Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Mon Nov 4, 2002; substantive revision Thu Sep 7, 2006

Supererogation is the technical term for the class of actions that go “beyond the call of duty.” Roughly speaking, supererogatory acts are morally good although not (strictly) required. Although common discourse in most cultures allows for such acts and often attaches special value to them, ethical theories have only rarely discussed this category of actions directly and systematically. A conspicuous exception is the Roman Catholic tradition, which gave rise to the concept of supererogation, and the virulent attacks on it by Lutherans and Calvinists. Surprisingly, the history of supererogation in non-religious ethical theory is very recent, starting only in 1958 with J. O. Urmson's seminal article, “Saints and Heroes.”

The Latin etymology of “supererogation” is paying out more than is due (super-erogare), and the term first appears in the Latin version of the New Testament in the parable of the Good Samaritan. Although we often believe that Good Samaritanism is praiseworthy and non-obligatory at the same time, philosophical reflection raises the question whether there can be any morally good actions that are not morally required, and even if there are such actions, how come they are optional or supererogatory. Thus, the substantial literature on supererogation since the 1960s demonstrates that even though the class of actions beyond duty is relatively small and the philosophical attention paid to it is only recent, the status of supererogation in ethical theory is important in exposing deep problems about the nature of duty and its limits, the relationship between duty and value, the role of ideals and excuses in ethical judgment, and the connection between actions and virtue. Supererogation raises interesting problems both on the meta-ethical level of deontic logic and on the normative level of the justification of moral demands.

1. The Two Faces of Morality: Values and Duties

Moral discourse is normative in nature, that is, concerned with guiding behavior rather than describing the world. But this normative character of moral judgment falls broadly speaking under two categories, the axiological and the deontic. The former refers to goodness, ideals and virtues; the latter to what ought to be done, to duties and obligations, to justice and rights. Whereas the object of axiological assessment is primarily states of affairs and human agents, the object of deontic evaluation is human actions. For instance, the state of affairs of a world with no war is a moral ideal and the individual Socrates is virtuous, whereas the practice of paying back debts is obligatory and acts of theft prohibited.

The axiological face of morality, unlike its deontic counterpart, is open-ended. Virtuous character traits, ethical ideals, or the goal of promoting human happiness have no fixed measure and can in principle be always improved and further perfected or realized. Moral requirements are relatively fixed and well defined, having clear criteria of fulfillment and violation. Consequently, the deontic sphere of morality is often taken as describing the minimal conditions of morality, the basic requirements of social morality that secure a just society, while the axiological sphere aims at higher ideals which can only be commended and recommended but not strictly required. In its deontic nature, morality is closely associated with the legal, while the axiological is closer to the ideal or the ideological (sometimes referred to as “the ethical”). Furthermore, the way in which deontic norms are fixed and universally expected of all members of society presupposes the general ability of all moral agents to act in the light of these norms. Ideals of goodness and virtue, in their open-ended texture, cannot be similarly expected of everyone and their determination is not subjected to the strict condition of “‘ought’ implies ‘can’.”

Most ethical theories maintain some form of this two-tier structure of the moral system, although admittedly in different versions and emphases. But this double role of normative discourse inevitably raises the idea of supererogation, the category of actions that are praiseworthy (either in creating good states of affairs or in reflecting a particularly virtuous trait of character) yet at the same time not obligatory. Supererogation lies at the intersection of the axiological and the deontic, the ‘good’ and the ‘ought’. Since moral theories of the past (like Aristotle, Kant and utilitarianism) all appeal in some form to both deontic and axiological concepts, the scant and cursory discussion of supererogation in those theories is all the more surprising.

The most notable exception to this historical generalization is the long-standing and elaborate Roman Catholic doctrine of opera supererogationis. The general background of this doctrine is the recognition of the two faces of morality under the concepts of “precepts” and “counsels.” The origins of this distinction go back to the New Testament, in which to the question what one should do to gain eternal life, Jesus replies: “if thou wilt enter into life, keep the commandments,” but adds “if thou wilt be perfect, go sell what thou hast and give to the poor and thou shalt have treasure in Heaven” (Matthew xix, 16-24). Beyond charity, the Church Fathers detected in the New Testament two additional evangelical counsels, chastity and obedience: taking a wife is no sin, but virginity has a superior value; the life of an ordinary Christian cannot be blamed, but that of absolute monastic dedication is far better. Forgiveness and love of one's enemies are also religious ideals that originate in the New Testament and were sometimes given a supererogatory interpretation in later Church doctrine.

The Old Law of the Old Testament is regarded by early Catholic thinkers as reflecting the rigid and minimal demands of religious morality, typically formulated in the negative terms of prohibitions and precepts (the violation of which entails punishment). The New Law, that of the New Testament, sometimes called the Law of Liberty, leaves the individual free to pursue more edifying ideals of perfection. Tertullian called this freedom licentia. According to the Catholic doctrine, the special merit of supererogatory acts accredited to their agent can be used both for that individual's own salvation and for the salvation of others. The “superabundant merit,” most typically collected by the actions of Jesus and the saints, who far exceeded what was required for their own salvation, is deposited in the Spiritual Treasury of the Church to be disposed by the Pope and the bishops for remitting the sins of other, ordinary believers. This is how the institution of Indulgences gradually developed in the late middle ages: sinners could buy the remission of their sins, first by joining the Crusades and later by contributing money to the coffers of the Church.

