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Zeno's Paradoxes

First published Tue Apr 30, 2002; substantive revision Fri Mar 26, 2004

Almost everything that we know about Zeno of Elea is to be found in the opening pages of Plato's Parmenides. There we learn that Zeno was nearly 40 years old when Socrates was a young man, say 20. Since Socrates was born in 469 BC we can estimate a birth date for Zeno around 490 BC. Beyond this, really all we know is that he was close to Parmenides (Plato reports the gossip that they were lovers when Zeno was young), and that he wrote a book of paradoxes defending Parmenides' philosophy. Sadly this book has not survived, and what we know of his arguments is second-hand, principally through Aristotle and his commentators (here I have drawn particularly on Simplicius, who, though writing a thousand years after Zeno, apparently possessed at least some of his book). There were apparently 40 ‘paradoxes of plurality’, attempting to show that ontological pluralism — a belief in the existence of many things rather than only one — leads to absurd conclusions; of these paradoxes only two definitely survive, though a third argument can probably be attributed to Zeno. Aristotle speaks of a further four arguments against motion (and by extension change generally), all of which he gives and attempts to refute. In addition Aristotle attributes two other paradoxes to Zeno. Sadly again, almost none of these paradoxes are quoted in Zeno's original words by their various commentators, but in paraphrase.

1. Background

Before we look at the paradoxes themselves it will be useful to sketch some of their historical and logical significance. First, Zeno sought to defend Parmenides by attacking his critics. Parmenides rejected pluralism and the reality of any kind of change: for him all was one indivisible, unchanging reality, and any appearances to the contrary were illusions, to be dispelled by reason and revelation. Not surprisingly, this philosophy found many critics, who ridiculed the suggestion; after all it flies in the face of some of our most basic beliefs about the world. (Interestingly, general relativity — particularly quantum general relativity — arguably provides a novel — if novelty is possible — argument for the Parmenidean denial of change: Belot and Earman, 2001.) In response to this criticism Zeno did something that may sound obvious, but which had a profound impact on Greek philosophy that is felt to this day: he attempted to show that equal absurdities followed logically from the denial of Parmenides' views. You think that there are many things? Then you must conclude that everything is both infinitely small and infinitely big! You think that motion is infinitely divisible? Then it follows that nothing moves! (This is what a ‘paradox’ is: a demonstration that a contradiction or absurd consequence follows from apparently reasonable assumptions.)

‘Dialectic’, the technique of arguing for or against a position by careful logical reasoning — and in particular the technique of arguing against a view by showing that it entails unacceptable consequences — was a crucial innovation, which has governed philosophical method ever since. In the absence of such a method one can only defend a position by mystical revelation say, or by rhetorical rather than rational appeal, or by force perhaps. And according to Aristotle, Zeno was the inventor of the method (in philosophy of least, for such an approach has been a part of mathematics for even longer). Later philosophers however — especially Plato and Aristotle — were far finer exponents of the approach.

As we read the arguments it is crucial to keep this method in mind. They are always directed towards a more-or-less specific target: the views of some person or school. We must bear in mind that the arguments are ad hominem, not in the ‘bad sense’ that they attack a person rather than his views but in the ‘good sense’ that they are formulated against a particular philosopher's assertions. They work by temporarily supposing ‘for argument's sake’ that those assertions are true, and then arguing that if they are then absurd consequences follow — that nothing moves for example: they are ‘reductio ad absurdum’ arguments. Then, if the argument is logically valid, and the conclusion genuinely unacceptable, the assertions must be false after all. Thus when we look at Zeno's arguments we must ask two related questions: whom or what position is Zeno attacking, and what exactly is assumed for argument's sake? If we find that Zeno makes hidden assumptions beyond what the position under attack commits one to, then the absurd conclusion can be avoided by denying one of the hidden assumptions, while maintaining the position. Indeed commentators at least since Aristotle have responded to Zeno in this way.

So whom do Zeno's arguments attack? There is a huge literature debating Zeno's exact historical target. As we shall discuss briefly below, some say that the target was a technical doctrine of the Pythagoreans, but most today see Zeno as opposing common-sense notions of plurality and motion. I will approach the paradoxes in this spirit, and refer the reader to the literature concerning the interpretive debate.

That said, it is also the majority opinion that — with certain qualifications — Zeno's paradoxes reveal some problems that cannot be resolved without the full resources of mathematics as worked out in the Nineteenth century (and perhaps beyond). This is not (necessarily) to say that modern mathematics is required to answer any of the problems that Zeno explicitly wanted to raise; arguably Aristotle and other ancients had replies that would — or should — have satisfied Zeno. (Nor yet should we conclude that Zeno's work had any direct influence on the history of mathematics, though surely the kind of worries that he raised did.) However, as mathematics developed, and more thought was given to the paradoxes, new difficulties arose from them; these difficulties require modern mathematics for their resolution. These new difficulties arise partly in response to the evolution in our understanding of what mathematical rigor demands: solutions that would satisfy Aristotle's standards of rigor would not satisfy ours. Thus we shall push several of the paradoxes from their common sense formulations to their resolution in modern mathematics. (Another qualification: I will offer resolutions in terms of ‘standard’ mathematics, but other modern formulations are also capable of dealing with Zeno.)

