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Ethics of Stem Cell Research

First published Fri Apr 25, 2008

Human embryonic stem cell (HESC) research offers much hope for alleviating the human suffering brought on by the ravages of disease and injury. HESCs are characterized by their capacity for self-renewal and their ability to differentiate into all types of cells of the body. The main goal of HESC research is to identify the mechanisms that govern cell differentiation and to turn HESCs into specific cell types that can be used for treating debilitating and life-threatening diseases and injuries.

Despite the tremendous therapeutic promise of HESC research, the research has met with heated opposition because the harvesting of HESCs involves the destruction of the human embryo. HESCs are derived in vitro around the fifth day of the embryo's development (Thomson et al. 1998). A typical day-5 human embryo consists of 200-250 cells, most of which comprise the trophoblast, which is the outermost layer of the blastocyst. HESCs are harvested from the inner cell mass of the blastocyst, which consists of 30-34 cells. The derivation of HESC cultures requires the removal of the trophoblast. This process of disaggregating the blastocyst's cells eliminates its potential for further development. Opponents of HESC research argue that the research is morally impermissible because it involves the unjust killing of innocent human beings.

Scientists recently succeeded in converting adult human skin cells into cells that appear to have the properties of HESCs by activating four genes in the adult cells (Takahashi et al. 2007; Yu et al. 2007). The reprogrammed cells — “induced pluripotent stem cells” (iPSCs) — could ultimately eliminate the need for HESCs. However, at present, the consensus in the scientific community is that both HESC and iPSC research should be pursued, as we do not yet know whether iPSCs have the same potential as HESCs or whether it is safe to transplant them into humans. Thus, the controversies around HESC research will continue, at least in the near-term.

While the principal source of the controversy surrounding HESC research lies in competing views about the value of human embryonic life, the scope of ethical issues in HESC research is broader than the question of the ethics of destroying human embryos. It also encompasses questions about, among other things, whether researchers who use but do not derive HESCs are complicit in the destruction of embryos, whether there is a moral distinction between creating embryos for research purposes and creating them for reproductive ends, the permissibility of cloning human embryos to harvest HESCs, and the ethics of creating human/non-human chimeras. This entry provides an overview of all but the last two issues just listed; cloning and human-non-human chimeras are addressed in separate entries.

1. The Ethics of Destroying Human Embryos for Research

The potential therapeutic benefits of HESC research provide strong grounds in favor of the research. If looked at from a strictly consequentialist perspective, it's almost certainly the case that the potential health benefits from the research outweigh the loss of embryos involved and whatever suffering results from that loss for persons who want to protect embryos. However, most of those who oppose the research argue that the constraints against killing innocent persons to promote social utility apply to human embryos. Thus, as long as we accept non-consequentialist constraints on killing persons, those supporting HESC research must respond to the claim that those constraints apply to human embryos.

In its most basic form, the central argument supporting the claim that it is unethical to destroy human embryos goes as follows: It is morally impermissible to intentionally kill innocent human beings; the human embryo is an innocent human being; therefore it is morally impermissible to intentionally kill the human embryo. It is worth noting that this argument, if sound, would not suffice to show that all or even most HESC research is impermissible, since most investigators engaged in HESC research do not participate in the derivation of HESCs but instead use cell lines that researchers who performed the derivation have made available. To show that researchers who use but do not derive HESCs participate in an immoral activity, one would further need to establish their complicity in the destruction of embryos. We will consider this issue in section 2. But for the moment, let us address the argument that it is unethical to destroy human embryos.

1.1 When does a human being begin to exist?

A premise of the argument against killing embryos is that human embryos are human beings. The issue of when a human being begins to exist is, however, a contested one. The standard view of those who oppose HESC research is that a human being begins to exist with the emergence of the one-cell zygote at fertilization. At this stage, human embryos are said to be “whole living member[s] of the species homo sapiens … [which] possess the epigenetic primordia for self-directed growth into adulthood, with their determinateness and identity fully intact” (George & Gomez-Lobo 2002, 258). This view is sometimes challenged on the grounds that monozygotic twinning is possible until around days 14-15 of an embryo's development (Smith & Brogaard 2003). An individual who is an identical twin cannot be numerically identical to the one-cell zygote, since both twins bear the same relationship to the zygote, and numerical identity must satisfy transitivity. That is, if the zygote, A, divides into two genetically identical cell groups that give rise to identical twins B and C, B and C cannot be the same individual as A because they are not numerically identical with each other. This shows that not all persons can correctly assert that they began their life as a zygote. However, it does not follow that the zygote is not a human being, or that it has not individuated. This would follow only if one held that a condition of an entity's status as an individual human being is that it be impossible for it to cease to exist by dividing into two or more entities. But this seems implausible. Consider cases in which we imagine adult humans undergoing fission (for example, along the lines of Parfit's thought experiments, where each half of the brain is implanted into a different body) (Parfit 1984). The prospect of our going out of existence through fission does not pose a threat to our current status as distinct human persons. Likewise, one might argue, the fact that a zygote may divide does not create problems for the view that the zygote is a distinct human being.