The most articulate exposition of the doctrine of supererogation in the Christian tradition is found in Thomas Aquinas (Aquinas 1947-8). Thomas mentions two distinct sources of merit of supererogatory behavior. On the one hand supererogation serves as a more expedient or guaranteed way of achieving everlasting life; on the other, it is intrinsically good in being aimed at higher ends than the mere fulfillment of the commandments. Precepts are universal in their scope, whereas counsels are addressed to the few who have the capacity and inclination to pursue the life of perfection. For Thomas, the open-texture character of the counsels of supererogation is what makes the morality of love superior to the authoritarian nature of the strict law. But Thomas does not draw a clear borderline between duty and supererogation. It is, for example, not clear whether “love thy enemy” is a precept or a supererogatory counsel. It is similarly unclear whether beneficence (almsgiving) is a duty or lies beyond duty. Nor is the role of virtue in demarcating the supererogatory from the obligatory explained. Thomas says that both natural law and positive law prescribe acts of virtue in general but they do not prescribe every specific virtuous act (except for those that promote the social good of justice and peace). And as for divine law, it prescribes also other, non-social actions that belong to the relations between man and God but leaves those actions of perfect virtue to the realm of supererogatory counsel.

The Catholic doctrine of supererogation met with an extremely fierce opposition in the times of the Reformation. Luther, Calvin and Anglican theologians attacked both the theory of “super-meritorious” actions and the corruption involved in the commercialization of the institution of indulgences for which the theory served as a cover. No human being, not even a saint, can do all that is strictly required as a duty, let alone hope to go beyond that. The way to salvation is not through “works” but through divine grace alone (Luther 1957). Even the most dramatic acts of martyrdom and self-sacrifice, which served the Catholics as paradigm examples of supererogation, are strictly speaking obligatory. Protestant ethics thus undermines the distinction between the two faces of morality: on the one hand, normative requirements cannot be defined in terms of rules fixing minimally prescribed behavior; on the other hand, every religiously good behavior is obligatory. Saints and sinners are equally dependent on God's grace for their salvation. Paradoxically, it may be noted, exactly because human actions can never fulfill God's commandments, divine grace is never due or ethically called for: it is typically supererogatory, a free gift of God!

An interesting parallel to the Christian concept of supererogation can be found in Jewish thought in the notion of "lifnim mishurat hadin". Typically, the rabbis dispute its philosophical meaning since it could be literally understood as either "within the line of law" or - as it is more often understood - "beyond the line of law". Some philosophers (like Nahmanides) follow the former reading, arguing that moral acts of piety or charity are obligatory, that is to say duties that apply to everybody. Others (notably Maimonides) adhere to the latter, more supererogatory understanding, holding that such acts are either obligatory only for the "pious" few or even not obligatory for anyone (Shilo 1978). This debate regarding the possibility of supererogatory acts reflects the deep underlying problem of the whole normative discourse in Jewish thought, namely is there an independent system of moral norms and ideals which is not directly derived from the Halakhic, commandment-based, legally binding (and enforceable) law (Lichtenstein 1975).

The hostile attitude of the Reformation to supererogation and the disappearance of the institution of indulgences in the Catholic Church led to the rapid decline in the theological and philosophical interest in the concept of supererogation in the modern era. However, the great theological debates about actions beyond the call of duty set the stage for the contemporary discussion of the subject. The revived interest in supererogation since the 1960s has completely shifted the focus from the theological context to the ethical, but the structure of the argumentation is often reminiscent of the traditional Christian debate.

2. What is Supererogation: Problems of Definition

The conceptual question of what we mean by supererogation and the substantive question of whether there actually are supererogatory acts (and how their normative value can be justified) are inextricably interrelated. Consequently, although the following discussion will try separate the two questions, addressing first the conceptual issue and only later the normative, the division is only didactic. Much of the disagreement about the nature of supererogation and its proper definition is informed by normative views about the scope of moral duty, the legitimate expectations of altruistic behavior, and the value of the autonomy of the individual in pursuing personal goals. This interdependence of the meta-ethical and the normative levels of discourse on supererogation becomes particularly evident when paradigm examples are discussed: for instance, is forgiveness obligatory or supererogatory is both a conceptual and a normative issue, and the same applies to charity, to acts of self-sacrifice and even to toleration, as will be shown below.

J.O. Urmson opened the contemporary discussion of supererogation (strikingly, without ever mentioning the term itself!) by challenging the traditional threefold classification of moral action: the obligatory, the permitted (or indifferent) and the prohibited (Urmson 1958). A more general schema of this classification runs thus (Chisholm 1963):

  1. actions that are good to do and bad not to do
  2. actions that are neither good to do nor bad not to do
  3. actions that are bad to do and good not to do

Urmson argued that a morally significant class of actions, to which he referred as saintly and heroic (such as throwing oneself on an exploding hand grenade in order to save the lives of others), does not fall under any of these categories. He referred to this class as praiseworthy though non-obligatory acts, or in terms of the above general schema as

  1. actions that are good to do but not bad not to do

The scope of this further category became, however, the focus of debate. Supererogatory acts in Urmson's sense (which is reminiscent of the Catholic doctrine) include only actions that are morally praiseworthy, valuable, although not obligatory in the sense that their omission is not blameworthy. But the general formulation (iv) could consist also of small acts of favor, politeness, consideration and tact, which are good though not morally praiseworthy, which can be expected of people even though not strictly demanded. The latter, wider, definition of supererogation, covers a larger scope of actions that we tend to view as good-though-not-obligatory; but the former, narrow, definition of supererogation as having a unique moral merit better captures the essential value and hence justification of supererogation as a distinct category of moral action.