2. The Paradoxes of Plurality

2.1 The Argument from Denseness

If there are many, they must be as many as they are and neither more nor less than that. But if they are as many as they are, they would be limited. If there are many, things that are are unlimited. For there are always others between the things that are, and again others between those, and so the things that are are unlimited. (Simplicius(a) On Aristotle's Physics, 140.29)

This first argument, given in Zeno's words according to Simplicius, attempts to show that there could not be many things, on pain of contradiction. Assume then that there are many things. First, he says that any collection must contain some definite number of things, neither more nor fewer. But if you have a definite number of things, he further concludes, you must have a finite — ‘limited’ — number of them; he implicitly assumes that to have infinitely many things is not to have any particular number of them. Second, imagine any collection of things arranged in space — imagine them lined up in one dimension for definiteness. Between and two of them, he claims, is a third; and in between these three elements another two; and another four between these five; and so on without end. Therefore the limited collection is also ‘unlimited’, which is a contradiction, and hence our original assumption must be false: there are not many things after all. At least, so Zeno's reasoning runs.

But why are there ‘always others between the things that are’? (In modern terminology, why must objects always be ‘densely’ ordered?) Suppose that I had imagined a collection of ten apples lined up; then there is indeed another apple between the sixth and eighth, but there is none between the seventh and eighth! On the assumption that Zeno is not simply confused, what does he have in mind? There are two possibilities: first, one might hold that for any pair of physical objects (two apples say) to actually be two distinct objects and not just one (a ‘double-apple’) there must be a third between them, physically separating them, even if it is just air. And one might think that for these three to be distinct, there must be two more objects separating them, and so on (this view presupposes that their being made of different substances is not sufficient to render them distinct). Second, one might hold that any body has parts that can be densely ordered. Of course 1/2s, 1/4s, 1/8s and so on of apples are not dense — some such parts are adjacent — but there may be sufficiently small parts — call them ‘point—parts’ — that are. Indeed, if between any two point-parts there lies a finite distance, and if point-parts can be arbitrarily close, then they are dense; a third lies at the half-way point of any two. In particular, familiar geometric points are like this, and hence are dense.

And thus we should read the argument as follows: if you suppose that the world contains many things, then you are faced with a contradiction, for the collection must be both finite and infinite — finite because it contains a definite number of things, and infinite because they are dense. The assumption that any definite number is finite seems intuitive, but we now know, thanks to the work of Cantor in the Nineteenth century, how to understand infinite numbers in a way that makes them just as definite as finite numbers. One central element of the this theory of the ‘transfinite numbers’ is a precise definition of when two infinite collections are the same size, and when one is bigger than the other — with such a definition in hand it is then possible to order the infinite numbers just as the finite numbers are ordered. For example, both the fractions and geometric points in a line are dense, but there are different, definite infinite numbers of them. (See Further Reading below for references to introductions to these mathematical ideas.) Of course, settling the mathematical question of whether infinite numbers can be definite doesn't show that real physical objects actually have geometric point parts, all it shows is that it is a logical possibility.

2.2 The Argument from Finite Size

… if it should be added to something else that exists, it would not make it any bigger. For if it were of no size and was added, it cannot increase in size. And so it follows immediately that what is added is nothing. But if when it is subtracted, the other thing is no smaller, nor is it increased when it is added, clearly the thing being added or subtracted is nothing. (Simplicius(a) On Aristotle's Physics,139.9)

But if it exists, each thing must have some size and thickness, and part of it must be apart from the rest. And the same reasoning holds concerning the part that is in front. For that too will have size and part of it will be in front. Now it is the same thing to say this once and to keep saying it forever. For no such part of it will be last, nor will there be one part not related to another. Therefore, if there are many things, they must be both small and large; so small as not to have size, but so large as to be unlimited. (Simplicius(a) On Aristotle's Physics, 141.2)

Once again we have Zeno's own words. According to his conclusion, there are three parts to this argument, but only two survive. The first — missing — argument purports to show that if many things exist then they must have no size at all. Second, from this Zeno argues that it follows that they do not exist at all; since the result of joining (or removing) a sizeless object to anything is no change at all, he concludes that the thing added (or removed) is literally nothing. The argument to this point is a self-contained refutation of pluralism, but Zeno goes on to generate a further problem for someone who continues to urge the existence of a plurality. This third part of the argument is rather badly put but it seems to run something like this: suppose there is a plurality, so some spatially extended object exists (after all, he's just argued that inextended things do not exist). Since it is extended, it has two spatially distinct parts (one ‘in front’ of the other). And the parts exist, so they have extension, and so they also each have two spatially distinct parts; and so on without end. And hence, the final line of argument seems to conclude, the object, if it is extended at all, is infinite in extent.

But what could justify this final step? It doesn't seem that because an object has two parts it must be infinitely big! And neither does it follow from any other of the divisions that Zeno describes here; four, eight, sixteen, or whatever finite parts make a finite whole. Again, surely Zeno is aware of these facts, and so must have something else in mind, presumably the following: he assumes that if the infinite series of divisions he describes were repeated infinitely many times then a definite collection of parts would result. And notice that he doesn't have to assume that anyone could actually carry out the divisions — there's not enough time and knives aren't sharp enough — just that an object can be geometrically decomposed into such parts (neither does he assume that these parts are what we would naturally categorize as distinct physical objects like apples, cells, molecules, electrons or so on, but only that they are geometric parts of these objects). Now, if — as a pluralist might well accept — such parts exist, it follows from the second part of his argument that they are extended, and, he apparently assumes, an infinite sum of finite parts is infinite.

Here we should note that there are two ways he may be envisioning the result of the infinite division.