There are, however, other grounds on which some have sought to reject that the early human embryo is a human being. According to one view, the cells that comprise the early embryo are a bundle of homogeneous cells that exist in the same membrane but do not form a human organism because the cells do not function in a coordinated way to regulate and preserve a single life (Smith & Brogaard 2003, McMahan 2002). While each of the cells is alive, they only become parts of a human organism when there is substantial cell differentiation and coordination, which occurs around day-16 after fertilization. Thus, on this account, disaggregating the cells of the 5-day embryo to derive HESCs does not entail the destruction of a human being.

This account is subject to dispute on empirical grounds. That there is some intercellular coordination in the zygote is revealed by the fact that the development of the early embryo requires that some cells become part of the trophoblast while others become part of the inner cell mass. Without some coordination between the cells, there would be nothing to prevent all cells from differentiating in the same direction (Damschen, Gomez-Lobo and Schonecker 2006). The question remains, though, whether this degree of cellular interaction is sufficient to render the early human embryo a human being. Just how much intercellular coordination must exist for a group of cells to constitute a human organism cannot be resolved by scientific facts about the embryo, but is instead an open metaphysical question (McMahan 2007a).

1.2 The moral status of human embryos

Suppose that the 5-day human embryo is a human being. On the standard argument against HESC research, membership in the species Homo sapiens confers on the embryo a right not to be killed. This view is grounded in the assumption that human beings have the same moral status (at least with respect to possessing this right) at all stages of their lives.

Some accept that the human embryo is a human being but argue that the human embryo does not have the moral status requisite for a right to life. There is reason to think that species membership is not the property that determines a being's moral status. We have all been presented with the relevant thought experiments, courtesy of Disney, Orwell, Kafka, and countless science fiction works. The results seem clear: we regard mice, pigs, insects, aliens, and so on, as having the moral status of persons in those possible worlds in which they exhibit the psychological and cognitive traits that we normally associate with mature human beings. This suggests that it is some higher-order mental capacity (or capacities) that grounds the right to life. While there is no consensus about the capacities that are necessary for the right to life, some of the capacities that have been proposed include reasoning, self-awareness, and agency (Kuhse & Singer 1992, Tooley 1983, Warren 1973).

The main difficulty for those who appeal to such mental capacities as the touchstone for the right to life is that early human infants lack these capacities, and do so to a greater degree than many of the nonhuman animals that most deem it acceptable to kill (Marquis 2002). This presents a challenge for those who hold that the non-consequentialist constraints on killing human children and adults apply to early human infants. Some reject that these constraints apply to infants, and allow that there may be circumstances where it is permissible to sacrifice infants for the greater good (McMahan 2007b). Others argue that, while infants do not have the intrinsic properties that ground a right to life, we should nonetheless treat them as if they have a right to life in order to promote love and concern towards them, as these attitudes have good consequences for the persons they will become (Benn 1973, Strong 1997).

Some claim that we can reconcile the ascription of a right to life to all humans with the view that higher order mental capacities ground the right to life by distinguishing between two senses of mental capacities: “immediately exercisable” capacities and “basic natural” capacities. (George and Gomez-Lobo 2002, 260). According to this view, an individual's immediately exercisable capacity for higher mental functions is the actualization of natural capacities for higher mental functions that exist at the embryonic stage of life. Human embryos have a “rational nature,” but that nature is not fully realized until individuals are able to exercise their capacity to reason. The difference between these types of capacity is said to be a difference between degrees of development along a continuum. There is merely a quantitative difference between the mental capacities of embryos, fetuses, infants, children, and adults (as well as among infants, children, and adults). And this difference, so the argument runs, cannot justify treating some of these individuals with moral respect while denying it to others.