The general schema underlying (iv), i.e. the combination of some positive assessment of the action with a non-negative assessment of its omission, can be filled in various ways. “Good to do, but not bad not to do” appears to be too weak a definition for supererogation, at least in the sense that some omissions of supererogatory action are (or lead to) bad states of affairs. “Right to do, but not wrong not to do” responds to this concern but seems an equally weak definition for supererogatory action, this time due to the overly wide characterization of the positive condition (e.g. “right” falls short of the proper description of the act of volunteering to risk one's life in order to save a stranger). “Praiseworthy to do, but not blameworthy not to do” seems closer to what we wish to say about supererogatory acts. However, praiseworthiness is associated with the evaluation of the agent rather than the act, while supererogation refers primarily to the act. Furthermore, we often praise agents for doing their duty (e.g. in overcoming obstacles like natural fear) and we often do not praise agents of supererogatory action (e.g. when no particular effort, cost, or risk is involved). It seems, therefore, that the neat schema of deontic logic, comprising of pairs of normative concepts applied symmetrically to commission and omission must be broken if we hope to arrive at a more useful characterization of supererogation (Schumaker 1972). This can be done by either mixing concepts from different pairs, such as “good to do but not wrong not to do,” or by enriching the schema itself by adding further conditions, such as the beneficent intentions of the agent and her altruistic motives (Heyd 1982, Zimmerman 1996).

Definitions that are motivated by a skeptical attitude to supererogation often try to salvage the three-fold classification of obligation-permission-prohibition as exhausting the realm of moral actions. Some philosophers identify supererogation with imperfect duty, or with a weak duty, or with duty that is personal and non-universalizable, or with duty that has no correlative right, or with an ethical rather than legal duty, or with an “ought” which is not enforceable. Some even use the oxymoronic term “supererogatory duty” in trying to do justice to the phenomenon of supererogation without giving up the typically Kantian framing of all moral judgments in terms of duty. These are, however, mostly unsuccessful attempts. Imperfect duties, as many Kant scholars have noted, are no less compelling than perfect duties and the distinction between perfect and imperfect duty lies only in the mode of application (to what degree the conditions of its fulfillment are fixed or left to personal choice) rather than in the prescriptive force of the duty itself. And since Kant sometimes defines imperfect duties as duties to adopt ends (rather than engage in particular acts), supererogation and imperfect duty do not belong to the same level of discourse: by doing many acts of charity one does not act supererogatorily, since one cannot be more charitable than required (Guevara 1999, Baron 1987). Furthermore, if supererogation is a personal (rather than universal) duty, then is it by a subjective judgment that it is made to be so? If not, there must be some (universalizable) characteristic which lays the duty on this kind of individual. Finally, there are many duties that have no correlative rights that have nothing to do with supererogation (e.g. duties to animals), so the test of the correlativity of duties to rights cannot account for the distinction between obligation and supererogation.

Another issue raised by attempts to subject the concept of supererogation to some version of the general schema is that of “offence” or “suberogation”: if there are non-obligatory well-doings (supererogation), are there also — as their mirror image — non-prohibited wrong-doings (“permissive ill-doings”)? Or in other words, are there

  1. actions that are bad to do but not good not to do

Some philosophers (Chisholm 1963, Richards 1971,  Forrester 1975, and Driver 1992) were attracted to the logically neat symmetry of supererogation and suberogation, but a critical examination of this artificially invented category demonstrates both the difficulty in filling it with content and flaws in the general schema itself (Heyd 1982, Mellema 1992). Examples for typical “offences” are hard to come by. At most one can think of permissible bad action in relatively trivial cases, like taking too long in a restaurant while others are waiting. These are uninteresting cases from a moral point of view as are their supererogatory counterparts of small favors or acts of politeness. Once we look for examples of morally vicious or villainous action that is nevertheless permissible (which is the counterpart of a morally heroic action), we see there is nothing there. This should hardly be surprising. By its nature, a moral system does not leave patently bad action as morally permissible. In that respect, good and bad, the virtuous and the vicious, are not symmetrical from the deontic point of view: the good is open-ended in a way that the bad is not. The extremely good cannot be required, but the extremely bad (vicious) is the prime target of prohibition.

Wider definitions of supererogation, which refer to any non-obligatory good action, are at risk of losing sight of the specifically moral value usually associated with “acting beyond the call of duty” or “going the second mile.” Although “supererogatory” in English also means superfluous, the technical Roman-Catholic meaning of the concept is closer to what moral philosophy wishes to highlight as a separate category of action. A typical ethically informed definition of supererogation relates both to the element of over-subscription (doing literally more than duty requires) and to the high risk involved in the action (Feinberg 1968). Risk may not be the source of the value of supererogation, since, as we have seen, it is neither a necessary nor a sufficient condition of supererogatory action. Yet it is true that, unlike definitions offered by deontic logicians, an ethical definition of supererogation must include a condition that the action be of a particularly moral value. The source of this particular value is double: the good intended consequences on the one hand, and the optional nature of the act on the other. The good promoted is typically of an altruistic nature and thus an act may be supererogatory even if the overall good is not promoted (as might be the case in extreme acts of self-sacrifice for the sake of another). Supererogatory behavior is typically other-regarding: even if there are duties “to oneself” (which many ethical theorists doubt), they cannot be transcended in a supererogatory way. In that respect, most definitions of supererogation in modern ethics diverge from the Christian tradition: whereas for the latter paradigm examples of supererogation are piety and chastity, for the former these are altruistic deeds of extreme beneficence. There are, however, contemporary non-religious views which leave room for self-regarding actions of supererogation (Kawall 2003).