First, one could read him as first dividing the object into 1/2s, then one of the 1/2s — say the second — into two 1/4s, then one of the 1/4s — say the second again — into two 1/8s and so on. In this case the result of the infinite division results in an endless sequence of pieces of size 1/2 the total length, 1/4 the length, 1/8 the length … . And then so the total length is (1/2 + 1/4 + 1/8 + …) of the length, which Zeno concludes is an infinite distance, so that the pluralist is committed to the absurdity that finite bodies are ‘so large as to be unlimited’.

What is often pointed out in response is that Zeno gives us no reason to think that the sum is infinite rather than finite. He might have had the intuition that any infinite sum of finite quantities, since it grows endlessly with each new term must be infinite, but one might also take this kind of example as showing that some infinite sums are after all finite. Thus, contrary to what he thought, Zeno has not proven that the absurd conclusion follows. However, what is not always appreciated is that the pluralist is not off the hook so easily, for it is not enough just to say that the sum might be finite, she must also show that it is finite — otherwise we remain uncertain about the tenability of her position. As an illustration of the difficulty faced here consider the following: many commentators speak as if it is simply obvious that the infinite sum of the fractions is 1, that there is nothing to infinite summation. But what about the following sum: 1 − 1 + 1 − 1 + 1 − … . Obviously, it seems, the sum can be rewritten (1 − 1) + (1 − 1) + … = 0 + 0 + … = 0. Surely this answer seems as intuitive as the sum of fractions. But this sum can also be rewritten 1 − (1 − 1 + 1 − 1 + …) = 1 − 0 — since we've just shown that the term in parentheses vanishes — = 1. Relying on intuitions about how to perform infinite sums leads to the conclusion that 1 = 0. Until one can give a theory of infinite sums that can give a satisfactory answer to any problem, one cannot say that Zeno's infinite sum is obviously finite. Such a theory was not fully worked out until the Nineteenth century by Cauchy. (In Cauchy's system 1/2 + 1/4 + … = 1 but 1 − 1 + 1 − … is undefined.)

Second, it could be that Zeno means that the object is divided in half, then both the 1/2s are both divided in half, then the 1/4s are all divided in half and so on. In this case the pieces at any particular stage are all the same finite size, and so one could conclude that the result of carrying on the procedure infinitely would be pieces the same size, which if they exist — according to Zeno — is greater than zero; but an infinity of equal extended parts is indeed infinitely big.

But this line of thought can be resisted. First, suppose that the procedure just described completely divides the object into non-overlapping parts. (There is a problem with this supposition that we will see just below.) It involves doubling the number of pieces after every division and so after N divisions there are 2N pieces. But it turns out that for any natural or infinite number, N, 2N > N, and so the number of (supposed) parts obtained by the infinity of divisions described is an even larger infinity. This is no immediate difficulty since, as we mentioned above, infinities come in different sizes. The number of times everything is divided in two is said to be ‘countably infinite’: there is a countable infinity of things in a collection if they can be labeled by the numbers 1, 2, 3, … without remainder on either side. But the number of pieces the infinite division produces is ‘uncountably infinite’, which means that there is no way to label them 1, 2, 3, … without missing some of them — in fact infinitely many of them. However, Cauchy's definition of an infinite sum only applies to countably infinite series of numbers, and so does not apply to the pieces we are considering. However, we could consider just countably many of them, whose lengths according to Zeno — since he claims they are all equal and non-zero — will sum to an infinite length; clearly the length of all of the pieces could not be less than this.

At this point the pluralist who believes that Zeno's division completely divides objects into non-overlapping parts (see the next paragraph) could respond that the parts in fact have no extension, even though they exist. That would block the conclusion that finite objects are infinite, but it seems to push her back to the other horn of Zeno's argument, for how can all these zero length pieces make up a non-zero sized whole? (Note that according to Cauchy 0 + 0 + 0 + … = 0 but this result shows nothing here, for as we saw there are uncountably many pieces to add up — more than are added in this sum.) We shall postpone this question for the discussion of the next paradox, where it comes up explicitly.

The second problem with interpreting the infinite division as a repeated division of all parts is that it does not divide an object into distinct parts, if objects are composed in the natural way. To see this, let's ask the question of what parts are obtained by this division into 1/2s, 1/4s, 1/8s, .... Since the division is repeated without end there is no last piece we can give as an answer, and so we need to think about the question in a different way. If we suppose that an object can be represented by a line segment of unit length, then the division produces collections of segments, where the first is either the first or second half of the whole segment, the second is the first or second quarter, or third or fourth quarter, and in general the segment produced by N divisions is either the first or second half of the previous segment. For instance, writing the segment with endpoints a and b as [a,b], some of these collections (technically known as 'chains' since the elements of the collection are ordered by size) would start {[0,1], [0,1/2], [1/4,1/2], [1/4,3/8], ...}. (When I argued before that Zeno's division produced uncountably many pieces of the object, what I should have said more carefully is that it produces uncountably many chains like this.)

The question of which parts the division picks out is then the question of which part any given chain picks out; it's natural to say that a chain picks out the part of the line which is contained in every one of its elements. Consider for instance the chain {[0,1/2], [1/4,1/2], [3/8,1/2], ...}, in other words the chain that starts with the left half of the line and for which every other element is the right half of the previous one. The half-way point is in every one of the segments in this chain; it's the right-hand endpoint of each one. But no other point is in all its elements: clearly no point beyond half-way is; and pick any point p before half-way, if you take right halves of [0,1/2] enough times, the left-hand end of the segment will be to the right of p. Thus the only part of the line that is in all the elements of this chain is the half-way point, and so that is the part of the line picked out by the chain. The problem is that by parallel reasoning, the half-way point is also picked out by the distinct chain {[1/2,1], [1/2,3/4], [1/2,5/8], ...}, where each segment after the first is the left half of the preceding one. And so both chains pick out the same piece of the line: the half-way point. (And many other pairs of chains have the same problem.) Thus Zeno's Dichotomy, interpreted as a repeated division of all parts into half, doesn't divide the line into distinct parts. Hence, if we think that objects are composed in the same way as the line, it follows that despite appearances, this version of the Dichotomy does not cut objects into parts whose total size we can properly discuss.

