v*_{i} = *i* moving
towards *D*. In no instant subsequent to *t* = 0
may *D* still be in the plane *z* = 0, because in that
case it would have been ‘pierced through’ by an infinite
number of rigid rings. This means that, in *t* = 0, *D*
interacts globally with the infinite set
of *R*_{i} in Pérez Laraudogoitia's
sense, despite the fact that, the distance between *D* and
the *R*_{i} being equal in this instant to the
unit, *D* cannot collide with
the *R*_{i} in any of the senses considered by
Peijnenburg & Atkinson. Peijnenburg & Atkinson's analysis fails when faced
with situations like this, demonstrating that it is not sufficiently
general.

### 4.3 Energy and Momentum Conservation in Supertasks

In sections 4.1 and 4.2 we considered the problem of indeterminism in
supertasks formulated principally in the sphere of classical mechanics
or relativistic mechanics. This section provides a brief review of the
closely related issue of energy and momentum conservation in
supertasks generated from initial states topologically similar to the
ones in Figure 4A in the following precise
sense: *P*_{1} may have any velocity (towards the left)
while the rest of the particles will be at rest to the left
of *P*_{1} in arbitrary positions
on *P*_{1}'s line of advance (but
with *P*_{j} to the left
of *P*_{i} if *j* > *i*) and
such that these positions have a point of accumulation *O*.

From 4.1 it obviously follows that when the total mass is infinite
both energy conservation and momentum conservation may be violated (in
classical and relativistic mechanics alike). They are violated, for
instance, when all the particles are identical. Atkinson (2007)
proposed the first model with total finite mass in Newtonian mechanics
in which the energy was not conserved, although momentum was, and
showed that in this mechanics momentum will be conserved provided
that: *C*_{1}) total mass is
finite, *C*_{2}) if *j* > *i* the mass
of *P*_{j} is less than those of
the *P*_{i}, and *C*_{3}) each
particle *P*_{n+1} undergoes in the process
exactly two collisions (one with each of its immediate neighbours)
while *P*_{1} undergoes just one. He also demonstrated
that, in relativistic mechanics and under these same three conditions,
energy conservation will be violated if and only if momentum
conservation is violated (in marked contrast to the classical case),
and that such violations will in fact take place unless the masses of
the particles *P*_{n} decrease very rapidly
with *n* (Atkinson 2008 shows that violation will occur, for
example, if *m*_{n} =
2^{−n}·*m*_{0}). Finally,
Atkinson & Johnson (forthcoming) have shown that the temporal reversal
of the state resulting from a process performed under
conditions *C*_{1}), *C*_{2})
and *C*_{3}) lead in turn to an indeterministic
process: there is an arbitrary parameter in the general solution to
the equations of the particles' movement that corresponds to the
injection of an arbitrary amount of energy (classically), or
energy-momentum (relativistically), into the system at the point of
accumulation of the locations of these particles. This last, highly
general result poses the question of whether in the classical (or
relativistic) dynamics of supertasks there is an intrinsic connection
between indeterminism and the non-conservation of energy. Pérez
Laraudogoitia (2009a) proves there isn't by showing a specific example
of supertask (although qualitatively different from the ones
considered by Atkinson & Johnson) in which the energy is conserved
despite the evolution of the physical system analized being
indeterministic. This latter model is also of interest because it
remains valid when the rigid bodies assumed in its description are
replaced, whether classically or relativistically, by deformable
solids. Furthermore, as the total mass may be as small as one wishes
without affecting the description of the evolution, it might be argued
that even the inclusion of gravitation will not affect the
results. This is probably the clearest example of how supertasks are
possible in the context of specific physical theories that also make
realistic assumptions.