As for the second source of value of supererogatory action, its optional nature, it should first be noted that supererogatory action must be voluntary (unlike obligatory action, which is often forced or enforced). But again, the neutral deontic description of “neither obligatory nor forbidden” fails to capture the kind of freedom involved in such action. The agent has full discretion whether to go beyond what is required and makes a personal choice to do so. She is neither under any external constraint (like the law), nor under internal demands (of rationality or of the Kantian moral law). In other words, supererogatory behavior is fully optional. Thus, it would be absurd to force a person to do a supererogatory act, even if that act had extremely beneficial consequences. The permission not to do the best we can is not derived from the unenforceability of supererogatory conduct but from agent-centred restrictions which limit the force of the impersonal maximizing principle (Haydar 2002). This does not mean that the agent herself necessarily believes that her action is optional. Many agents of supererogatory acts report that all they did was what they felt they “had to do,” or what they thought was their duty (although when asked whether they would expect such an action to be performed by everybody else in the same circumstances they would probably answer in the negative, thus getting entangled in an inconsistency typical of moral modesty).

Doing one's duty does not win the agent any credit. She only did what she had to do. But going beyond the call of duty is meritorious exactly in the sense that the agent did something “extra,” breaking the balance of justice or that of respect for claim-rights and the fulfillment of duties. This merit of supererogatory action should be held distinct from the praise we often assign to the agent. Praise is a subjective assessment or recognition of the particular way in which the agent faced a moral challenge and acted as she did (e.g. overcoming special difficulties or obstacles, or sacrificing herself in the course of doing either what was her duty or what lay beyond it). Merit is an objective property of the act itself. It is typically attached to heroic and saintly acts, but it can also be gained by minor supererogatory acts of kindness or gifts, and is thus not necessarily associated with particular praise for the agent (cf. Montague 1989, Trianosky 1986). Unlike the Catholic doctrine, few theorists of supererogation believe that this merit is transferable or can serve as compensation for other people's moral failures. And although supererogation cannot be hoped to simply offset even one's own violations of duty, the merit of actions beyond the call of duty definitely plays an important role in the overall evaluation of one's moral record. In cases of a high potential benefit we may sometimes even be permitted to act supererogatorily rather than do our duty (Kamm 1985). Furthermore, the traditional idea of merit (or “superabundance”) associated with supererogation is reflected in secular ethical theory in the duty of gratitude: acknowledging the meritorious nature of a gift or any non-obligatory well doing is the morally obligatory response (irrespective of the moral praise which might or might not accrue to the agent of the supererogatory act).

The characterization of supererogatory acts is highly controversial and cannot be captured by a strict formal definition. Furthermore, as has already come up in the discussion in this section, the way we describe supererogation is closely dependent on the way we justify (or deny) its moral value. Most typically, definitions of supererogation that introduce conditions of altruistic intention, free choice and good consequences are constructed in a way that betrays an underlying view about its special moral value and hence justification. On the other hand, definitions that are merely formal (deontic) in nature are not committed to the intrinsic value, indeed to the very existence of supererogatory actions.

3. Three Views of Supererogation: Problems of Justification

The modern debate whether there actually are supererogatory acts has lost its traditional fervor typical of the great religious disputes between Catholics and Reformers in the 16th and 17th centuries. One reason is that there are no direct political or institutional stakes involved in the contemporary discussions, such as Church power in granting indulgences (although there is a supererogatory dimension in the contemporary idea of Truth and Reconciliation Commissions). Yet, the issue between supererogationists, as they are often called, and their opponents still runs deep and involves the general relationship between the “good” and the “ought”.

The views about the possibility and value of supererogatory acts can be grouped under three categories:

  1. Anti-supererogationism: since all morally good action is obligatory, there cannot be a separate class of morally good action the omission of which is not wrong.
  2. Qualified supererogationism: there are actions which lie beyond the call of duty, but their value is derived from their being hypothetical duties, subjective duties, duties from which one may be excused, that is, duties in a weaker sense.
  3. Unqualified supererogationism: supererogatory actions lie entirely and without qualification beyond the requirements of morality and that is the source of their unique value.

Like any classification, this one is somewhat artificial and arbitrary. Some particular views of supererogation cannot be easily and neatly subsumed under one of its categories. The distinction between (1) and (2) hinges on the nature of the relevant “qualification”: even the rigorous deniers of supererogation are willing to accept some form of excuse for not engaging in particularly difficult or demanding moral action, and qualified supererogationists may often admit that a heroic action is obligatory even if it is unrealistic for society to expect individuals to perform it. The borderline between (2) and (3) is also often vague, since when one tries to explain what makes a class of actions supererogatory, in the unqualified sense of being fully optional, one is often drawn back to the difficulty in performing it, to the particular personal virtue required to do so, or in general terms to certain qualifying conditions which justify leaving them beyond the demands of morality.

The three views of supererogation are three responses to the “paradox of supererogation,” namely how can the moral good not be required as a duty. The first view recognizes the paradox and addresses it by denying the very possibility of supererogation; the second resolves what it sees as an apparent paradox by explaining the conditions under which duty loses its prescriptive force; the third view denies that there is in the first place any paradox in the gap between the “good” and the “ought,” thus leaving room for an independent category of supererogation.

3.1 Anti-supererogationism

The denial of supererogation is basically associated with the rejection of the idea of the two faces of morality. Normativity is one and cannot be split into two levels, that of the good (the desirable, the ideal, the recommended) and that of the required (the obligatory, the prescribed). What “ought to be the case” also “ought to be done.” A possible good state of affairs creates a reason for action. Furthermore, the fact that human beings, due to their limitations and flawed character, often fail to live up to the standards of the ideally good behavior is a deplorable fact that does not undermine the normative power of the moral demands.