Given that a human embryo cannot reason at all, the claim that it has a rational nature has struck some as tantamount to asserting that it has the potential to become an individual that can engage in reasoning (Sagan & Singer 2007). But an entity's having this potential does not logically entail that it has the same status as beings that have realized some or all of their potential (Feinberg 1986). Moreover, with the advent of cloning technologies, the range of entities that we can now identify as potential persons arguably creates problems for those who place great moral weight on the embryo's potential. A single somatic cell or HESC can in principle (though not yet in practice) develop into a mature human being under the right conditions — that is, where the cell's nucleus is transferred into an enucleated egg, the new egg is electrically stimulated to create an embryo, and the embryo is transferred to a woman's uterus and brought to term. If the basis for protecting embryos is that they have the potential to become reasoning beings, then, some argue, we have reason to ascribe a high moral status to the trillions of cells that share this potential and to assist as many of these cells as we reasonably can to realize their potential (Sagan & Singer 2007, Savulescu 1999). Because this is a stance that we can expect nearly everyone to reject, it's not clear that opponents of HESC research can effectively ground their position in the human embryo's potential.

One response to this line of argument has been to claim that embryos possess a kind of potential that somatic cells and HESCs lack. An embryo has potential in the sense of having an “active disposition” and “intrinsic power” to develop into a mature human being (Lee & George 2006). An embryo can mature on its own in the absence of interference with its development. A somatic cell, on the other hand, does not have the inherent capacity or disposition to grow into a mature human being. However, some question whether this distinction is viable, especially in the HESC research context. While it is true that somatic cells can realize their potential only with the assistance of outside interventions, an embryo's development also requires that numerous conditions external to it are satisfied. In the case of embryos that are naturally conceived, they must implant, receive nourishment, and avoid exposure to dangerous substances in utero. In the case of spare embryos created through in vitro fertilization — which are presently the source of HESCs for research — the embryos must be thawed and transferred to a willing woman's uterus. Given the role that external factors — including technological interventions — play in an embryo's realizing its potential, one can question whether there is a morally relevant distinction between an embryo's and somatic cell's potential and thus raise doubts about potentiality as a foundation for the right to life (Devolder & Harris 2007).

Some grant that human embryos lack the properties essential to a right to life, but hold that they possess an intrinsic value that calls for a measure of respect and places at least some moral constraints on their use: “The life of a single human organism commands respect and protection … no matter in what form or shape, because of the complex creative investment it represents and because of our wonder at the divine or evolutionary processes that produce new lives from old ones.” (Dworkin l992, 84). There are, however, divergent views about the level of respect embryos command and what limits exist on their use. Some opponents of HESC research hold that the treatment of human embryos as mere research tools always fails to manifest proper respect for them. Other opponents take a less absolutist view. Some, for example, deem embryos less valuable than more mature human beings but argue that the benefits of HESC research are too speculative to warrant the destruction of embryos, and that the benefits might, in any case, be achieved through the use of noncontroversial sources of stem cells (e.g., adult stem cells) (Holm 2003).

Many, if not most, who support the use of human embryos for HESC research would likely agree with opponents of the research that there are some circumstances where the use of human embryos would display a lack of appropriate respect for human life, for example, were they to be offered for consumption to contestants in a reality TV competition or destroyed for the production of cosmetics. But proponents of the research hold that the value of human embryos is not great enough to constrain the pursuit of research that may yield significant therapeutic benefits. Supporters of the research also frequently question whether most opponents of the research are consistent in their ascription of a high value to human embryos, as opponents generally display little concern about the fact that many embryos created for fertility treatment are discarded.

1.3 The case of “doomed embryos”

When spare embryos exist after fertility treatment, the individuals for whom the embryos were created typically have the option of storing for them for future reproductive use, donating them to other infertile couples, donating them to research, or discarding them. Some argue that as long as the decision to donate embryos for research is made after the decision to discard them, it is morally permissible to use them in HESC research even if we assume that they have the moral status of persons. The claim takes two different forms. One is that it is morally permissible to kill an individual who is about to be killed by someone else where killing that individual will help others (Curzer, H. 2004). The other is that researchers who derive HESCs from embryos that were slated for destruction do not cause their death. Instead, the decision to discard the embryos causes their death; research just causes the manner of their death (Green 2002).

Both versions of the argument presume that the decision to discard spare embryos prior to the decision to donate them to research entails that donated embryos are doomed to destruction when researchers receive them. There are two arguments one might marshal against this presumption. First, one who wants to donate embryos to research might first elect to discard them only because doing so is a precondition for donating them. There could be cases in which one who chooses the discard option would have donated the embryos to other couples were the research donation option not available. The fact that a decision to discard embryos is made prior to the decision to donate the embryos thus does not establish that the embryos were doomed to destruction before the decision to donate them to research was made. Second, a researcher who receives embryos could choose to rescue them, whether by continuing to store them or by donating them to infertile couples. While this would violate the law, the fact that it is within a researcher's power to prevent the destruction of the embryos he or she receives poses problems for the claim that the decision to discard the embryos dooms them or causes their destruction.