### 4.4 Actions without Interaction

The configuration of identical particles introduced in section 4.1,
and the resulting possibility of spontaneous self-excitation, has
inspired a new type of problem that can be formulated in terms of
supertasks (although not only in terms of supertasks), that is
qualitatively different to the ones considered until now. It is a
commonplace that, when we act physcally on a system (which entails
exerting influence in some way on its evolution), we do so by
interacting with it. However, Pérez Laraudogoitia (2009b) has
shown that a numerable infinity of actors (Gods, or machines suitably
programmed) may act physically on an infinite set of particles
provoking its self-excitation without interacting with the set in
question. Let us consider the system of identical particles in Figure
4A, with the sole difference that *P*_{1} is also at
rest (in general, *P*_{i} is at rest
at *x*_{i} = 1/*i*). We know that it
may spontaneously self-excite at any moment at any velocity, although
we shall assume that in *t* = 0 all
the *P*_{i} are at rest. Let God_{1},
God_{2}, God_{3}, … be a numerable totality of
Gods (machines) such that God_{n} has the capacity to
control particle *P*_{n} and only
particle *P*_{n}. Taking *t** > 0,
let us suppose that the Gods now decide to pursue the following course
of action: God_{n} shall prevent, at any 0
< *t* < *t** +
(1/*n*), *P*_{n} from abandoning
point *x*_{n} = 1/*n*, but if,
from *t** + (1/*n*), *P*_{n}
does not acquire a unit velocity towards the right by other means
(although even for a limited time) then it (God_{n})
shall provide it (*n* = 1, 2, 3, …). The interesting,
and surprising, thing in this case is that the Gods will manage to
make the system of particles self-excite at *t** at unit
velocity and they will do so without interacting with it, meaning we
will indeed have a case of action without interaction that does,
however, alter the dynamic state of the particles (all at rest
in *t* = 0). This is easy to see in two steps:

(I) For every *n*, *P*_{n} will acquire
from *t** + (1/*n*) unit velocity to the right
(although, for *n* > 1, for a limited time). This is so
because, should there be no other process providing it with unit
velocity from *t** + (1/*n*), we know that
God_{n} will provide it.

(II) For every *n*, *P*_{n} will
acquire from *t** + (1/*n*) unit velocity to the right
as a result of receiving the impact
of *P*_{n+1}. This is so because, according to
(I), *P*_{n+1} acquired from *t** +
(1/(*n*+1)) unit velocity to the right which led it to collide
with *P*_{n} at *t** +
(1/(*n*+1)) + ((1/*n*) − (1/(*n*+1)))
= *t** + (1/*n*), transmitting that velocity to it
from *t** + (1/*n*), which implies that
God_{n} does not in fact interact
with *P*_{n}.

From (II) it follows that the set of particles will self-excite
precisely at *t**, that no God_{n} interacts
with any particle, but that the set of Gods caused this
self-excitation by acting physically without interaction on the set in
question on the basis of the policy referred to earlier. Indeed, if
only the particles existed (without Gods), then from the configuration
in *t* = 0 an infinity of different possibilities of evolution
would be open to them, an infinity that the Gods have reduced
significantly by preventing any self-excitation before *t** and
provoking one in *t**: this is precisely how they acted on
them. From this Pérez Laraudogoitia (2009b) concludes that
indeterminism is a necessary condition for actions without
interaction.

### 4.5 The Spaceship Paradox

Benardete (1964) formulates what has since then come to be known as
the spaceship paradox in the following terms: ‘Indeed one minute
will suffice to enable us to exhaust an infinite world. We have only
to launch a rocket and travel one thousand miles into outer space
during the first 1/2 minute, another one thousand miles after that
during the next 1/4 minute, still another one thousand miles during
the next 1/8 minute, &c. * ad infinitum *. At the end of the
minute we shall have succeeded in travelling an infinite
distance’ (p. 149). The situation described here has all the
characteristic ingredients of a classical supertask and the whiff of
paradox arises when we wonder, like Benardete: ‘At the end of
the minute we find ourselves an infinite distance from Earth
… *Where in the World are we?*’ The question only
makes sense in a Newtonian universe, where there is no limit to the
velocity that a material body can achieve. Indeed, Pérez
Laraudogoitia (1997) constructed a model of the spaceship paradox in
classical particle mechanics in which a numerable infinity of
identical particles, distributed along the positive *X* axis
with unbounded velocities, collide with each other in an orderly
fashion in a finite time, each transmitting to the following one
progressively increasing velocities in accordance with a process
essentially identical to the one imagined by Benardete. Oppy (2006)
rejected the possibility of this kind of process, reasoning that there
is no possible World in which the speed of the spaceship is
infinite. However, his criticism is not convincing to the extent that
in Benardete's scenario only the average velocity (and average
acceleration) needs to be infinite, not the instantaneous velocity (or
acceleration). In any case the air of paradox disappears if we apply
coherently the principle of continuity seen in section 3.2. From that,
it follows that at the end of the minute Benardete's spaceship will
not be anywhere, as we saw occurring in section 4.1 with Black's
particle introduced previously in section 2.4.