This “good-ought tie-up” is a theoretically attractive principle: whatever is good, ought to be done. If an action is good, then there must be reasons for doing it. If it is the best possible action, the reasons for doing it are conclusive, that is outweighing all other reasons for not doing it (or doing something else). Failing to do the best action cannot therefore be immune from blame or condemnation. Or, in other words, doing the best is always obligatory, never optional. Supererogation is impossible (Moore 1948, New 1974, Feldman 1986, Pybus 1982).

The principled denial of supererogation was central in the theological conception of Lutherans and Calvinists. The demands of God are so extensive that human beings have not the slightest chance of ever satisfying them, let alone going beyond them. But there are also non-theological adherents to this idea of the “totalitarian” dominion of duty. Kantian ethics is based on the general idea of an all-encompassing moral law and conceives of duty as the only expression of moral value in human action. Universalizability of the maxim of action and acting from the sense of duty (or respect for the law) as a motive are two constitutive hallmarks of moral action according to Kant. But the two are incompatible with the nature of supererogatory action, which is optional and personal on the one hand and not motivated by the subjection to the moral law on the other. Classical utilitarianism may also be interpreted as denying any space for supererogation. If promoting the overall good in the world is the fundamental principle of action, there can be no (non-utilitarian) exemption from the duty to do so (but see Slote 1989, and the suggestion of “satisficing” rather than “optimizing” as a consequentialist principle). Both Kantians and utilitarians are highly suspicious of acts of great personal self-sacrifice (typical of some paradigm examples of supererogation). For Kant they may reflect moral self-indulgence and vanity unbound by the moral law or even be a violation of one's duties to oneself (Kant 1949, Timmermann 2005). For utilitarians such acts may end up decreasing the overall happiness in the world (since the loss to the agent could outweigh the gain for the beneficiary, either in the specific individual case, or when adopted as a general rule of behavior). It should, however, be noted that there are serious attempts to interpret Kant's theory as leaving some room for supererogation (Hill 1971, Eisenberg 1966, Heyd 1983) and there are utilitarians like Mill who specifically hail the value of non-obligatory meritorious action (Mill 1969).

The denial of the value of supererogatory action also appeals to its incompatibility with the fundamental requirement of impartiality. Actions beyond the call of duty are not expected of everybody on an equal basis and are not bestowed on everybody in an impartial way. In other words, there are no general rules regarding either the agent or the recipient of supererogatory conduct. Thus, no general specification as to who deserves or is entitled to be the recipient of supererogatory giving can be formulated, and those who, for instance, are not given charity cannot complain for being discriminated against. Furthermore, some philosophers have noted (Wolf 1982) that despite the traditional aura associated with saintly action, “moral saints” are not very attractive human characters and most of us do not take them as role models for the way we lead our lives. They are fanatically one-track minded in their pursuit of moral ideals, tending to disparage the more personal (non-moral) values which we tend to appreciate in ourselves and in others (such as achieving athletic excellence or dedicating one's life to music). We feel similar repugnance towards a person who always goes beyond her duty as we feel towards the person who never does anything beyond what is strictly required of her.

Despite its theoretical and moral purity, the anti-supererogationist view is open to criticism. The good-ought tie-up rests on an ambiguity in the concept of ought, which may be interpreted either in a commendatory sense or in a prescriptive sense. “You ought to see the current Caravaggio exhibition” provides one with a reason for action, an advice, a recommendation that is not binding. “You ought to attend the next faculty meeting” may be a conclusive reason for action, a prescription. To further complicate matters, “ought” is often used impersonally, as in “it ought to be nice weather for our picnic tomorrow,” but also personally, as in “you ought to buy wine for the picnic.” And “the picnic ought to have been better organized” lies between the personal and the impersonal senses of “ought,” referring to some unspecified agent without addressing a prescription to any particular individual.

The good-ought tie-up works for the commendatory use of “ought” as well as for the impersonal, but not for the prescriptive and personal. “Ought” in the personal sense involves human agency as well as personal responsibility. Laying a duty on an individual requires both having a particularly strong (not just a) reason and showing how the reason is related to the particular agent. Just being a good state of affairs (even the best) does not create a reason for x to bring it about. X must stand in a particular position to the desirable state of affairs to make her have a (conclusive) reason to bring it about. Once the good-ought tie-up is broken in those central prescriptive contexts of personal “ought,” anti-supererogationism loses much of its bite. Supererogation is exactly what one does not personally have to do, even if it either ought to be done by someone or would lead to a state of affairs which “ought to exist.” However it remains for the supererogationist view to explain why the personal ought does not extend to the whole scope of the good.

3.2 Qualified Supererogationism

Completely denying the existence and value of supererogatory action does not fit with most people's intuitions. One way to account for supererogation without giving up the moral and theoretical principle relating the ‘good’ to the ‘ought’, value to duty, is to distinguish between different kinds of duties and obligations or to specify conditions and limits of the application of duties. Supererogation is a legitimate class of moral action but only in a qualified sense, i.e. due to certain conditions that make the moral ‘ought’ inapplicable or not fully prescriptive. This intermediate position seems to be the most common in the literature on supererogation, but it has many forms and variations.