2. The Ethics of Using Human Embryonic Stem Cells in Research

Assume for the sake of argument that it is morally impermissible to destroy human embryos. It does not follow that all research with HESCs is impermissible, as it is sometimes permissible to benefit from moral wrongs. For example, there is nothing objectionable about transplant surgeons and patients benefiting from the organs of murder and drunken driving victims (Robertson 1988). If there are conditions under which a researcher may use HESCs without being complicit in the destruction of embryos, then those who oppose the destruction of embryos could support research with HESCs under certain circumstances.

Researchers using HESCs are clearly implicated in the destruction of embryos where they derive the cells themselves or enlist others to derive the cells. However, most investigators who conduct research with HESCs obtain them from an existing pool of cell lines and play no role in their derivation. One view is that we cannot assign causal or moral responsibility to investigators for the destruction of embryos from which the HESCs they use are derived where their “research plans had no effect on whether the original immoral derivation occurred.” (Robertson 1999). This view requires qualification. There may be cases in which HESCs are derived for the express purpose of making them widely available to HESC investigators. In such instances, it may be that no individual researcher's plans motivated the derivation of the cells. Nonetheless, one might argue that investigators who use these cells are complicit in the destruction of the embryos from which the cells were derived because they are participants in a research enterprise that creates a demand for HESCs. For these investigators to avoid the charge of complicity in the destruction of embryos, it must be the case that the researchers who derived the HESCs would have performed the derivation in the absence of external demand for the cells (Siegel 2004).

The issue about complicity goes beyond the question of an HESC researcher's role in the destruction of the particular human embryo(s) from which the cells he or she uses are derived. There is a further concern that research with existing HESCs will result in the future destruction of embryos: “[I]f this research leads to possible treatments, private investment in such efforts will increase greatly and the demand for many thousands of cell lines with different genetic profiles will be difficult to resist.” (U.S. Conference of Catholic Bishops 2001). This objection faces two difficulties. First, it appears to be too sweeping: research with adult stem cells and non-human animal stem cells, as well as general research in genetics, embryology, and cell biology could be implicated, since all of this research might advance our understanding of HESCs and result in increased demand for them. Yet, no one, including those who oppose HESC research, argues that we should not support these areas of research. Second, the claim about future demand for HESCs is speculative. Indeed, current HESC research could ultimately reduce or eliminate demand for the cells by providing insights into cell biology that enable the use of alternative sources of cells (Siegel 2004).

While it might thus be possible for a researcher to use HESCs without being morally responsible for the destruction of human embryos, that does not end the inquiry into complicity. Some argue that agents can be complicit in wrongful acts for which they are not morally responsible. One such form of complicity arises from an association with wrongdoing that symbolizes acquiescence in the wrongdoing (Burtchaell 1989). The failure to take appropriate measures to distance oneself from moral wrongs may give rise to “metaphysical guilt,” which produces a moral taint and for which shame is the appropriate response (May 1992). The following question thus arises: Assuming it is morally wrongful to destroy human embryos, are HESC researchers who are not morally responsible for the destruction of embryos complicit in the sense of symbolically aligning themselves with a wrongful act?

One response is that a researcher who benefits from the destruction of embryos need not sanction the act any more than the transplant surgeon who uses the organs of a murder or drunken driving victim sanctions the homicidal act (Curzer 2004). But this response is unlikely to be satisfactory to opponents of HESC research. There is arguably an important difference between the transplant case and HESC research insofar as the moral wrong associated with the latter (a) systematically devalues a particular class of human beings and (b) is largely socially accepted and legally permitted. Opponents of HESC research might suggest that the HESC research case is more analogous to the following kind of case: Imagine a society in which the practice of killing members of a particular racial or ethnic group is legally permitted and generally accepted. Suppose that biological materials obtained from these individuals subsequent to their deaths are made available for research uses. Could researchers use these materials while appropriately distancing themselves from the wrongful practice? Arguably, they could not. There is a heightened need to protest moral wrongs where those wrongs are socially and legally accepted. Attempts to benefit from the moral wrong in these circumstances may be incompatible with mounting a proper protest (Siegel 2003).