The temporal reversion of this curious evolution of a flight to infinity is an unpredictable process of arrival from infinity, which would appear to sanction an odd asymmetry between the two situations: the escape is deterministic while the arrival from infinity is not. However, Pérez Laraudogoitia (forthcoming) has shown that this asymmetry is much less profound than it appears. By elaborating an infinite sequence of suitably programmed finite tasks (which recall, although with far greater complexity, the ones taken on by the Gods in section 4.4 to achieve actions without interaction), it is possible to design supertasks capable of ‘bringing’ a spaceship from infinity in a perfectly planned and deterministic way. The intriguing possibility of manipulating the conditions at infinity to predict what we are going to ‘take’ from there (consistently, certainly, with the principle of mass conservation announced in section 4.1) is a further example of the new conceptual possibilities opened up by the supertask concept.

However, to date we have only discussed models of supertasks in classical mechanics, relativistic mechanics and quantum mechanics. The physics of supertasks in the context of the other major closed physical theory, general relativity, will be the topic of the following two subsections.

### 4.6 Bifurcated Supertasks

Within relativity theory, supertasks have been approached from a
radically different perspective from the one adopted here so far. This
new perspective is inherently interesting, since it links the problem
of supertasks up with the relativistic analysis of the structure of
space-time. To get an insight into the nature of that connection, let
us first notice that, according to the theory of relativity, the
duration of a process will not be the same in different reference
systems but will rather vary according to the reference system within
which it is measured. This leaves open the possibility that a process
which lasts an infinite amount of time when measured within reference
system *O* may last a finite time when measured within a different
reference system *O*′.

The supertask literature has needed to exploit space-times with sufficiently complicated structure that global reference systems cannot be defined in them. In these and other cases, the time of a process can be represented by its ‘proper time’. If we represent a process by its world-line in space-time, the proper time of the process is the time read by a good clock that moves with the process along its world-line. A familiar example of its use is the problem of the twins in special relativity. One twin stays home on earth and grows old. Forty years of proper time, for example, elapses along his world-line. The travelling twin accelerates off into space and returns to find his sibling forty years older. But much less time — say only a year of proper time — will have elapsed along the travelling twin world-line if he has accelerated to sufficiently great speeds.

If we take this into account it is easily seen that the definition of supertask that we have been using is ambiguous. In section 1 above we defined a supertask as an infinite sequence of actions or operations carried out in a finite interval of time. But we have not specified in whose proper time we measure the finite interval of time. Do we take the proper time of the process under consideration? Or do we take the proper time of some observer who watches the process? It turns out that relativity theory allows the former to be infinite while the latter is finite. This fact opens new possibilities for supertasks. Relativity theory thus forces us to disambiguate our definition of supertask, and there is actually one natural way to do it. We can use Black's idea — presented in 2.4 — of an infinity machine, a device capable of performing a supertask, to redefine a supertask as an infinite sequence of actions or operations carried out by an infinity machine in a finite interval of the machine's own proper time measured within the reference system associated to the machine. This redefinition of the notion of supertask does not change anything that has been said until now; our whole discussion remains unaffected so long as ‘finite interval of time’ is read as ‘finite interval of the machine's proper time’. This notion of supertask, disambiguated so as to accord with relativity theory, will be denoted by the expression ‘supertask-1’. Thus:

Supertask-1: an infinite sequence of actions or operations carried out by an infinity machine in a finite interval of the machine's proper time.

However we might also imagine a machine that carries out an infinite sequence of actions or operations in an infinite machine proper time, but that the entire process can be seen by an observer in a finite amount of the observer's proper time.