(You might think that this problem could be fixed by taking the elements of the chains to be segments with no endpoint to the right. Then the first of the two chains we considered no longer has the half-way point in any of its segments, and so does not pick out that point. The problem now is that it fails to pick out any part of the line: the previous reasoning showed that it doesn't pick out any point greater than or less than the half-way point, and now it doesn't pick out that point either!)

2.3 The Argument from Complete Divisibility

… whenever a body is by nature divisible through and through, whether by bisection, or generally by any method whatever, nothing impossible will have resulted if it has actually been divided …  though perhaps nobody in fact could so divide it.

What then will remain? A magnitude? No: that is impossible, since then there will be something not divided, whereas ex hypothesi the body was divisible through and through. But if it be admitted that neither a body nor a magnitude will remain … the body will either consist of points (and its constituents will be without magnitude) or it will be absolutely nothing. If the latter, then it might both come-to-be out of nothing and exist as a composite of nothing; and thus presumably the whole body will be nothing but an appearance. But if it consists of points, it will not possess any magnitude. (Aristotle On Generation and Corruption, 316a19)

These words are Aristotle's not Zeno's, and indeed the argument is not even attributed to Zeno by Aristotle. However we have Simplicius' opinion ((a) On Aristotle's Physics, 139.24) that it originates with Zeno, which is why it is included here. Aristotle begins by hypothesizing that some body is completely divisible, ‘through and through’; the second step of the argument makes clear that he means by this that it is divisible into parts that themselves have no size — parts with any magnitude remain incompletely divided. (Once again what matters is that the body is genuinely composed of such parts, not that anyone has the time and tools to make the division; and remembering from the previous section that one does not obtain such parts by repeatedly dividing all parts in half.) So suppose the body is divided into its dimensionless parts. These parts could either be nothing at all — as Zeno argued above — or ‘point-parts’. If the parts are nothing then so is the body: it's just an illusion. And, the argument concludes, even if they are points, since these are unextended the body itself will be unextended: surely any sum — even an infinite one — of zeroes is zero.

One could of course point out that it is only assumed that an infinity of zeroes is itself zero, and deny that assumption. However it has a strong intuitive pull, and once again one should show how any dimensionless points actually do make an extended whole. Fortunately Grünbaum (1967) showed how this is possible according to the modern mathematical treatment of a line. Consider a line segment of unit length. At its most basic level the segment is just a set of points — if you take any spatial part of it, all you have is a point or set of points. Now Cantor gave a beautiful, astounding and extremely influential ‘diagonal’ proof that the number of points in the segment is uncountably infinite: there is no way to label all the points in the line with the infinity of numbers 1, 2, 3, … . As we noted above, it follows that we cannot apply the Cauchy definition of infinite sums to the points of the line, and so happily we cannot immediately conclude that because they all have zero length so does the whole line. But that still leaves open the question of how the line gets extension from its inextended points.

So suppose that you are just given the number of points in a line and that their lengths are all zero; how would you determine the length? Do we need a new definition, one that extends Cauchy's to uncountably infinite sums? It turns out that that would not help, because Cauchy further showed that any segment, of any length whatsoever (and indeed an entire infinite line) have exactly the same number of points as our unit segment. So knowing the number of points won't determine the length of the line, and so nothing like familiar addition — in which the whole is determined by the parts — is possible. Instead we must think of the distance properties of a line as logically posterior to its point composition: first we have a set of points (ordered in a certain way, so that there is some fact, for example, about which of any two is before the other) then we define a function of two points which specifies how far apart they are (and which satisfies such conditions as that the distance between A and B plus the distance between B and C equals the distance between A and C — assuming that C is not between A and B). By analogy, the maiden names of a married couple do not determine their surname: they could take either maiden name or hyphenate, or take a wholly new name if they choose. Thus we answer Zeno as follows: the argument assumed that the size of the body was a sum of the sizes of the point parts, but that is not the case; according to modern mathematics, a line is an uncountable infinity of points plus a distance function. (Note that Grünbaum used the fact that the point composition fails to determine a length to support his ‘conventionalist’ view that a line has no determinate length at all, independent of a standard of measurement.)

3. The Paradoxes of Motion

3.1 The Dichotomy

The first asserts the non-existence of motion on the ground that that which is in locomotion must arrive at the half-way stage before it arrives at the goal. (Aristotle Physics, 239b11)

This paradox is known as the ‘dichotomy’ because it involves repeated division into two (like the second paradox of plurality). Like the other paradoxes of motion we have it from Aristotle, who sought to refute it.