Accounts of supererogation belonging to this group typically appeal to the linguistic hybrid “supererogatory requirements” or even “supererogatory duties.” Thus, for instance, contract theorists (Richards 1971) describe principles of supererogation as those that ideal contractors in the original position would consent not to enforce in society. Supererogatory behavior is a requirement, but punishing those who do not fulfill the requirement would be too costly in terms of the relative pain incurred to the agent as against the benefit to the potential beneficiary. Failure to act supererogatorily is blameworthy and wrong, but lends itself only to informal criticism rather than to institutionalized sanction. Supererogation is justified only in qualified, circumstantial terms relating to the limited effectiveness of its enforcement. It has no intrinsic value.

Another line of justifying supererogation without relinquishing the principle of ‘good’-entails-‘ought’ goes back to Thomas Aquinas but has some contemporary followers who sometimes speak in terms of vocation. Supererogatory behavior is required, but not of everybody. It can be expected only from those who subjectively feel the commitment to do it or from those who are objectively blessed with the necessary strength of character and virtue. Unlike the previous view, which distinguished between duty and supererogation in terms of the overall costs of enforcing duty, this approach is based on a principle of excuse: most human beings, due to their frail moral nature and imperfection are excused from omitting what from an ideal (religious, ethical) point of view is prescribed as a duty. The problem with this excused-based view of supererogation is that it is either subjectivist (the individual chooses her duties) or aristocratic (distinguishing between classes of moral agents). Furthermore, it fails to distinguish between the common appeals to excuses from obligatory action based on the particular difficulty or risk involved in its performance and the general exemption from supererogatory action that is sometimes easy and possible for everybody (like doing a small favor or showing forgiveness). Rawls' analysis of supererogation also appeals to an argument from exemption: “Supererogatory acts are not required, though normally they would be were it not for the loss or risk involved for the agent himself. A person who does a supererogatory act does not invoke the exemption which the natural duties allow” (Rawls 1971, p. 117).

A structurally similar analysis of supererogation is offered in terms of reasons for action. We may have a good (even a conclusive) reason to act in a certain way, but also a second-order permission not to act on that good reason. This permission, called “exclusionary,” is based on a second-order reason and allows the agent to disregard the balance of first order reasons for action. An agent acts supererogatorily if despite the permission to ignore these reasons, decides to act on them (Raz 1975). Typically, other-regarding considerations such as promoting the overall good serve as the kind of first-order conclusive reasons for an action (making it prima facie obligatory), whereas self-regarding considerations of the individual's autonomy to pursue her own goals in life support the second-order permission not to engage in that action. Self-sacrifice is again a paradigm example of supererogation. Although personal autonomy is not strictly speaking an excuse, it creates a kind of exemption from doing the morally required act. But the autonomy of the individual cannot serve to break the good-ought tie-up, since it presupposes the independent value of the personal good from what ought to be done rather than establish it (Dancy 1988). Furthermore, supererogationists of the unqualified kind would resist this exemption-based analysis as playing down the positive moral value of supererogation and relegating it to the morally neutral category of the “permitted” (Heyd 1992).

Qualified versions of supererogationism try to salvage a prescriptive element in the analysis of the concept without collapsing supererogation into duty (which would amount to denying its separate existence). Identifying supererogation with a weaker kind of duty, an imperfect duty, a non-universalizable duty, an ‘ought’ rather than a duty are all forms of recognition of supererogatory acts but only as being an integral part of an overall conception of duty. They maintain the deontic integrity of the moral system but by that run the risk of losing sight of what makes supererogatory action uniquely meritorious, sometimes praiseworthy, and often touching.

3.3 Unqualified Supererogationism

Imagine a world in which all morally good acts are also obligatory and in which individuals are capable of carrying out their duties with ease (and with no conflict with their personal goals and aims). Is something of moral value missing in such a world? Both anti-supererogationists and qualified supererogationists would answer in the negative. Those who believe in the intrinsic value of supererogatory conduct would disagree. What would be missing in such a world is what Tertullian referred to as licentia, that special field of liberty, which allows human beings to exercise their power of moral choice. Even Kant, who suggests the ideal of the Kingdom of Ends in which members of the moral community exercise their free will (Wille) by the necessity of their nature, believes that imperfect moral creatures like us have a free choice (Willkür) between good and evil. In this discretionary power to adopt the moral law (or reject it) lies the particular value of morality, at least for human beings. Going beyond duty might be consdered as a display of this power of free choice. The pure or unqualified version of supererogationism highlights the moral potential of good human action not prescribed or commanded, imposed or demanded in any sense. In other words, supererogation is good, not only due to the promotion of overall value in the world (which would not be denied by the other two views either), but also due to the kind of liberty in which it is performed. If that is the case, then an inherent part of the value of supererogation lies exactly in its lying beyond duty. The supererogatory is something that is not required in any sense and its omission does not call for an appeal to a special permission, exemption or excuse.

Rather than argue that a supererogatory act is that which the agent is permitted not to do, the unqualified analysis argues that it is an option for the agent. Permissions, at least “strong permissions,” are given to people to act in a way which there is some reason not to, whereas options are the positive counterparts of permissions. Options, as the etymology of the term attests, are actions the agent wishes to do, actions that seem good and worthy of choice to him. The point of supererogatory action lies, accordingly, in the good will of the agent, in his altruistic intention, in his choice to exercise generosity or to show forgiveness, to sacrifice himself or to do a little uncalled favor, rather than strictly adhering to his duty. Supererogatory action is a matter of personal initiative; it is spontaneous (i.e. originating in personal choice rather than in any external or universal demands). It allows for the expression of personal care or concern for another individual and thus may either reflect a particular personal relationship to another or create such a relationship. Supererogation is valuable because we believe that beyond the impersonal and egalitarian social web created by the universal morality of duty, there is space left for particular relationships that are not governed by the principles of justice and rights. From society's point of view, leaving a separate space for supererogatory action may strengthen mutual trust and communal bonds since it often indicates and promotes love and personal concern rather than mere respect for persons and a sense of justice. This view of supererogation locates it in the open-ended dimension of morality, that of ideals rather than principles, what Urmson calls “the higher flights or morality” and Bergson “the morality of aspiration.” The Talmud suggests this idea epigrammatically: “Jerusalem was only destroyed because judgments were given strictly upon Biblical Law and did not go beyond the requirements of the law”.