It is convenient at this stage to introduce a contrasting notion:

Supertask-2: an infinite sequence of actions or operations carried out by a machine in a finite interval of an observer's proper time.

While we did not take relativity theory into account, the notions of supertask-1 and supertask-2 coincided. The duration of an interval of time between two given events is the same for all observers. However in relativistic spacetimes this is no longer so and the two notions of supertasks become distinct. Even though all supertasks-1 are also supertasks-2, there may in principle be supertasks-2 which are not supertasks-1. For instance, it could just so happen that there is a machine (not necessarily an infinity machine) which carries out an infinite number of actions in an interval of its own proper time of infinite duration, but in an interval of some observer's proper time of finite duration. Such a machine would have performed a supertask-2 but not a supertask-1.

The distinction between supertasks-1 and supertasks-2 is certainly no relativistic hair-splitting. Why? Because those who hold that, while conceptually possible, supertasks are physically impossible (this seems to be the position adopted by Benacerraf and Putnam (1964), for instance) usually mean that supertasks-1 are physically impossible. But from this, it does not follow that supertasks-2 must also be physically impossible. Relativity theory thus adds a brand-new, exciting extra dimension to the challenge presented by supertasks. Earman and Norton (1996), who have studied this issue carefully, use the name ‘bifurcated supertasks’ to refer specifically to supertasks-2 which are not supertasks-1, and I will adopt this term.

### 4.7 Bifurcated Supertasks and the Solution to the Philosophical Problem of Supertasks

What shape does the philosophical problem posed by supertasks — introduced in Section 1.2 — take on now? Remember that the problem lay in specifying the set of sentences which describe the state of the world after the supertask has been performed. The problem will now be to specify the set of sentences which describe the relevant state of the world after the bifurcated supertask has been performed. Before this can done, of course, the question needs to be answered whether a bifurcated supertask is physically possible. Given that we agree that compatibility with relativity theory is a necessary and sufficient condition of physical possibility, we can reply in the affirmative.

Pitowsky (1990) first showed how this compatibility might arise. He
considered a Minkowski spacetime, the spacetime of special relativity.
He showed that an observer *O** who can maintain a sufficient increase in
his acceleration will find that only a finite amount of proper time
elapses along his world-line in the course of the complete history of
the universe, while other unaccelerated observers would find an
infinite proper time elapsing on theirs.

Let us suppose that some machine *M* accomplishes a bifurcated
supertask in such a way that the infinite sequence of actions involved
happens in a finite interval of an observer *O*'s proper
time. If we imagine such an observer at some event on his world-line,
all those events from which he can retrieve information are in the
‘past light cone’ of the observer. That is, the observer
can receive signals travelling at or less than the speed of light from
any event in his past light cone. The philosophical problem posed by
the bifurcated supertask accomplished by *M* has a particularly
simple solution when the infinite sequence of actions carried out
by *M* is fully contained within the past light cone of an
event on observer *O*'s world-line. In such a case the relevant
state of the world after the bifurcated supertask has been performed
is *M*'s state, and this, in principle, can be specified,
since *O* has causal access to it. Unfortunately, a situation
of this type does not arise in the simple bifurcated supertask devised
by Pitowsky (1990). In his supertask, while the accelerated
observer *O** will have a finite upper bound on the proper time
elapsed on his world-line, there will be no event on his world-line
from which he can look back and see an infinity of time elapsed along
the world-line of some unaccelerated observer.

To find a spacetime in which the philosophical problem posed by bifurcated supertasks admits of the simple solution that has just been mentioned, we will move from the flat spacetime of special relativity to the curved spacetimes of general relativity. One type of spacetime in the latter class that admits of this simple solution has been dubbed Malament-Hogarth spacetime, from the names of the first scholars to use them (Hogarth 1992). An example of such a spacetime is an electrically charged black hole (the Reissner-Nordstroem spacetime). A well known property of black holes is that, in the view of those who remain outside, unfortunates who fall in appear to freeze in time as they approach the event horizon of the black hole. Indeed those who remain outside could spend an infinite lifetime with the unfortunate who fell in frozen near the event horizon. If we just redescribe this process from the point of view of the observer who does fall in to the black hole, we discover that we have a bifurcated supertask. The observer falling in perceives no slowing down of time in his own processes. He sees himself reaching the event horizon quite quickly. But if he looks back at those who remain behind, he sees their processes sped up indefinitely. By the time he reaches the event horizon, those who remain outside will have completed infinite proper time on their world-lines. Of course, the cost is high. The observer who flings himself into a black hole will be torn apart by tidal forces and whatever remains after this would be unable to return to the world in which he started.