Suppose a very fast runner — such as mythical Atalanta — needs to run for the bus. Clearly before she reaches the bus stop she must run half-way, as Aristotle says. There's no problem there; supposing a constant motion it will take her 1/2 the time to run half-way there and 1/2 the time to run the rest of the way. Now she must also run half-way to the half-way point — i.e., a 1/4 of the total distance — before she reaches the half-way point, but again she is left with a finite number of finite lengths to run, and plenty of time to do it. And before she reaches 1/4 of the way she must reach 1/2 of 1/4 = 1/8 of the way; and before that a 1/16; and so on. There is no problem at any finite point in this series, but what if the halving is carried out infinitely many times? The resulting series contains no first distance to run, for any possible first distance could be divided in half, and hence would not be first after all. However it does contain a final distance, namely 1/2 of the way; and a penultimate distance, 1/4 of the way; and a third to last distance, 1/8 of the way; and so on. Thus the series of distances that Atalanta is required to run is: …, then 1/16 of the way, then 1/8 of the way, then 1/4 of the way, and finally 1/2 of the way (of course we are not suggesting that she stops at the end of each segment and then starts running at the beginning of the next — we are thinking of her continuous run being composed of such parts). And now there is a problem, for this description of her run has her travelling an infinite number of finite distances, which, Zeno would have us conclude, must take an infinite time, which is to say it is never completed. And since the argument does not depend on the distance or who or what the mover is, it follows that no finite distance can ever be traveled, which is to say that all motion is impossible. (Note that the paradox could easily be generated in the other direction so that Atalanta must first run half way, then half the remaining way, then half of that and so on, so that she must run the following endless sequence of fractions of the total distance: 1/2, 1/4, 1/8 ….)

A couple of common responses are not adequate. One might — as Simplicius ((a) On Aristotle's Physics, 1012.22) tells us Diogenes the Cynic did by silently standing and walking — point out that it is a matter of the most common experience that things in fact do move, and that we know very well that Atalanta would have no trouble reaching her bus stop. But this would not impress Zeno, who as a paid up Parmenidean held that many things are not as they appear: it may appear that Diogenes is walking or that Atalanta is running, but appearances can be deceptive and surely we have a logical proof that they are in fact not moving at all. And if one doesn't accept that Zeno has given a proof that motion is illusory — as we hopefully do not — one then owes an account of what is wrong with his argument: he has given reasons why motion is impossible, and so an adequate response must show why those reasons are not sufficient. And it won't do simply to point out that there are some ways of cutting up Atalanta's run — into just two halves, say — in which there is no problem. For if you accept all of the steps in Zeno's argument then you must accept his conclusion (assuming that he has reasoned in a logically deductive way): it's not enough to show an unproblematic division, you must also show why the given division is unproblematic.

Another response — given by Aristotle himself — is to point out that as we divide the distances run we should also divide the total time taken: there is 1/2 the time for the final 1/2, a 1/4 of the time for the previous 1/4, an 1/8 of the time for the 1/8 of the run and so on. Thus each fractional distance has just the right fraction of the finite total time for Atalanta to complete it, and thus the distance can be completed in a finite time. Aristotle felt that this reply should satisfy Zeno, however he also realized (Physics, 263a15) that this could not be the end of the matter (and surely Zeno would have made the same point if presented with Aristotle's response). For now we are saying that the time Atalanta takes to reach the bus stop is composed of an infinite number of finite pieces — …, 1/8, 1/4, and 1/2 (of the total time) — and isn't that an infinite time?

Of course, one could again claim that some infinite sums in fact have finite totals, and in particular that the sum of these pieces is 1 × the total time, which is of course finite (and again a complete solution would demand a rigorous account of infinite summation, like Cauchy's). However, Aristotle did not make such a move. What he said is worth noting because it had a considerable influence on later thinking about Zeno. In his response Aristotle drew a sharp distinction between what he termed a ‘continuous’ line and a line divided into parts. Consider a simple division of a line into two: on the one hand there is the undivided line, and on the other the line with a mid-point selected as the boundary of the two halves. Aristotle claims that these are two distinct things: and that the later is only ‘potentially’ derivable from the former. Next, Aristotle takes the common-sense view that time is like a geometric line, and considers the time it takes to complete the run. We can again distinguish the two cases: on the one hand there is the continuous run from start to finish, and on the other there is the run divided into Zeno's infinity of half-runs. The former is ‘potentially infinite’ in the sense that it could be divided into latter ‘actual infinity’. Here's the crucial step: Aristotle thinks that since these times are geometrically distinct they must be physically distinct. But how could that be? He claims that the runner must do something at the end of each half-run to make it distinct from the next: she must stop. (Why stop rather than cough or something? Because if the time is discontinuous then so is the motion.) And so Aristotle's full answer to the paradox is that Zeno's question — whether the infinite series of runs is possible or not — is ambiguous. One the one hand, the answer is ‘yes’ if one means the potentially infinite series that form the continuous run. On the other the answer is ‘no’ if one means the actual infinity of pieces that form the discontinuous run.

It is hard — from our modern perspective perhaps — to see how this answer could be completely satisfactory. In the first place it assumes that a clear distinction can be drawn between potential and actual infinities, something that was never fully achieved. Second, suppose that Zeno's problem turns on the claim that infinite sums of finite quantities are invariably infinite. Then Aristotle's distinction will only help if he can explain why potentially infinite sums are in fact finite (and couldn't I potentially add 1 + 1 + 1 + …, which does not have a finite total); or if he can give a reason why potentially infinite sums just don't exist. Or perhaps Aristotle did not see infinite sums as the problem, but rather whether completing an infinity of finite actions is metaphysically and conceptually and physically possible, an idea discussed at length in recent years: see ‘Supertasks’ below. In this case we need an account of actions that makes precise the sense in which the continuous run is indeed a single action (using rest to individuate motions seems problematic, for humans are probably never completely still, and yet we perform distinct motions — breathing, eating, skipping and so on). Finally, the distinction between potential and actual infinities has played no role in mathematics since Cantor tamed the transfinite numbers — certainly the potential infinite has played no role in the modern mathematical solutions discussed here.