The optional nature of supererogatory behavior has recently been defended in terms of "position relative consequentialism". The idea is that people are not always required to do what they have the strongest moral reason to do (although they are permitted to do so). For they might have overriding non-moral reasons to act otherwise. Thus, supererogatory acts go against the overall balance of reasons (that includes the overriding non-moral reasons), which can be seen as the source of their special moral value (Porter 2003).

The justification of a principled (rather than pragmatic or circumstantial) demarcation between duty and supererogation is reminiscent of the analogous demarcation between the legal and the moral. Beyond the obvious reasons for avoiding the legal enforcement of all moral duties, many philosophers believe that part of the value of acting on one's moral duty has to do with the intention to do the right act, with acting for duty's sake. This serves as a principled ground for leaving morality free from legal enforcement. Similarly, unqualified supererogationists argue that the value of some virtuous actions like giving and forgiving would be lost if these become morally obligatory, demands whose omission entails blame and condemnation. The optional nature of supererogatory behavior is one step beyond the Kantian-like freedom of acting from moral duty. The moral non-enforcement of the supererogatory is analogous to the legal non-enforcement of the moral.

All this leaves the question of the substantive demarcation of duty and supererogation unsettled. Those who deny the existence of supererogation are not bothered by the issue. Those who explain it in terms of exemptions and excuses can appeal to cost-benefit analyses of the enforcement of high standards of behavior on morally weak human beings. But for those who ground supererogation in the intrinsic value of individual autonomy and altruistic intention, personal concern and the expression of virtue, there are no easy criteria for establishing the limits of duty and the space of the supererogatory. It should be noted that in virtue-based ethics (for example Aristotle's) the demarcation issue becomes moot: supererogatory transcendence of the demands of morality does not play a major role since ethical norms do not consist of well-defined moral duties with which supererogation is correlated.

There is no knockout argument for any of the three views of supererogation. The relative merits and defects in each have to do with the kind of definition of the supererogatory as well as with some fundamental beliefs about the nature of morality and the source of moral value. However, a more “local,” less abstract, discussion of paradigm examples of supererogatory action may be of help in the overall assessment of the three views.

4. Paradigm Examples

The analysis of concrete cases or examples is methodologically important in the philosophical discussion of supererogation. Unlike other subjects in ethics, like justice or duty, in which there is wide agreement about some core cases, supererogation is a concept the applicability of which is controversial. Unlike the concepts of justice and duty, which have deep roots in both ordinary language and everyday moral judgment, the idea of supererogation is only tenuously anchored in common moral discourse and the concept itself is a theoretical construct. Examples cannot in themselves prove the truth of any of the previously discussed analyses of supererogation, but they can definitely help in revising the various definitions of the concept as well as make a case for one or another of its justifications. Admittedly, some measure of circularity is inevitable in such a method, since the way examples are understood and analyzed is also informed by the definition and the construction of the theoretical concept.

Beneficence and charity are often considered as typical examples of supererogation. Unlike giving what is the recipient's due (or what is owed to him as his right), charity is not required by justice, lies beyond one's duty. As the term “gratuity” indicates, it is not necessary but optional. Charity is typically open-ended (i.e. there is no specified limit to how much one may give), is driven by altruistic intention, and is judged to be morally praiseworthy in a different sense than the fulfillment of a duty or respect for others' rights. But anti-supererogationists hold a harsher view of charity. Some regard charity as a condescending attitude; others expose the underlying expectation of return involved in any system of gifts (Mauss 1954) or even the logical impossibility of a real, free and gratuitous gift relationship, since every giving involves an expectation of return - of both gratitude and a future gift (Derrida 1992). There are ethical theorists who believe that our standards of distributive justice are far too minimalist and that much of what is considered supererogatory in the transference of wealth from the rich to the poor should really be considered obligatory. The more extreme version of this critique suggests a principle of giving according to which one should give all one's luxuries in order to satisfy the basic needs of others. Thus, the realm of the supererogatory is radically narrowed down, although it is hard to see how anti-supererogationists can completely abolish it. Supererogationists for their part argue that some distinction between justice and charity, between market exchange and voluntary giving, is good for both society and individuals because it creates a sense of community and good will, not to speak of more utilitarian benefits. One classical example is the system of the provision of blood for medical purposes. Social scientists as well as philosophers have argued for the advantages of a completely voluntary (supererogatory) system of blood donation over the commercialized or “enforced” systems (Titmuss 1973). But it seems that the issue of the deontic status of charity is often of a normative rather than conceptual kind. It focuses on the demarcation line between the obligatory and the gratuitous, both on the personal level of the behavior of the individual and on the social and political level (e.g. how much do rich countries owe poor countries and how much should be left to voluntary charity).