## 5. What Supertasks Entail for the Philosophy of Mathematics

### 5.1 A Critique of Intuitionism

The possibility of supertasks has interesting consequences for the
philosophy of mathematics. To start with, take a well-known unsolved
mathematical problem, for example that of knowing whether Goldbach's
conjecture is or is not correct. Goldbach's conjecture asserts that any
even number greater than 2 is the sum of two prime numbers. Nobody has
been capable of showing whether this is true yet, but if supertasks are
possible, that question can be resolved. Let us, to that effect,
perform the supertask of type *w* consisting in the following
sequence of actions: action *a*_{1} involves checking whether the
first pair greater than 2 (number 4) is the sum of two prime numbers or
not; let this action be accomplished at *t* = 0.3 P.M.; action
*a*_{2} involves checking whether the second pair greater than 2
(number 6) is the sum of two prime numbers or not; let this action be
accomplished at *t* = 0.33 P.M.; action *a*_{3} involves checking
whether the third pair greater than 2 (number 8) is the sum of two
prime numbers or not; let this action be accomplished at *t* = 0.333
P.M., and so on. It is clear that at *t* = 0.33333… = 1/3 P.M.,
the instant at which the supertask has already been performed, we will
have checked all the pairs greater than 2, and, therefore, will have
found some which is not the sum of two prime numbers or else will have
found all of them to be the sum of two prime numbers. In the first
case, we will know at *t* = 1/3 P.M. that Goldbach's conjecture is false;
in the second case we will know at *t* = 1/3 P.M. that it is true. Weyl
(1949) seems to have been the first to point to this intriguing method
—the use of supertaks—for settling mathematical questions about
natural numbers. He, however, rejected it on the basis of his finitist
conception of mathematics; since the performance of a supertask
involves the successive carrying out of an actual infinity of actions
or operations, and the infinity is impossible to accomplish, in his
view. For Weyl, taking the infinite as an actual entity makes no sense.
Nevertheless, there are more problems here than Weyl imagines, at least
for those who ground their finitist philosophy of mathematics on
intuitionism à la Brouwer. That is because Brouwer's rejection
of actual infinity stems from the fact that we, as beings, are immersed
in time. But this in itself does not mean that all infinities are
impossible to accomplish, since an infinity machine is also ‘a
being immersed in time’ and that in itself does not prevent the
carrying out of the infinity of successive actions a supertask is
comprised of. It goes without saying that one can adhere to a
constructivist philosophy of mathematics (and the consequent rejection
of actual infinity) for diferent reasons from Brouwer's; supertasks
will still not be the right kind of objet to study either.

As Benacerraf and Putnam (1964) have observed, the acknowledgement that supertasks are possible has a profound influence on the philosophy of mathematics: the notion of truth (in arithmetic, say) would no longer be doubtful, in the sense of dependent on the particular axiomatisation used. The example mentioned earlier in connection with Goldbach's conjecture can indeed be reproduced and generalised to all other mathematical statements involving numbers (although, depending on the complexity of the statement, we might need to use several infinity machines instead of just one), and so, consequently, supertasks will enable us to decide on the truth or falsity of any arithmetical statement; our conclusion will no longer depend on provability in some formal system or constructibility in a more or less strict intuitionistic sense. This conclusion seems to lead to a Platonist philosophy of mathematics.