One last point: Zeno's argument seeks most obviously to establish the impossibility of motion, but he also intended it (and the following arguments) as further refutations of plurality — certainly, Plato interprets Zeno's intentions in this way. How might the argument seek to establish this conclusion? Presumably Zeno has in mind the view that spatial (and perhaps temporal) distances have a plurality of parts; parts which are infinitely divisible into two. Given that assumption, supposedly finite distances (or times) can be decomposed into an infinity of finite parts with no first (or alternatively, last) one. And how can such distances be finite after all? And if the pluralist also believes in motion, how can such a distance be traversed? It seems it cannot be.

3.2 Achilles and the Tortoise

The [second] argument was called "Achilles," accordingly, from the fact that Achilles was taken [as a character] in it, and the argument says that it is impossible for him to overtake the tortoise when pursuing it. For in fact it is necessary that what is to overtake [something], before overtaking [it], first reach the limit from which what is fleeing set forth. In [the time in] which what is pursuing arrives at this, what is fleeing will advance a certain interval, even if it is less than that which what is pursuing advanced … . And in the time again in which what is pursuing will traverse this [interval] which what is fleeing advanced, in this time again what is fleeing will traverse some amount … . And thus in every time in which what is pursuing will traverse the [interval] which what is fleeing, being slower, has already advanced, what is fleeing will also advance some amount. (Simplicius(b) On Aristotle's Physics, 1014.10)

This paradox turns on much the same considerations as the last. Imagine Achilles chasing a tortoise, and suppose that Achilles is running at 1 m/s, that the tortoise is crawling at 0.1 m/s and that the tortoise starts out 0.9 m ahead of Achilles. On the face of it Achilles should catch the tortoise after 1s, at a distance of 1m from where he starts (and so 0.1m from where the Tortoise starts). We could break Achilles' motion up as we did Atalanta's, into halves, or we could do it as follows: before Achilles can catch the tortoise he must reach the point where the tortoise started. But in the time he takes to do this the tortoise crawls a little further forward. So next Achilles must reach this new point. But in the time it takes Achilles to achieve this the tortoise crawls forward a tiny bit further. And so on to infinity: every time that Achilles reaches the place where the tortoise was the tortoise has had enough time to get a little bit further, and so Achilles has another run to make, and so Achilles has in infinite number of finite catch-ups to do before he can catch the tortoise, and so, Zeno concludes, he never catches the tortoise.

One aspect of the paradox is thus that Achilles must traverse the following infinite series of distances before he catches the tortoise: first 0.9m, then an additional 0.09m, then 0.009m, … . These are the series of distances ahead that the tortoise reaches at the start of each of Achilles' catch-ups. Looked at this way the puzzle is identical to the Dichotomy, for it is just to say that ‘that which is in locomotion must arrive [nine tenths of the way] before it arrives at the goal’. And so everything we said above applies here too.

But what the paradox in this form brings out most vividly is the problem of completing a series of actions that has no final member — in this case the infinite series of catch-ups before Achilles reaches the tortoise. But just what is the problem? Perhaps the following: Achilles' run to the point at which he should reach the tortoise can, it seems, be completely decomposed into the series of catch-ups, none of which take him to the tortoise. Therefore, nowhere in his run does he reach the tortoise after all. But if this is what Zeno had in mind it won't do. Of course Achilles doesn't reach the tortoise at any point of the sequence, for every run in the sequence occurs before we expect Achilles to reach it! Thinking in terms of the points that Achilles must reach in his run, 1m does not occur in the sequence 0.9m, 0.99m, 0.999m, … , so of course he never catches the tortoise during that sequence of runs! The series of catch-ups does not after all completely decompose the run: the final point — at which Achilles does catch the tortoise — must be added to it. So is there any puzzle? Arguably yes.

Achilles run passes through the sequence of points 0.9m, 0.99m, 0.999m, … , 1m. But does such a strange sequence — comprised of an infinity of members followed by one more — make sense mathematically? If not then our mathematical description of the run cannot be correct, but then what is? Fortunately the theory of transfinites pioneered by Cantor assures us that such a series is perfectly respectable. It was realized that the order properties of infinite series are much more elaborate than those of finite series. Any way of arranging the numbers 1, 2 and 3 gives a series in the same pattern, for instance, but there are many distinct ways to order the natural numbers: 1, 2, 3, … for instance. Or … , 3, 2, 1. Or … , 4, 2, 1, 3, 5, … . Or 2, 3, 4, … , 1, which is just the same kind of series as the positions Achilles must run through. Thus the theory of the transfinites treats not just ‘cardinal’ numbers — which depend only on how many things there are — but also ‘ordinal’ numbers which depend further on how the things are arranged. Since the ordinals are standardly taken to be mathematically legitimate numbers, and since the series of points Achilles must pass has an ordinal number, we shall take it that the series is mathematically legitimate. (Again, see ‘Supertasks’ below for another kind of problem that might arise for Achilles’.)