But even if we assume that HESC researchers cannot avoid the taint of metaphysical guilt, it is not clear that researchers who bear no moral responsibility for the destruction of embryos are morally obligated not to use HESCs. One might argue that there is a prima facie duty to avoid moral taint, but that this duty may be overridden for the sake of a noble cause.

3. The Ethics of Creating Embryos for Stem Cell Research and Therapy

Most HESCs are derived from embryos that were created for infertility treatment but that were in excess of what the infertile individual(s) ultimately needed to achieve a pregnancy. The HESCs derived from these leftover embryos offer investigators a powerful tool for understanding the mechanisms controlling cell differentiation. However, there are scientific and therapeutic reasons not to rely entirely on leftover embryos. From a research standpoint, creating embryos through cloning technologies with cells that are known to have particular genetic mutations would allow researchers to study the underpinnings of genetic diseases in vitro. From a therapeutic standpoint, the HESCs obtained from leftover IVF embryos are not genetically diverse enough to address the problem of immune rejection by recipients of stem cell transplants. (Induced pluripotent stem cells may ultimately prove sufficient for these research and therapeutic ends, since the cells can (a) be selected for specific genetic mutations and (b) provide an exact genetic match for stem cell recipients.) At present, the best way to address the therapeutic problem is through the creation of a public stem cell bank that represents a genetically diverse pool of stem cell lines (Faden et al. 2003, Lott & Savulescu 2007). This kind of stem cell bank would require the creation of embryos from gamete donors who share the same HLA-types (i.e., similar versions of the genes that mediate immune recognition and rejection).

Each of these enterprises has its own set of ethical issues. In the case of research cloning, some raise concerns, for example, that the perfection of cloning techniques for research purposes will enable the pursuit of reproductive cloning, and that efforts to obtain the thousands of eggs required for the production of cloned embryos will result in the exploitation of women who provide the eggs (President's Council on Bioethics 2002, Norsigian 2005). With respect to stem cell banks, it is not practically possible to create a bank of HESCs that will provide a close immunological match for all recipients. This gives rise to the challenge of determining who will have biological access to stem cell therapies. We might construct the bank so that it provides matches for the greatest number of people in the population, gives everyone an equal chance of finding a match, or ensures that all ancestral/ethnic groups are fairly represented in the bank (Faden et al. 2003, Bok, Schill, & Faden 2004, Greene 2006).

There are, however, more general challenges to the creation of embryos for research and therapeutic purposes. Some argue that the creation of embryos for non-reproductive ends is morally problematic, regardless of whether they are created through cloning or in vitro fertilization. There are two related arguments that have been advanced to morally distinguish the creation of embryos for reproductive purposes from the creation of embryos for research and therapeutic purposes. First, each embryo created for procreative purposes is originally viewed as a potential child in the sense that each is a candidate for implantation and development into a mature human. In contrast, embryos created for research or therapies are viewed as mere tools from the outset (Annas, Caplan & Elias 1996, President's Council on Bioethics 2002). Second, while embryos created for research and therapy are produced with the intent to destroy them, the destruction of embryos created for reproduction is a foreseeable but unintended consequence of their creation (Fizpatrick 2003).

One response to the first argument has been to suggest that we could, under certain conditions, view all research embryos as potential children in the relevant sense. If all research embryos were included in a lottery in which some of them were donated to individuals for reproductive purposes, all research embryos would have a chance at developing into mature humans (Devander 2005). Since those who oppose creating embryos for research would likely maintain their opposition in the research embryo lottery case, it is arguably irrelevant whether embryos are viewed as potential children when they are created. Of course, research embryos in the lottery case would be viewed as both potential children and potential research tools. But this is also true in the case of embryos created for reproductive purposes where patients are open to donating spare embryos to research.

As to the second argument, the distinction between intending and merely foreseeing harms is one to which many people attach moral significance, and it is central to the Doctrine of Double Effect. But even if one holds that this is a morally significant distinction, it is not clear that it is felicitous to characterize the destruction of spare embryos as an unintended but foreseeable side-effect of creating embryos for fertility treatment. Fertility clinics do not merely foresee that some embryos will be destroyed, as they choose to offer patients the option of discarding embryos and carry out the disposal of embryos when patients request it. Patients who elect that their embryos be discarded also do not merely foresee the embryos' destruction; their election of that option manifests their intention that the embryos be destroyed. There is thus reason to doubt that there is a moral distinction between creating embryos for research and creating them for reproductive purposes, at least given current fertility clinic practices.


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abortion | cloning | double effect, doctrine of | ethics, biomedical: chimeras, human/non-human