The problem of demarcation also plagues the paradigm case of supererogatory behavior, the so-called saintly and heroic acts. Fire fighters rushing to a burning house to save its residents risk their lives in a way that moves every spectator. But are not they paid for it? Is it not “their job”? Are they not justified when in a later response to a journalist's question they insist that they only did their duty? The supererogationist might respond by turning our attention to a similar risk taken by a by-stander who joins the professional emergency forces and literally jumps into the fire. Deniers of supererogation might argue that although such an action is heroic, it ought not to have been performed, since the slight chances of saving the victims of the fire do not justify the very high risk of loss of life of the volunteer. Kant at one point expresses his doubts about the moral motive behind some of the extreme cases of moral heroism and warns against moral fanaticism and sentimentalism (Kant 1949).

There are however examples of morally good actions which can be denied a supererogatory status only with much difficulty. Volunteering is a typical act that cannot be reduced to a duty, even not in a hypothetical manner as qualified supererogationism might try to do. When a job or a task must be done by a group of people, the group might select the individual who will do the job on the basis of some principle of justice or desert or, in the absence of such principle, by lot. In extreme cases, such as taking part in a highly risky medical experiment, it may be the case that no selection process, including lottery, should be deployed. If an individual volunteers to take upon herself the task rather than leaving it to the selected person, and particularly when it is wrong to select anyone, then clearly her act is supererogatory. Volunteering highlights the optional nature of supererogatory action in its purest form (the agent can hardly hide behind the morally modest expression “I only did my duty”). Promising is similar to volunteering in its optional nature which is not associated with the demarcation problem. One ought to fulfill one's promises, but making them in the first place is supererogatory. This might solve a paradox which has been raised: is a promise to do a supererogatory act possible? It seems not, since it cannot be both an obligatory act of promise keeping and a supererogatory act at the same time (Kawall, 2005). However, if the act of promising itself is supererogatory, then so is its fulfillment, even though the expectation created by the promise means that after being made it must be fulfilled (Heyd 2005).

Of course, anti-supererogationists could argue that volunteering and promising are both imperfect duties, i.e. not obligatory in any given individual case but nevertheless general requirements of virtue. People who never volunteer are morally condemnable; people who never commit themselves by promising are morally defective and fall short of standards of friendship and social behavior.

There are cases in which the supererogatory response is expressed in omission rather than in action. Forgiveness is a prime example of supererogatory forbearance. The offended party refrains from reacting negatively to the wrong done to him. Rather than the morally justified hostility and resentment that he was entitled to express, he shows forgiveness. There is, however a heated debate in ethical theory about the deontic nature of forgiveness. Many philosophers and non-philosophers alike believe that forgiveness is a moral duty, particularly if certain conditions like expressions of regret by the offender have been satisfied (e.g. Rashdall 1924). An unforgiving person is, accordingly, morally blameworthy. But for others, forgiveness is the epitome of supererogatory action since it is completely gratuitous, dependent on the good will of the offended party (Heyd 1982). For supererogationists the touching aspect of forgiveness lies exactly in its optional nature. Since the offender deserves punishment (or at least resentment), he cannot at the same time deserve (or have the right to) forgiveness. Despite the close similarity between giving and forgiving, it seems that the latter is a purer example of supererogatory act since it has a better chance of breaking what Derrida refers to as an endless circle: while a gift imposes a duty (debt) which can be satisfied only by a slightly larger counter-gift (which would initiate yet another round of giving), forgiveness is more a matter of attitude and has no measure.

It has also been suggested that toleration is, like forgiveness, an act of supererogatory forbearance: although the tolerator has a good reason for intervening in the wrong behavior of another, she chooses to refrain from such interference, letting the other lead her life as she wants (Newey 1997, Benbaji & Heyd 2001). Thus, an analysis of toleration as supererogatory is a possible solution of the “paradox of toleration,” viz. how can refraining from intervening in the wrong beliefs or behavior of others be considered desirable.

However, even if certain acts of forgiveness and toleration exemplify a supererogatory response, there surely are cases in which both are forbidden (the unforgivable and the intolerable) and there may be cases in which they are both obligatory (persistent pleas of the offender to be forgiven or the political demands of toleration of minorities in a multi-cultural society). A conceptually neat case for testing our intuitions about the deontic status of forgiveness (and toleration) is God's attitude to human sinners: is God bound by the principles of just retribution, i.e. not to forgive? Does he have a duty to forgive? Or is divine forgiveness a pure act of gratuitous grace? If God can act supererogatorily, how does that reflect on the perfection of divine justice that it transcends? The application of the concepts of forgiveness on the political level raise further questions. Even if the universal and unbiased rules of justice can be surpassed by individuals who show forgiveness or toleration, can institutions like the state or the courts exercise such supererogatory restraint without violating the demands of impartiality and equality before the law (Heyd 1978)? Legal pardon granted by kings and presidents reflects this tension between the wish to leave some measure of individual discretion in showing mercy to some public figures and the concern for the impartial application of such supererogatory grace.

There are of course many other examples of supererogatory action although the length and nature of the list is dependent on the definition of supererogation we adopt and the view of its value. But to the extent that actions and forbearances are supererogatory we may summarize their source of value as belonging either to their good consequences (as in the case of giving and charity) or to the strength of character or virtue of the agent (as in the risky acts of heroism) or to the pure good will involved in choosing to do what lies beyond duty (volunteering, forgiveness, small favors).

Beyond the complex philosophical debate about the nature and scope of supererogation, the discussion of paradigm examples indicate that any ethical system which does not allow for any actions beyond the call of duty would prove to be distressingly impoverished, even if coherent.


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consequentialism | ethics: deontological | ethics: virtue