3.3 The Arrow

The third is … that the flying arrow is at rest, which result follows from the assumption that time is composed of moments … . he says that if everything when it occupies an equal space is at rest, and if that which is in locomotion is always in a now, the flying arrow is therefore motionless. (Aristotle Physics, 239b.30)

Zeno abolishes motion, saying "What is in motion moves neither in the place it is nor in one in which it is not". (Diogenes Laertius Lives of Famous Philosophers, ix.72)

This argument against motion explicitly turns on a particular kind of assumption of plurality: that time is composed of moments (or ‘nows’) and nothing else. Consider an arrow, apparently in motion, at any instant. First, Zeno assumes that it travels no distance during that moment — ‘it occupies an equal space’ for the whole instant. But the entire period of its motion contains only instants, all of which contain an arrow at rest, and so, Zeno concludes, the arrow cannot be moving.

An immediate concern is why Zeno is justified in assuming that the arrow is at rest during any instant. It follows immediately if one assumes that an instant lasts 0s: whatever speed the arrow has, it will get nowhere if it has no time at all. But what if one held that the smallest parts of time are finite — if tiny — so that a moving arrow might actually move some distance during an instant? One way of supporting the assumption — which requires reading quite a lot into the text we have — is to assume that instants are indivisible. Then suppose that an arrow actually moved during an instant. It would be at different locations at the start and end of the instant, which implies that the instant has a ‘start’ and an ‘end’, which in turn implies that it has at least two parts, and so is divisible, and so is not an indivisible moment at all. (Note that this argument only establishes that nothing can move during an instant, not that instants cannot be finite.)

So then, nothing moves during any instant, but time is entirely composed of instants, so nothing ever moves. A first response is to point out that determining the velocity of the arrow means dividing the distance traveled in some time by the length of that time. But — assuming from now on that instants have zero duration — this formula makes no sense in the case of an instant: the arrow travels 0m in the 0s the instant lasts, but 0/0 m/s is not any number at all. Thus it is fallacious to conclude from the fact that the arrow doesn't travel any distance in an instant that it is at rest; whether it is in motion at an instant or not depends on whether it travels any distance in a finite interval that includes the instant in question.

The answer is correct, but it carries the counter-intuitive implication that motion is not something that happens at any instant, but rather only over finite periods of time. Think about it this way: time, as we said, is composed only of instants. No distance is traveled during any instant. So when does the arrow actually move? How does it get from one place to another at a later moment? There's only one answer: the arrow gets from point X at time 1 to point Y at time 2 simply in virtue of being at successive intermediate points at successive intermediate times — the arrow never changes its position during an instant but only over intervals composed of instants, by the occupation of different positions at different times. In Bergson's memorable words — which he thought expressed an absurdity — ‘movement is composed of immobilities’ (1911, 308): getting from X to Y is a matter of occupying exactly one place in between at each instant (in the right order of course). For a recent discussion of this issue see Arntzenius (2000).

3.4 The Stadium

The fourth argument is that concerning equal bodies [AA] which move alongside equal bodies in the stadium from opposite directions — the ones from the end of the stadium [CC], the others from the middle [BB] — at equal speeds, in which he thinks it follows that half the time is equal to its double…. And it follows that the C has passed all the As and the B half; so that the time is half … . And at the same time it follows that the first B has passed all the Cs. (Aristotle Physics, 239b33)

The final paradox of motion runs as follows: picture three sets of three touching cubes — all nine exactly the same, with side L m  — in relative motion. One set — the As — are at rest, and the others — the Bs and Cs — move from the left and right respectively, at a constant equal speed, S m/s. And suppose that at some moment the rightmost B is perfectly aligned with the middle A, and the leftmost C with the rightmost A: thus the edges of the rightmost B and leftmost C are exactly lined up. That is they are arranged as shown.

  A A A    
B B B      
      C C C

Now consider the later time at which the rightmost A and B are aligned; since the speeds of the Bs and Cs are equal, at this moment the middle A will be aligned with the leftmost C. That is consider the moment when the blocks are configured thus.

  A A A    
  B B B    
    C C C  

This motion requires the rightmost B to move one block — a distance L m — to the right, at a speed of S m/s, so it takes L/S s. And the same motion also requires the leftmost C to move from just to the right of the rightmost B into alignment with the middle B, a distance a distance of 2L m. So far so good, but now Zeno concludes that since the Cs are moving at S m/s, the motion must also take 2L/S s. And hence ‘half the time [L/S] is equal to its double [2L/S]’, since one and the same motion seems to take both times.

The unanimous verdict on Zeno is that he was hopelessly confused about relative velocity in this paradox. If the Bs are moving with speed S m/s to the right with respect to the As and if the Cs are moving with speed S m/s to the left with respect to the As then the Cs are moving with speed S+S = 2S m/s to the left with respect to the Bs. And so, as expected it takes the Cs 2L/2S = L/S s to complete the motion after all.

This resolution notwithstanding, recent philosophers have attempted to put a new spin on Zeno's argument (it's arguable whether Zeno himself had anything like what follows in mind). This argument opposed the view that space and time are ‘quantized’, composed of smallest finite parts. Suppose they are and that L m is the ‘quantum’ of length and that the two moments considered are separated by a single quantum of time. Now something strange has happened, for the rightmost B and the leftmost C have clearly passed each other during the motion, and yet there is no moment at which they are level: since the two moments are separated by the smallest possible time, there can be no moment between them — it would be a time smaller than the smallest time from the two moments we considered. Conversely, if one insisted that if they pass then there must be a moment when they are level, then it shows that cannot be a shortest finite interval — whatever it is, just run this argument against it. However, why should one insist on this assumption? The problem is that one naturally imagines quantized space as being like a chess board, on which the chess pieces are frozen during each quantum of time. Then one wonders when the red queen, say, gets from one square to the next, or how she gets past the white queen without being level with her. But the analogy is misleading. It is better to think of quantized space as a giant matrix of lights that holds some pattern of illuminated lights for each quantum of time. In this analogy a lit bulb represents the presence of an object: for instance a series of bulbs in a line lighting up in sequence represent a body moving in a straight line. In this case there is no temptation to ask when the light ‘gets’ from one bulb to the next — or in analogy how the body moves from one location to the next.