However, the situation here is more subtle than the previous comments
suggest. Above I introduced a supertask of type *w* that can
settle the truth or falsity of Goldbach's conjecture, but the
reference (essential in it) to time contrasts with the lack of
specification regarding how to make the necessary computations.When
one tries to make up for this omission one discovers that the defence
of Platonism is more debatable than it seems at first sight. Davies
(2001) has proposed a model of an infinite machine (an infinite
machine is a computer which can carry out an infinite number of
computations within a finite length of time) based on the Newtonian
dynamics of continuous media which reveals the nature of the
difficulty. One cannot attempt to decide on mathematical questions
such as Goldbach's conjecture by using a mechanical computer which
carries out operations at an increasing speed, as if it were a Turing
machine. The reason is that the different configurations the computer
adopts at increasingly short intervals of time eventually (if the
conjecture is true) lead to a paradox of the type of Thomson's lamp,
where (if we do not assume continuity in the sense of section 3.2) the
final state of the computer is indeterminate, which makes it useless
for our purpose. Davies's clever solution consists in assuming an
infinite machine capable of building a replica of itself that has
twice its own memory but is smaller and works at greater speed. The
replica can in its turn build another (even smaller and quicker)
replica of itself and so on. With the details Davies gives about the
working of his infinite machines, it is clear that they will in no
case lead to an indeterminacy paradox (since each replica carries out
only a finite part of the task).The problem is that to settle
questions like Goldbach's conjecture (if, as I said above, it is true)
a numerable (actual) infinity of replicating machines is required, and
this will surely be rejected by anyone who, like intuitionists, has a
strong dislike of the actual infinity. In more abstract words, the
mathematical theory that models the computation process presupposes a
Platonic conception of the infinite and thus begs the question by,
circularly, supporting Platonism.

### 5.2 The Importance of the Malament-Hogarth Spacetime

Similar comments can be made about the implications of supertasks for
the philosophy of mathematics if one only accepts the possibility of
bifurcated supertasks. Of course, a bifurcated supertask performed in
a non-Malament-Hogarth space-time would not be so interesting in this
sense. The obvious reason is that we would not even have a sound
procedure to determine the truth or falsity of Goldbach's conjecture
seen in 5.1 by means of the performance of an infinite sequence of
actions of order type *w*. To really have a safe decision
procedure in this simple case (as in other, more complex ones) there
must necessarily exist an instant of time at which it can be said that
the supertask has been accomplished. Otherwise, in the event that the
machine finds a counterexample to Goldbach's conjecture we will know
it to be false, but in the event of the machine finding none we will
not be able to tell that it is true, because for this there must exist
an instant of time by which the supertask has been accomplished and at
which we can say something like: ‘the supertask has been
performed and the machine has found no counterexamples to Goldbach's
conjecture; therefore, the conjecture is true’. It follows that,
in the case of a bifurcated supertask, possessing a sound decision
procedure on Goldbach's conjecture requires the existence of an
observer *O* such that the infinite sequence of actions (of
order type *w*) carried out by the machine lies within the past
light cone of an event on observer *O*'s world-line. But this
is equivalent to saying that the relativistic space-time in which the
bifurcated supertask is performed is a Malament-Hogarth space-time,
and this realisation is one of the main reasons why this sort of
relativistic space-times have been studied in the literature.

At first sight, the intuitionistic criticism of the possibility of supertasks is less effective in the case of bifurcated supertasks, because in this latter case it is not required that there is any sort of device capable of carrying out an infinite number of actions or operations in a finite time (measured in the reference system associated to the device in question, which is the natural reference system to consider). In contrast, from the possibility of bifurcated supertasks in Malament-Hogarth space-times strong arguments seem to follow against an intuitionistic philosophy of mathematics. But, again, one must be very cautious at this point, as we were at the end of our previous section 5.1. The mathematical theory which models a bifurcated supertask is general relativity, and this theory, as it fully embraces classical mathematical analysis, entails a strong commitment to the—intuitionistically unacceptable—objective status of the set of all natural numbers. It is difficult to believe, therefore, that a radical constructivist lets himself be influenced by the current literature on bifurcated supertasks. This does not make that literature less interesting, as, in establishing unthought-of connections between computability and the structure of space-time, it enriches (as does the existing literature on supertasks in general) the set of consequences that can be derived from our most interesting physical theories.

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## Related Entries

determinism: causal | infinity | space and time: Malament-Hogarth spacetimes and the new computability | Zeno of Elea: Zeno's paradoxes