4. Two More Paradoxes

4.1 The Paradox of Place

Zeno's difficulty demands an explanation; for if everything that exists has a place, place too will have a place, and so on ad infinitum. (Aristotle Physics, 209a23)

When he sets up his theory of place — the crucial spatial notion in his theory of motion — Aristotle lists various theories and problems that his predecessors, including Zeno, have formulated on the subject. One can again see here a problem for pluralism, for the second step of the argument concludes that there are many places. It is perhaps a little hard to feel the full force of the conclusion, for why should there not be an infinite series of places of places of places of …? Presumably the worry would be greater for someone who (like Aristotle) believed that there could not be an actual infinity of things, for the argument seems to show that there are. But certainly today we need have no such qualms; there seems nothing problematic with an actual infinity of places; indeed, it seems very natural to think that every point of space is a distinct place, even if there are an infinity of points.

The only other way one might find the regress troubling is if one had reason to suppose that objects must have ‘absolute’ places, in the sense that there is always a unique answer to the question ‘where is it’? For example, where am I as I write? If the paradox is right then I'm in my place, and I'm also in my place's place, and my place's place's place, and my … . Since I'm in all these places any might seem an appropriate answer to the question. But why think that there must be a unique answer to the question? Why shouldn't I have many locations? At my desk, in my apartment, in Chicago, Illinois, USA, North America, the Earth, Solar System … . (In fact there is a reason that Aristotle might have had this concern about Zeno's argument, for in his theory of motion, the natural motion of a body is determined by the relation of its place to the center of the universe: an account that only makes sense if bodies can be attributed a unique place. Interestingly, Newton, in the Scholium to the principal Definitions in Book I of his Principia, gives an argument along similar lines: he assumes that every body has a unique, absolute velocity, and argues that only a fixed matter-independent, ‘absolute’ space will provide such uniqueness. That said, there is no evidence either that Zeno had this kind of argument in mind, or that Newton was influenced by Aristotle in this regard.)

4.2 The Grain of Millet

… Zeno's reasoning is false when he argues that there is no part of the millet that does not make a sound; for there is no reason why any part should not in any length of time fail to move the air that the whole bushel moves in falling. (Aristotle Physics, 250a19)

This argument is a Parmenidean argument against the reliability of the senses. It goes like this: if you drop a sack of millet on the floor then you hear a loud thud; but this noise is the result of the noise made by every grain of millet in the sack; and the result of the noise made by every part of every grain; therefore every part of every grain makes a noise as it hits the ground. But now consider dropping a tiny part of a grain; we know that we won't hear it. Therefore our sense of hearing is deceptive — there are noises it cannot hear — and so we should not trust it. Aristotle's response seems to be that the part would not move as much air as the sack, but the paradox is not that the part should make as much noise as the sack, but that it should make some noise. A better reply is surely that not every disturbance in the air is audible by us: that a measuring instrument is unreliable over some range is no argument that it is unreliable over every range.

5. Zeno's Influence on Philosophy

In this final section we should consider briefly the impact that Zeno has had on various philosophers; a search of the literature will reveal that these debates continue.

One should also note that Grünbaum took the job of showing that modern mathematics describes space and time to involve something rather different from arguing that it is confirmed by experience. The dominant view at the time (though not at present) was that scientific terms had meaning insofar as they referred directly to objects of experience — such as ‘1 m ruler’ — or, if they referred to ‘theoretical’ rather than ‘observable’ entities — such as ‘a point of space’ or ‘1/2 of 1/2 of … 1/2 a racetrack’ — then they obtained meaning by their logical relations — via definitions and theoretical laws — to such observation terms. Thus Grünbaum undertook an impressive program to give meaning to all terms involved in the modern theory of infinity, interpreted as an account of space and time.

Further Readings

After the relevant entries in this encyclopedia, the place to begin any further investigation is Salmon (2001), which contains some of the most important articles on Zeno up to 1970, and an impressively comprehensive bibliography of works in English in the Twentieth Century.

One might also take a look at Huggett (1999, Ch. 3) for further source passages and discussion. For introductions to the mathematical ideas behind the modern resolutions, the Appendix to Salmon (2001) is a good start; Russell (1919) and Courant et al. (1996, Chs. 2 and 9) are also both wonderful sources. Finally, three collections of original sources for Zeno's paradoxes: Lee (1936) contains everything known, Kirk et al (1983, Ch. 9) contains a great deal of material (in English and Greek) with useful commentaries, and Cohen et al. (1995) also has the main passages.


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Related Entries

Aristotle | atomism: ancient | Cantor, Georg | Dedekind, Richard | infinity | Parmenides | Plato | Pythagoras | quantum mechanics | Simplicius | space and time: supertasks | time


This entry is dedicated to the late Wesley Salmon, who did so much to educate philosophers about the significance of Zeno's paradoxes. Those familar with his work will see that this discussion owes a great deal to him; I hope that he would find it satisfactory. This material is based upon work supported by National Science Foundation Grant SES-0004375. I would also like to thank Eliezer Dorr for bringing to my attention some problems with my original formulation of the Dichotomy.